Locke on Personal Identity

First published Mon Feb 11, 2019

John Locke (1632–1704) added the chapter in which he treats persons and their persistence conditions (Book 2, Chapter 27) to the second edition of An Essay Concerning Human Understanding in 1694, only after being encouraged to do so by William Molyneux (1692–1693).[1] Nevertheless, Locke’s treatment of personal identity is one of the most discussed and debated aspects of his corpus. Locke’s discussion of persons received much attention from his contemporaries, ignited a heated debate over personal identity, and continues to influence and inform the debate over persons and their persistence conditions. This entry aims to first get clear on the basics of Locke’s position, when it comes to persons and personal identity, before turning to areas of the text that continue to be debated by historians of philosophy working to make sense of Locke’s picture of persons today. It then canvases how Locke’s discussion of persons was received by his contemporaries, and concludes by briefly addressing how those working in metaphysics in the twentieth and twenty-first centuries have responded to Locke’s view—giving the reader a glimpse of Locke’s lasting impact and influence on the debate over personal identity.

1. Locke on Persons and Personal Identity: The Basics

Locke’s most thorough discussion of the persistence (or diachronic identity) of persons can be found in Book 2, Chapter 27 of the Essay (“Of Identity and Diversity”), though Locke anticipates this discussion as early as Book 1, Chapter 4, Section 5, and Locke refers to persons in other texts, including the Second Treatise of Government. The discussion of persons and their persistence conditions also features prominently in Locke’s lengthy exchange with Edward Stillingfleet, Bishop of Worcester (1697–1699).

Locke begins “Of Identity and Diversity” by first getting clear on the principle of individuation, and by setting out what some have called the place-time-kind principle—which stipulates that no two things of the same kind can be in the same place at the same time, and no individual can be in two different places at the same time (L-N 2.27.1).[2] With some of the basics of identity in place, Locke posits that before we can determine the persistence conditions for atoms, masses of matter, plants, animals, men, or persons, we must first know what we mean by these terms. In other words, before we can determine what makes atoms, masses of matter, plants, animals, men, or persons the same over time, we must pin down the nominal essences—or general ideas—for these kinds. Of this Locke says,

’Tis not therefore Unity of Substance that comprehends all sorts of Identity, or will determine it in every Case: But to conceive, and judge of it aright, we must consider what Idea the Word it is applied to stands for…. (L-N 2.27.7)

That we must define a kind term before determining the persistence conditions for that kind is underscored in Locke’s definition of “person”. Locke starts off by saying,

This being premised to find wherein personal Identity consists, we must consider what Person stands for….

He goes on,

which, I think, is a thinking intelligent Being, that has reason and reflection, and can consider it self as itself, the same thinking thing in different times and places…. (L-N 2.27.9)

A person for Locke is thus the kind of entity that can think self reflectively, and think of itself as persisting over time.

Locke additionally asserts that persons are agents. For Locke “person” is a

…Forensick Term appropriating Actions and their Merit; and so belongs only to intelligent Agents capable of a Law, and Happiness and Misery. (L-N 2.27.26)

Persons are therefore not just thinking intelligent beings that can reason and reflect, and consider themselves as the same thinking things in different times and places, but also entities that can be held accountable for their actions. It is because persons can think of themselves as persisting over time that they can, and do, plan ahead, with an eye toward the punishment or reward that may follow.

Just after Locke defines “person”, he begins to elucidate what makes any person the same person over time. He asserts that

…consciousness always accompanies thinking, and ‘tis that, that makes every one to be, what he calls self. (L-N 2.27.9)

Consciousness is what distinguishes selves, and thus,

…in this alone consists personal Identity, i.e. the sameness of rational Being: And as far as this consciousness can be extended backwards to any past Action or Thought, so far reaches the Identity of that Person; it is the same self now it was then; and ‘tis by the same self with this present one that now reflects on it, that that Action was done. (L-N 2.27.9)

After the initial assertion that the diachronic identity of persons consists in sameness of consciousness, Locke goes on to use various imaginary cases to drive this point home.

The imaginary cases that Locke employs are not dissimilar to ancient cases, such as the Ship of Theseus, reported by Plutarch. In this case, we are asked to imagine a ship that has slowly had its planks replaced with new ones. The intuition Plutarch’s case are intended to test is whether, at the end (when the ship has an entirely new material constitution), we have the same ship as before. Likewise, Locke is using cases to test readers’ intuitions about persistence and identity. But it is arguable that Locke is the first to devise such cases to specifically test readers’ intuitions about persons and the conditions under which they are the same. Locke is thus carving out a new conceptual space through such imaginary cases. A few of these will be outlined and discussed in what follows.

In the “prince and the cobbler” passage, or L-N 2.27.15, Locke asks the reader to imagine the soul of a prince entering and informing the body of a cobbler, taking all of its “princely thoughts” with it. In this scenario, the person called “prince” ends up persisting in the man identified as the “cobbler”, because the prince’s consciousness goes along with the prince’s soul. Just after Locke describes this scenario, he says,

I know that in the ordinary way of speaking, the same Person, and the same Man, stand for one and the same thing. And indeed every one will always have a liberty to speak, as he pleases, and to apply what articulate Sounds to what Ideas he thinks fit, and change them as often as he pleases. But yet when we will enquire, what makes the same Spirit, Man, or Person, in our Minds; and having resolved with our selves what we mean by them, it will not be hard to determine, in either of them, or the like, when it is the same, and when not. (L-N 2.27.15)

Through the “prince and the cobbler” passage it not only becomes clear that a person goes where their consciousness goes, but also that Locke distinguishes between the term “man” (which is synonymous with “human being”) and “person”.

Other scenarios that Locke conjures, such as the “waking and sleeping Socrates” case (L-N 2.27.19), make clear that even if an individual remains the same man, he may not persist as the same person. Here Locke says,

If the same Socrates waking and sleeping do not partake of the same consciousness, Socrates waking and sleeping is not the same Person. And to punish Socrates waking, for what sleeping Socrates thought, and waking Socrates was never conscious of, would be no more of Right, than to punish one Twin for what his Brother-Twin did, whereof he knew nothing, because their outsides were so like, that they could not be distinguished; for such Twins have been seen. (L-N 2.27.19)

If Socrates has a different consciousness by day than he does by night, then waking Socrates ought not be punished for what sleeping Socrates does. This is because although Socrates is the same man by day as he is by night, he is a different person by day than he is at night (and moral responsibility lies with persons, according to Locke). Thus while the identity of consciousness determines the identity of person, the identity of persons and the identity of men come apart for Locke—or at least they can.[3]

Locke additionally distinguishes between persons and souls. There is evidence for this in L-N 2.27.13. Here Locke claims,

But yet to return to the Question before us, it must be allowed, That if the same consciousness … can be transferr’d from one thinking Substance to another, it will be possible, that two thinking Substances may make but one Person.

If consciousness can actually be transferred from one soul to another, then a person can persist, despite a change in the soul to which her consciousness is annexed. Thus if a reader’s soul switches out as she progresses from the start of L-N 2.27 to the end, so long as the reader’s consciousness remains the same, she remains the same person, according to Locke.

On top of this, Locke asserts that even if an individual has the same soul, he may fail to be the same person. Locke makes this point in L-N 2.27.14, 23, and 24. In the “day and night-man” passage, or 2.27.23, Locke asks the reader to imagine “…two distinct incommunicable consciousnesses acting the same Body, the one constantly by Day, the other by Night” (L-N 2.27.23). Locke goes on to suggest that the “…Day and the Night-man” are “as distinct persons as Socrates and Plato” (L-N 2.27.23). Locke then makes clear that this is the case even if day and night-man share the same soul:

For granting that the thinking Substance in Man must be necessarily suppos’d immaterial, ‘tis evident, that immaterial thinking thing may sometimes part with its past consciousness, and be restored to it again, as appears in the forgetfulness Men often have of their past Actions, and the Mind many times recovers the memory of a past consciousness, which it had lost for twenty Years together. Make these intervals of Memory and Forgetfulness to take their turns regularly by Day and Night, and you have two Persons with the same immaterial Spirit, as much as in the former instance two Persons with the same Body. So that self is not determined by Identity or Diversity of Substance…but only by identity of consciousness. (L-N 2.27.23)

Just as the “waking and sleeping Socrates” passage, L-N 2.27.23 shows that there can be a change of person due to a change in consciousness, and this is the case even though there is no change in man. But, what Locke also makes clear through L-N 2.27.23 is that there can be a change of person even though there is no change in soul. Thus while many philosophers (including Plato, Rene Descartes, Samuel Clarke, etc.) think that one cannot be a person unless one has an immaterial soul, and the identity of persons rests in the identity of souls, Locke makes the bold move of pulling persons and souls apart.

In addition to this, Locke calls the substantial nature of souls into question. Locke takes thought to be immaterial, and while Locke contends that the immaterial cannot be reduced to, or explained in terms of, the material, Locke is not committed to substance dualism, when it comes to finite thinkers. This is because Locke thinks substratum—or the substance that underlies and supports any particular substance’s qualities—is impossible for finite minds to penetrate. Additionally there is nothing in the concepts “thought” and “matter” that allows us to deduce that one excludes the other, and God could have superadded the ability to think to formerly inert systems of matter. In Locke’s picture, we cannot know whether the substance (or substratum) that underlies thinking and willing is different from the substance (or substratum) that underlies being solid and white, or yellow and malleable. Locke’s official position on the substantial nature of finite thinkers is therefore one of agnosticism.

2. Locke on Persons: What’s Up for Debate

This section outlines some of the areas of Locke’s text, and aspects of Locke’s view, that continue to be debated by historians of philosophy working to make sense of Locke’s picture of persons and their persistence conditions today. As will soon become clear, there is disagreement about almost every aspect of Locke’s discussion of persons, and even some of what has been presented thus far betrays a particular interpretive framework.

One of the overarching questions asked about Locke’s Essay is how much it includes metaphysical exploration. Some think that Locke’s project is exclusively epistemological, citing (among other passages) the following as evidence for their view: In the Epistle to the Reader, Locke describes himself as an “underlabourer”. Locke then goes on to say,

This, therefore being my Purpose to enquire into the Original, Certainty, and Extent of humane Knowledge; together, with the Grounds and Degrees of Belief, Opinion, and Assent; I shall not at present meddle with the Physical Consideration of the Mind; or trouble my self to examine, wherein its Essence consists, or by what Motions of our Spirits, or Alterations of our Bodies, we come to have any Sensation by our Organs, or any Ideas in our Understandings; and whether those Ideas do in their Formation, any, or all of them, depend on Matter, or no. These are Speculations, which, however curious and entertaining, I shall decline, as lying out of my Way, in the Design I am now upon. (L-N 1.1.2)

Under this reading, Locke is interested in determining what we can and cannot know by first determining how we come to have ideas, but what this entails is determining which activities give rise to our ideas, rather than investigating the metaphysical nature of the thinking thing wherein these activities—sensation and reflection—take place. Likewise all other explorations within the Essay eschew metaphysics.

Those who read L-N 2.27 as part of a project which is purely epistemological see the claims that Locke makes about the persistence of persons as claims about what we can know about the persistence of persons. As Lex Newman puts it,

Locke’s broader aim is to clarify the conditions under which we judge that we are numerically the same with some earlier person, not the conditions under which we strictly are the same person. (2015: 90)

Under this kind of reading, Locke’s claim that the identity of any person does not rest in the identity of substance (L-N 2.27.10 and 23) amounts to the claim that if any person wants to determine whether they are the same, they do not look to substance to find out. The idea is that because we have such an impoverished notion of substance in general, we do not look to substratum to determine if we are the same person over time in Locke’s view.

Other scholars tend to think that although Locke sets his task in the Essay as an epistemological one, he cannot help but dabble in some metaphysics along the way. What has been presented (regarding the basics of Locke’s picture of persons) in this entry thus far falls within this interpretive camp. This is why the imaginary cases that Locke employs in L-N 2.27 have been described as giving the reader information about what makes it the case that a person is the same at time 2 as at time 1. According to this view, what Locke is giving us in L-N 2.27 are inter alia “the conditions under which we strictly are the same person”.

Nevertheless, within the interpretive camp that takes Locke to dabble in metaphysics, there is widespread debate, both at the macro and the micro level. To start with the macro level: Some who fall into this camp see Locke making metaphysical claims in various passages throughout the text. Such scholars thus see what Locke is doing in L-N 2.27 as very much in keeping with moves that he makes in other parts of the Essay (see Stuart 2013, for example). However, others see L-N 2.27—and the metaphysics Locke is doing therein—as a significant break from the methodology that Locke employs in the rest of the Essay. This is because just after Locke claims that his project in the Essay is an epistemological one (1.1.2), he makes clear that in this project, he is using the historical plain method, or roughly, the Baconian method of induction (see Nuovo forthcoming). Of this, Locke says,

…I shall imagine I have not wholly misimploy’d my self in the Thoughts I shall have on this Occasion, if, in this Historical, plain Method, I can give any Account of the Ways , whereby our Understandings come to attain those Notions of Things we have, and can set down any Measures of the Certainty of our Knowledge, or the Grounds of those perswasions, which are to be found amongst Men, so various, different, and wholly contradictory…. (L-N 1.1.2)

Those who see a tension between Locke’s discussion of personal identity and the rest of the Essay contend that the way in which Locke proceeds in L-N 2.27 not only includes metaphysics, but also a reliance on thought experiments for data. Thus, rather than surveying a number of instances, and drawing inferences from there—or utilizing the historical, plain method—as he claims to be doing throughout the Essay, Locke is doing something quite different in 2.27: He is employing imaginary cases instead (see Antonia LoLordo 2012, for example).

However, what the historical plain method amounts to for Locke, and whether Locke’s use of thought experiments in L-N 2.27 is in tension with this method is also the subject of debate. So too is whether Locke uses thought experiments in 2.27 alone. Additionally, some have questioned whether the exercises that Locke walks readers through in 2.27 count as thought experiments at all (see Kathryn Tabb 2018, for more on this). There are thus wide-ranging debates about how to best describe 2.27 and the methodologies Locke employs therein. There is also much disagreement regarding how to square these methodologies with the general description Locke gives of his project in the Essay. Moreover, this is the case even amongst those who are in agreement that Locke is doing metaphysics in 2.27.

On top of this, there are deep and long-standing micro-level debates amongst those who think Locke is giving us some metaphysics in L-N 2.27. One such debate regards the implications of Locke’s assertion that the identity of any person does not rest in the identity of substance (2.27.10 and 23). Some scholars take Locke’s assertion that the identity of any person does not rest in the identity of substance, and other similar claims, to be evidence that Locke is a relativist about identity (see Stuart 2013, for example). To get a sense of what this entails, it is helpful to consider the contrast case: strict identity. If a philosopher holds a strict identity theory, then she takes it that we can ask, “Is y at time 2 the same as x at time 1?” and arrive at a determinate answer. On the other hand, if a philosopher is a relativist about identity, then she asserts that in response to the former question, we have to ask “Same what?” So if we ask, “Is Socrates the same?” a relativist about identity thinks we have to specify under which sortal term we are considering Socrates. Are we thinking about Socrates as a human being, or a body, or a soul (or something else altogether)?

On top of this, the relativist about identity thinks that an entity who is of two sorts can persist according to one, while failing to persist according to the other. We might say that from one day to the next, Socrates persists as the same human being, but not as the same body. Thus when Locke says that a person can persist despite a change in substance, or a person can persist despite a change in soul, some scholars take Locke to be showing that he is a relativist about identity. Relative identity readings were rather unpopular for some time, but have experienced a resurgence as of late (see Stuart 2013).

Still, some think that attributing this kind of reading to Locke is anachronistic. Others take issue with the fact that under a relative identity reading, there is, properly speaking, just one entity described under different sorts. (What we call “Socrates” does not pick out a human being, and person, with a body and soul, but rather one thing, described in these different ways.) This is appealing for some, especially those who think that this is the only way to save Locke from violating the place-time-kind principle, which stipulates that no two things of the same kind can be in the same place at the same time. But it lacks appeal for those who take Locke to be claiming that persons and the human beings who house them (for instance) are distinct.[4]

Some scholars take Locke’s assertion that the identity of substance is neither required nor enough for the persistence of any person to be evidence that persons are modes (or attributes), rather than substances (or things themselves). Such scholars then turn to Locke’s place-time-kind principle, for further evidence for their view. They take Locke’s assertion that no two things of the same kind can be in the same place at the same time to mean that no two substances of the same kind can be in the same place at the same time. Souls are thinking substances for Locke, and if persons are substances, they would count as such. Thus, persons cannot be substances, for otherwise wherever there is a person and her soul there are two thinking substances in the same place at the same time. Those who offer mode readings additionally turn to Locke’s claim that person is a “forensic term” and Locke’s bold assertion that a demonstrative science of morality is possible as evidence that the term “person” must be a mode term, rather than a substance term. This line of interpretation is popular today (see LoLordo 2012, Mattern 1980, Uzgalis 1990), but dates back to Edmund Law (1769).

Other Locke scholars defend substance readings of Locke on persons. They turn to Locke’s claims about substance, power, and agency, to conclude that if an entity has any power whatsoever it has to be a substance. Persons have powers. Thus, persons have to be substances for Locke (for arguments along these lines, see Gordon-Roth 2015, Rickless 2015, Chappell 1990). They then have to explain what Locke means when he asserts that the identity of any person does not rest in the identity of substance. Those who do not take the relative identity path usually end up working to get clear on what Locke could mean by “substance” when he makes this claim. Many conclude that what Locke means is that the identity of any person does not depend upon the identity of the simple substances that compose or constitute her. There are numerous defenders of this position today (see Alston and Bennett 1988, Bolton 1994, Chappell 1990, and Uzgalis 1990). Thus questions about two of the most basic features of Locke’s picture of personal identity—What is Locke’s (general) view on identity?; and, What kind of entity is a person, exactly?—are the subject of ongoing debate.[5]

So too are the most clearly stated aspects of Locke’s view: the claim that persons have consciousnesses, and the accompanying assertion that sameness of person rests in sameness of consciousness. What is consciousness for Locke? What does Locke mean by “sameness of consciousness”? Answering these questions turns out to be difficult, since Locke does not say much about what he takes consciousness to be (and we only know the persistence conditions of any entity, once we get clear on the nominal essence of that entity’s kind, according to Locke). Nevertheless, answering these questions is crucial to understanding Locke’s theory of personal identity since it is consciousness centered.

Some scholars take Locke to be a strict memory theorist. In other words, consciousness just is memory for Locke. As will become clear below, this reading dates back at least as far as Thomas Reid. Of course, it is the case that the way a person extends their consciousness backward is via memory. It thus may seem as if the identity of consciousness consists in memory, or that to have the same consciousness as she who did x, one has to have a memory of doing x, under Locke’s view. Nevertheless, as Margaret Atherton points out, Locke talks at length about forgetfulness, and if consciousness just is memory, then we cannot make sense of consciousness at any given moment where a person is not invoking memory (1983: 277–278). Atherton then goes on to develop an account of consciousness that is analogous with Locke’s conception of animal “life”.

The identity of consciousness is what allows for the persistence of any person, just as the identity of life is what allows for the persistence of any animal. “If we look at Locke in this fashion”, Atherton argues,

then what he is saying is that what makes me different at this moment from any other person is that my thoughts are identical with my consciousness of them. No one else can have my consciousness any more than any organism can have my life. (Atherton 1983: 283)

A person, in Atherton’s reading of Locke, is a single center of consciousness, and so long as that single center of consciousness persists, the person persists.

Other scholars hold what is called an “appropriation reading” (see Winkler 1991, Thiel 2011, LoLordo 2012). Under this reading, what Locke means when he says that sameness of person consists in sameness of consciousness, is that any person extends back only to those mental events or acts which they take to be their own. In other words, the persistence of any person or self is best seen in terms of the “subjective constitution of the self” (Winkler 1991: 204). There might be a worry that under this kind of reading, Locke gives persons too much authority. That is, a person could deny that she is the one who committed the crime, just because she doesn’t see that act as her own. But, although the “self has a certain authority over its own constitution”, Kenneth Winkler makes clear that

it is important to realize that this authority is not consciously exerted. I do not willfully disown one act and appropriate another; instead I accept what my consciousness reveals to me. There is also a severe limit on that authority, imposed by the transitivity of identity,

which comes through, as Winkler notes, in Reid’s objection—an objection which Winkler thinks sympathetic readers of Locke can answer and which is discussed in section 3 below (Winkler 1991: 206).

From these treatments it is still difficult to discern what consciousness is for Locke, however. Shelley Weinberg works to give a robust picture of Locke’s conception of consciousness in her recent book (2016). According to Weinberg, Locke uses the term “consciousness” in two different ways:

…Locke seems to see consciousness as (1) a mental state inseparable from an act of perception by means of which we are aware of ourselves as perceiving, and (2) the ongoing self we are aware of in these conscious states. (Weinberg 2016: 153)

The former is a momentary psychological state that allows for what Weinberg calls

a momentary subjective experience that the self presently perceiving is the same as the self that remembers having once had a past thought or action

and captures the first-person experience of persisting over time (Weinberg 2016: 153). The latter is an “objective fact of an ongoing consciousness” (Weinberg 2016: 153). This sense of consciousness is available from a third personal point of view, and fills in the gaps that any person’s subjective experience might entail.

Thus, Weinberg contends that the identity, or continued existence, of consciousness consists in a metaphysical fact, rather than appropriation. Nevertheless, Weinberg additionally argues that the first personal (conscious) experience of our own mental states, whether those states are occurrent sensations, reflections, or via remembering is a necessary, but not sufficient, condition of personal identity. In other words, to have the awareness (or knowledge) of an ongoing self—or (2)—we must have (1). Although there is a range of interpretations of Locke on consciousness on the table, Weinberg’s book, Consciousness in Locke, marks the first large-scale treatment of Locke’s views on consciousness.[6]

In addition to the debate over what consciousness is, and what Locke means when he says that the identity of any person consists in the identity of consciousness, there is ongoing debate about what Locke’s stance is when it comes to what can give rise to consciousness. That is, there is ongoing discussion of what Locke means when he says that God could have superadded thinking to formerly inert systems of matter, and what Locke’s actual position is on the substantial nature of finite thinkers. There are those who take Locke to be truly agnostic. Those who take this line of interpretation remind readers of Locke’s stated aims at the start of the Essay (as quoted earlier), and the epistemic modesty that Locke maintains throughout the text. But, there are others who think that Locke overstates the probability that souls are immaterial substances, so as not to ruffle the feathers of Stillingfleet and other religious authorities. Some in the latter group think that Locke leans toward materialism. This raises questions about how far Anthony Collins (discussed below) departs from the Lockean picture, or the degree to which Locke anticipates later materialist pictures of persons.[7] At the very least, it can be said that Locke challenges the importance that many philosophers place on the immaterial soul to personhood and personal identity.[8] As might be expected, this was met with mixed reviews.

3. The Early Modern Reception of Locke’s Picture of Persons

This section addresses how Locke’s view was received by his contemporaries and by those writing in the remainder of the early modern period (16th-18th centuries). A good number of philosophers vehemently objected to Locke’s treatment of persons, though some defended it, and many others used it as an inspiration, or springboard, for their own views.

Many who objected to Locke’s treatment of persons did so because they objected to the decreased importance Locke places on the soul for personhood and personal persistence (see Joseph Butler, Thomas Reid, and Samuel Clarke, for example). Many such philosophers argue that numerical identity consists in no change at all, and the only kind of entity that allows for identity in this strict sense is an immaterial substance.

Along the way, some charged Locke’s theory of personal identity with circularity. As Joseph Butler puts it,

…[O]ne should really think it self-evident that consciousness of personal identity presupposes, and therefore cannot constitute, personal identity; any more than knowledge, in any other case, can constitute truth, which it presupposes. (1736 [1842: 298])

Butler then asserts that Locke’s misstep stems from his methodology. He says,

This wonderful mistake may possibly have arisen from hence; that to be endued with consciousness is inseparable from the idea of a person, or intelligent being. For this might be expressed inaccurately thus, that consciousness makes personality: and from hence it might be concluded to make personal identity. (1736 [1842: 298])

One of the points that Locke emphasizes—that persistence conditions are determined via defining kind terms—is what, according to Butler, leads Locke astray.

Butler additionally makes the point that memory is not required for personal persistence. He says,

But though present consciousness of what we at present do and feel is necessary to our being the persons we now are; yet present consciousness of past actions or feelings is not necessary to our being the same persons who performed those actions, or had those feelings. (1736 [1842: 298])

This is a point that others develop when they assert that Locke’s view results in contradiction.

The most popular, or well known, version of this line of objection comes from Thomas Reid (1785). In the “brave officer” objection, Reid poses the following challenge to Locke’s theory of personal identity. He says:

Suppose a brave officer to have been flogged when a boy at school for robbing an orchard, to have taken a standard from the enemy in his first campaign, and to have been made a general in advanced life; suppose, also, which must be admitted to be possible, that, when he took the standard, he was conscious of his having been flogged at school, and that, when made a general, he was conscious of his taking the standard, but had absolutely lost the consciousness of his flogging. These things being supposed, it follows, from Mr. Locke’s doctrine, that he who was flogged at school is the same person who took the standard, and that he who took the standard is the same person who was made a general. Whence it follows, if there be any truth in logic, that the general is the same person with him who was flogged at school. But the general’s consciousness does not reach so far back as his flogging; therefore, according to Mr. Locke’s doctrine, he is not the person who was flogged. Therefore, the general is, and at the same time is not, the same person with him who was flogged at school. (Reid 1785 [1851: 248–249])

In this exercise (and other similar versions of it) we are supposed to assume Locke’s theory of personal identity, and maintain that sameness of person consists in sameness of consciousness. When we do, Reid expects we will conclude that the general (C) is the same person as he who took the standard from the enemy (B) because the general (C) remembers doing so. Additionally he who took the standard from the enemy (B) is the same person as he who was flogged at school for robbing the orchard (A) because he (B) remembers that past traumatic experience. Thus C (he who is was made general) is identical to B (he who took the standard) and B (he who took the standard) is identical to A (he who was flogged at school).

Given the law of transitivity (which says that if C is identical to B and B is identical to A, then C is identical to A), we should conclude that C (the general) is identical to A (the flogged school boy). But, since we are assuming Locke’s theory of personal identity, Reid thinks we cannot come to this conclusion. If we assume Locke’s view, Reid contends that we have to conclude that C (the general) is not identical to A (the school boy). This is because C (the general) has no consciousness or memory of having been flogged at school (A).

This and other similar objections are meant to show that if we place the identity of persons in the identity of consciousness, as Locke suggests, then we run into a problem—namely one of contradiction—for we get the result that C and A both are, and are not, identical. Nevertheless, as is made clear above, there is debate about whether Locke’s claims about identity of consciousness should be read in terms of memory, and whether Reid is correct to take “memory” and “consciousness” as synonymous terms for Locke.

Circularity and contradiction are just two of the major objections launched at Locke’s theory of personal identity shortly after it is published. Importantly, these are objections to which sympathetic readers of Locke are still responding (see Atherton 1983, Weinberg 2016, LoLordo 2012, Thiel 2011, Garrett 2003, Schechtman 2014, etc). This gives the reader a glimpse of some of the lines of attack that were launched against Locke’s discussion of persons during the early modern period. Nevertheless, not all of Locke’s peers attacked his picture of persons, and numerous philosophers worked to defend his view.

One such philosopher is Catharine Trotter Cockburn. Cockburn pens her Defence of Mr. Locke’s Essay of Human Understanding in 1702.[9] In this text, Cockburn is responding to three pamphlets directed at Locke’s Essay.[10] These pamphlets take aim at Locke’s Essay rather broadly, and Cockburn’s Defence reflects this, but much is said about Locke on persons and their persistence conditions therein. Specifically, these pamphlets charge Locke with not proving that the soul is immortal, or threatening proofs of the immortality of the soul. They additionally charge that Locke’s view leaves us with the strange consequence that our souls are in constant flux, making it the case that we “awake with new souls each morning”. Given the importance of the soul, its persistence, and its immortality, to many traditional theories of personal identity, these objections are arguably intended to be objections to Locke’s picture of persons. Cockburn is quick to defend Locke, but proceeds carefully and thoroughly as she does so.

Cockburn points out that Locke never sets out to prove the soul immortal, and Locke actually claims that it is more probable that the soul is immaterial, than material. Moreover, even if Locke is not committed to the soul being immaterial, this ought not threaten proofs of the immortality of the soul. This is because what allows Locke to speculate that God could have superadded thinking to formerly inert systems of matter is that God is omnipotent, and surely an omnipotent being could make souls immortal even if they are material. Moreover, proofs for the immortality of the soul that rely on the immateriality of the soul are not likely to convince laymen of the soul’s immortality, and may actually leave them sceptical about whether the soul is indeed immortal (even if it is immaterial).

Cockburn additionally attacks the assertion that Locke’s claim that “men think not always” threatens proofs of the immortality of the soul. Of this she says,

But let it be granted, that it is ever so clearly proved, that thinking is necessary to the soul’s existence, that can no more prove, that it shall always exist, than it proves, that it has always existed; it being as possible for that omnipotence, which from nothing gave the soul a being, to deprive it of that being in the midst of its most vigorous reflections, as in an utter suspension of all thought. If then this proposition, that the soul always thinks, does not prove, that it is immortal, the contrary supposition takes not away any proof of it; for it is no less easy to conceive, that a being, which has the power of thinking with some intervals of cessation from thought, that has existed here for some time in a capacity of happiness or misery, may be continued in, or restored to the same state, in a future life, than that a Being which always thinks, may be continued in the same state. (Cockburn, in Sheridan (ed) 2006: 53)

As Cockburn points out, the notion that the soul is always thinking is not used as evidence for the soul’s immortality. Locke’s claim to the contrary thus ought not count as evidence against it, and we ought to have faith that an omnipotent God will ensure the soul’s immortality (whether it always thinks or not). Additionally, there is ample evidence that Locke thinks the soul is immortal, and that persons will go on to receive divine punishment and reward in the next life for their deeds in this life. This comes through not just in L-N 2.27 of the Essay, but also in Locke’s correspondence with Stillingfleet, and many of Locke’s religious writings, including the posthumously published “Resurrectio et quae secuuntur” (though Cockburn would not have had access to the latter while drafting her Defence).[11]

Finally, Cockburn argues that the assumption that Locke’s view entails that we “awake with new souls each morning” rests on a misunderstanding. Just as a body that was in motion and comes to rest does not become a new body once it starts moving again, a soul that was thinking and ceases to think does not become a new soul once thought is restored to it. Thus, Locke’s claim that we do not always think—and indeed may have dreamless sleep—does not have the absurd consequences for the persistence of persons that the pamphlets charge. To this it might also be added that even if we awake with new souls each morning, it need not mean that we are new persons each morning, according to Locke.

Through the Defence, Cockburn additionally makes clear that although Locke’s theory of personal identity allows for sci-fi switches such as those described in the “prince and the cobbler” passage (L-N 2.27.15), the “waking and sleeping Socrates” passage (2.27.19), and the “day and night-man” passage (2.27.23), Locke does not think that this is the way things ordinarily go. In other words, in Locke’s view it is not that persons are switching bodies and swapping souls on a regular basis. Rather, Locke is making clear that we should distinguish between the concepts “man”, “body”, “soul”, and “person”. Moreover, the persistence of any person does not always align with the persistence of a human being or soul, as many assume. Making this point is the purpose of those imaginary cases.

Sixty-seven years after Cockburn’s Defence, and twenty-one years after the correspondence between Cockburn and Edmund Law ends, Law drafts a Defence of his own. Law’s Defence of Mr. Locke’s Opinion Concerning Personal Identity (1769) is later included in the 1823 version of Locke’s Works, and in it Law offers a particular reading of the ontological status of persons. Law defends a consciousness-based view, and makes much of Locke’s claim that person is a “forensic term”. Law moves from this point to the conclusion that Locke thinks persons are modes (or attributes) rather than substances (or things in themselves). He says,

Now the word Person, as is well observed by Mr. Locke…is properly a forensick term, and here to be used in the strickt forensick sense, denoting some such quality or modification in man as denominates him a moral agent, or an accountable creature; renders him the proper subject of Laws, and a true object of Rewards or Punishments. (1823: 1–2)

This is significant since whether Lockean persons are best thought of as substances, modes, or relations is something that is still debated amongst Locke scholars today.

While some philosophers were happy to defend Locke, as Cockburn and Law did, numerous philosophers writing in the eighteenth century utilized Locke’s theory of personal identity as a stepping stone to establish their own even more provocative views on persons. The ways in which these theorists go beyond Locke varies. Some of these are outlined below.[12]

In Anthony Collins’s correspondence with Samuel Clarke (1707–1708), it can often look as if Collins is a mere defender of Locke’s view. Collins holds a consciousness-based view of personal identity, and Collins invokes Locke’s discussion of persons and their persistence conditions throughout this lengthy exchange. Nevertheless, Collins takes Locke’s assertion that for all we know God could have superadded the ability to think to formerly inert systems of matter, and runs with it. As Larry Jorgensen puts it,

A significant difference between Collins and Locke…is that Collins thought that material systems provided a better explanatory basis for consciousness, which changes the probability calculus. Collins provides evidence that casts doubt on Locke’s claim that “it is in the highest degree probable” that humans have immaterial souls. Although he is building from a Lockean starting point, namely the possibility that God might superadd thinking to matter, he ends up with a naturalized version: thinking “follows from the composition or modification of a material system” (Clarke and Collins 2011: 48). (Jorgensen forthcoming)

Collins’s view on personal identity is a consciousness-based view, but what gives rise to consciousness, according to Collins, is likely a material system. Thus some take Locke’s purported agnosticism about the substantial nature of finite thinkers, and proceed more forcefully in the direction of materialism. In other words, Locke’s views on the substantial nature of finite thinkers opens the door to materialist views of persons and their persistence conditions.

Others take criticisms launched at Locke’s theory of personal identity, including the criticism that the self (or persisting self) is a fiction, and appear to embrace such consequences.[13] This can be seen rather readily in David Hume’s Treatise of Human Nature (1738). In the Treatise, Hume asserts that it is not clear how we can even have an idea of the self. This is because most take selves to be persisting entities, and all of our ideas come from corresponding impressions. But since our impressions constantly change, there is no one impression that can give rise to the idea we call “self”. Of this Hume says,

It must be some one impression, that gives rise to every real idea. But self or person is not any one impression, but that to which our several impressions and ideas are suppos’d to have a reference. If any impression gives rise to the idea of self, that impression must continue invariably the same, thro the whole course of our lives; since self is suppos’d to exist after that manner. But there is no impression constant and invariable. Pain and pleasure, grief and joy, passions and sensations succeed each other, and never all exist at the same time. It cannot, therefore, be from any of these impressions, or from any other, that the idea of self is deriv’d; and consequently there is no such idea. (1738 Book I, Part IV, Section VI [1896: 251–252])

Moreover, whenever Hume looks for himself, all he finds are impressions. He says,

For my part, when I enter most intimately into what I call myself, I always stumble on some particular perception or other, of heat or cold, light or shade, love or hatred, pain or pleasure. I never catch myself at any time without a perception, and never can observe any thing but the perception. (1738 [1896: 252])

This leads Hume to claim that we are just bundles of perceptions, in constant flux (1738 [1896: 252]).

Thus it is not only the case that we fail to have an idea of the self, according to Hume, but also the case that, properly speaking, no subsisting self persists from one moment to the next. It is the imagination that leads us astray when we think of ourselves, and other entities, as persisting over time (1738 [1896: 254]). As Hume puts it,

The identity, which we ascribe to the mind of man, is only a fictitious one, and of a like kind with that which we ascribe to vegetables and animal bodies. (1738 [1896: 259])

He goes on,

It cannot, therefore, have a different origin, but must proceed from a like operation of the imagination upon like objects. (1738 [1896: 259])

In moving away from a more traditional substance-based view of personal identity (where the identity of person lies in the identity of soul), Locke opens the door to more fragmentary treatments of selves and persons.[14]

Along similar lines, some take Locke’s claim that the identity of persons lies in the identity of consciousness as fuel for the assertion that, properly speaking, there is no special relation between person x and any other future person. That is, personal identity only exists between present and past selves, not present and future selves. For this reason, we ought not have prudential concern, or concern for a future self that is distinct from our concern for others. This is the argumentative move that William Hazlitt makes, and in An Essay on the Principles of Human Action (1805), he explicitly sets as his task showing

…that the human mind is naturally disinterested, or that it is naturally interested in the welfare of others in the same way, and from the same motives, by which we are impelled to the pursuit of our own interests. (1805: 1)

This line of argumentation is replicated and expanded almost one hundred and eighty years later by Derek Parfit in Reasons and Persons (1984), though it does not appear that Parfit is aware of Hazlitt’s view when he drafts his own.[15]

4. Locke’s Lasting Impact on the Personal Identity Debate

This section briefly outlines the lasting impact that Locke has had on the debate over persons and their persistence conditions by exploring how Locke’s theory of personal identity gets taken up in the twentieth and twenty-first centuries. Most metaphysicians contributing to the debate over personal identity refer to Locke’s treatment of persons in their texts. Many even directly respond to Locke’s view as they flesh out their own.

Most who hold psychological continuity theories of personal identity take their views to be descendants of Locke’s. This is true of John Perry (1975), David Lewis (1976), Sydney Shoemaker (1984), and Derek Parfit (1984), for instance (Schechtman “Memory, Identity, and Sameness of Consciousness”, forthcoming in The Lockean Mind). In fact, Parfit defends what he calls a “Lockean view” as recently as 2016 (34). What makes each of these views Lockean (at least according to their authors)?: Like Locke, they take personal identity to consist in the continuity of psychological life, and they take this to mean that personal identity is relational. Moreover, like Locke, they emphasize the forensic nature of personhood.

Marya Schechtman offers a rival interpretation to those held by Perry, Lewis, Shoemaker, and Parfit, but Locke is very much in the foreground of Schechtman’s narrative account as well. In The Constitution of Selves (1996: 15), Schechtman claims,

The argument that personal identity must be defined in psychological terms is first systematically presented and defended by Locke in his Essay concerning Human Understanding

Schechtman then goes on to show that the project of psychological continuity theorists is “incoherent” because

[t]he goal of offering reidentification criterion is fundamentally at odds with the goal of defining personal identity in terms of psychological continuity…. (1996: 24)

Importantly, Schechtman does this not just by making a passing reference to Locke and then treating Parfit, Perry, and the like, but via a thorough examination of Locke’s theory, and the objections raised to it by Butler, Reid, and others.

Moreover, this is the case not only in Schechtman’s earlier work, but in her most recent work as well. Schechtman includes a thirty-two page chapter titled, “Locke and the Psychological Continuity Theorists” at the start of Staying Alive: Personal Identity, Practical Concerns, and the Unity of a Life (2014), and in “Memory, Identity, and Sameness of Consciousness”, Schechtman turns to recent developments in the psychological study of memory to update Locke’s view to “…capture some of the crucial insights of Locke’s account, and show why it remains relevant and influential” (in The Lockean Mind, forthcoming).

Those who defend animalism—or the view that persons just are human organisms—hold a position that is quite different from psychological continuity theories or narrative based views. Still, most animalists respond to Locke. Some even invoke Locke’s view as they develop their own. For example, Eric Olson’s animalist view relies very heavily both on Locke’s conception of “life”, and the persistence conditions Locke gives for organisms (1997: 137–138, etc.). This is why Olson describes his view as “Lockean”.

At the same time, some animalists blame Locke for separating the discussion of persons and personal identity from the discussion of human beings or human animals. In Animalism: New Essays on Persons, Animals & Identity, Stephen Blatti and Paul Snowdon ask, “Why was the idea of an animal conspicuously absent…” in the personal identity debate for so long (2016: 3)? They go on,

To answer this question, we need to return to Locke’s famous discussion of personal identity, in which the notion of an animal was central…Locke exercised great care in specifying the different ideas for which the words ‘animal’ and ‘person’ stood. A reasonable conjecture, or proposal, we suggest, is that Locke’s treatment of these two terms and notions was so effective that it generated in people engaging with the problem the conviction that the notion of a person is the central one fixing the type of thing the problem is about, with the consequence that the notion of an animal was lost to sight. (2016: 3)

Locke does much to distinguish between human beings (or men)—which are animals—and persons, and Blatti and Snowdon assert that this sets the stage for how the personal identity debate plays out for the next several hundred years. In other words, Locke is the reason that animalist views do not emerge until later in the twentieth century.[16]

Finally, even those working to carve out an entirely new space for the discussion of persons and their persistence conditions say something about Locke as they proceed. Leke Adeofe outlines and develops a tripartite picture of persons according to what he calls the “African thought system”. As he does, Adeofe aligns his approach with Locke’s. He says,

My approach, partly descriptive and partly imaginative, ought to be familiar; it has been borrowed from a tradition that dates back at least to John Locke. (2004: 69)

Moreover, this is the case even though Adeofe uses the African, or Yoruba, conception of “person” to challenge Western philosophy’s treatment of persons and their persistence conditions.

In Real People: Personal Identity Without Thought Experiments (1988), Kathleen Wilkes takes aim at the proliferation of thought experiments in the personal identity literature. It is clear that Wilkes has the elaborate thought experiments that Parfit employs (including teletransportation, split brain cases, etc.) in mind throughout her critique. But, it is also clear that Wilkes traces this methodology back to Locke. Of this she says,

The subject of personal identity…has probably exploited the method [of thought experiments] more than any other problem area in philosophy. Many of the examples are familiar:…Locke testing ‘what we would say if’ the soul of a cobbler migrated into the body of a prince, or if the Mayor of Queinborough awoke one day with all of Socrates’ memories. (Wilkes 1988: 6)

The “prince and the cobbler” passage, or L-N 2.27.15, proceeds in the opposite direction, with Locke asking us what we would conclude about the soul of a prince entering and informing the body of a cobbler, but, regardless, Wilkes takes Locke and the tradition that follows, as her target as she works to move the discussion of personal identity away from fantasy cases and toward real-life ones.

Locke’s discussion of personal identity is central to the current debate over persons and their persistence conditions. Nevertheless, there are many different versions of Locke’s view that contemporary metaphysicians take themselves to be embracing or rejecting. Even those who describe their respective views as “Lockean”—Parfit and Olson, for instance—can end up defending very different pictures of persons. This highlights just how difficult it is to determine what Locke’s view on persons and their persistence conditions amounts to, despite how clear its importance is.

Bibliography

Primary Literature by Locke

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Other Internet Resources

Acknowledgments

I am grateful to the Chicago Early Modern Round Table for helpful feedback on an earlier draft of this entry, Shelley Weinberg and an anonymous referee from SEP for insightful comments on later drafts. I’m also deeply indebted to Margaret Atherton, John Whipple, Marya Schechtman, and the many audiences I’ve gotten feedback from when I was just starting to think about Locke on personhood and personal identity.

Copyright © 2019 by
Jessica Gordon-Roth <gordo216@umn.edu>

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