First published Mon Apr 7, 2014; substantive revision Mon Jul 15, 2019

Among the questions to be raised under the heading of “personal identity” are these: “What are we?” (fundamental nature question) and “Under what conditions do we persist through time?” (persistence question). Against the dominant neo-Lockean approach to these questions, the view known as animalism answers that each of us is an organism of the species Homo sapiens and that the conditions of our persistence are those of animals. Beyond describing the content and historical background of animalism and its rivals, this entry explores some of the arguments for and objections to this controversial account of our nature and persistence.

1. Formulating Animalism

Despite its Aristotelian heritage, animalism is a relative newcomer to the personal identity debate. While early intimations of the view can be found in work by Wiggins (1980) and Wollheim (1984), those primarily responsible for injecting the view into the contemporary debate over personal identity include Ayers (1991), Carter (1989, 1999), Olson (1997), Snowdon (1990, 1991, 1995), and van Inwagen (1990). Though its supporters appear to remain in the minority, animalism has since attracted other advocates, including Bailey (2016, 2017), Blatti (2012), DeGrazia (2005), Hacker (2007), Hershenov (2005a), D. Mackie (1999a,b), Merricks (2001), and Wiggins (2001). Notable critics include Baker (2000, 2016), Johnston (2007, 2016), McMahan (2002), Noonan (1998, 1989 [2019]), Parfit (2012), and S. Shoemaker (1999, 2011, 2016), among others.

The name ‘animalism’ was conferred by Snowdon (1991: 109) and has been widely adopted. The view is also sometimes referred to as “the organism view” (e.g., Liao 2006), the “biological criterion” (e.g., D. Shoemaker 2009), or “the biological approach” (e.g., Olson 1997).

1.1 Our Fundamental Nature

Animalism’s hallmark claim concerns our basic metaphysical nature: whether we are material or immaterial; simple or composite; substance, property, process, or event; organic or inorganic; etc. In this context, the animalist asserts simply:

We are animals.

Despite its plainness, (1′) is easily misinterpreted (for discussion, see D. Mackie 1999b: 230–33; Olson 2003: 318–21; and Snowdon 2014: ch. 1). According to the intended reading, the ‘we’ picks out human persons such as you and me. Nevertheless, (1′) should not be taken to assert that all persons are animals. It leaves open the possibilities of both non-animal people (e.g., robots, angels, aliens, deities) and human animals that are not people (e.g., patients in persistent vegetative states, human fetuses). The ‘are’ reflects the ‘is’ of numerical identity. Consequently, animalism is not the view that each of us is “constituted by” a particular organism, in the way that a statue is sometimes said to be non-identically constituted by the hunk of matter with which it coincides (see section 2.3). Nor still should (1′) be understood to claim that each of us has a body that is an animal—as if you were one thing and your animal body another. Finally, ‘animals’ refers to biological organisms—members of the primate species Homo sapiens. While participants on both sides of the debate over animalism tend to treat these terms interchangeably, some prominent critics distinguish ‘animals’ from ‘organisms’ and deny that these terms co-refer (e.g., Johnston 2007: 55–56, S. Shoemaker 2011: 353).

Expressed in logical notation and individualized, (1′) is sometimes presented in the following form:

\(\Box (\forall x) (x \text{ is a human person} \rightarrow x \text{ is an animal})\).

This says: necessarily, for any object x, if x is a human person, then x is an animal, i.e., necessarily, human persons are animals. While neither (1′) nor (1″) is unproblematic (see, e.g., Johansson 2007 and Toner 2011), it is clear enough what they do not suggest. According to the animalism account of our most fundamental nature, we are not

  • immaterial souls or egos (Descartes; Foster 1991);
  • material bodies (Thomson 1997; Williams 1957);
  • body-soul complexes (Swinburne 1984);
  • bundles of mental states (Hume; Rovane 1998; S. Campbell 2006);
  • material simples (Chisholm 1978 [1989]; Lowe 1996, 2001);
  • parts of brains (Puccetti 1973; McMahan 2002);
  • persons materially constituted by, but nonidentical with, animals (S. Shoemaker 1999; Baker 2000; Johnston 2007); or
  • nothing at all (Unger 1979a,b; cf. Unger 1990).

Having said that, this entry will focus primarily on animalism’s positive assertions, rather than on animalist criticisms of each of its rival views. The interested reader is directed to Olson 2007 and Snowdon 2014, which not only include qualified defenses of (1), but also raise a host of criticisms of the foregoing alternatives—criticisms that, if not motivated by an acceptance of (1), are at least consistent with its truth.

It bears mention that animalism is sometimes formulated slightly differently as:

We are essentially animals.

On this construal, animalism is the view that we could not exist except as animals. Indeed, some have alleged that a commitment to (1′) is insufficient to qualify anyone as an animalist and that this label should be reserved only for those committed to both (1′) and (1‴) (Belshaw 2011: 401; cf. Olson 2007: 26–27, Snowdon 1990). Insistence on this point is probably innocuous, however, since most philosophers accept that all animals (human and otherwise) are essentially animals, in which case, (1‴) follows immediately from (1′).

Unless otherwise noted, in what follows, ‘(1)’ will be treated as referring equivocally to (1′), (1″), and (on the assumption that all animals are essentially animals) (1‴).

1.2 Our Persistence

While it is a claim about our fundamental nature that is most readily associated with the name, animalism also incorporates a view about our persistence. Stated in its most general form, this view asserts the following:

The conditions whose satisfaction is necessary and sufficient for a past or future being to be identical with a human person that exists now just are those whose satisfaction is necessary and sufficient for a past or future being to be identical with an animal that exists now.

All animalists subscribe to (2), so far as it goes. But it does not go very far. What exactly are the conditions of (human) animal continuity? Although animalists are mostly in agreement, there is a subtle and seldom acknowledged rift between two camps of animalist thinking about the answer to this question.

According to the first camp, remaining alive is both a necessary and a sufficient condition for the persistence of human animals. Human-animal persistence thus consists in the continuation of those processes constitutive of biological life. As Olson puts it, “one survives just in case one’s purely animal functions—metabolism, the capacity to breathe and circulate one’s blood, and the like—continue” (1997: 16). On this view, an animal’s life is understood as

a self-organizing biological event that maintains the organism’s complex internal structure. The materials that organisms are made up of are intrinsically unstable and must therefore be constantly repaired and renewed, or else the organism dies and its remains decay. An organism must constantly take in new particles, reconfigure and assimilate them into its living fabric, and expel those that are no longer useful to it. An organism’s life enables it to persist and retain its characteristic structure despite constant material turnover. (Olson 2007: 28)

This first animalist answer to the persistence question, then, can be glossed as follows:

Given a human animal, x, existing at one time, \(t_1\), and something, y, existing at a later time, \(t_2\), y is identical with x if and only if y continues the life processes previously undergone by x.

Once (2a) is conjoined with the animalist answer to the fundamental nature question, (1), we have a view that might be labeled “organic animalism”. Notable advocates of this view include Olson and van Inwagen (1990). Of course, it follows from the organicist view that death will constitute the end of our existence. Whatever else may remain following our deaths, each of us will cease to exist when we die. Indeed, strictly speaking on this view, there is no such thing as a dead animal (or perhaps—if ‘dead’ is a non-attributive adjective like ‘fake’—that a “dead animal” is not an animal).

Those in the second animalist camp deny that being alive is a necessary condition for the persistence of human animals. On their view, a human animal (like all organisms) is a functionally organized physical object whose membership in a particular species is attributed to its origin and structure. Only if it is so gruesome as to destroy this structure will an organism’s death bring about its nonexistence. We persist, David Mackie puts it, “as long as this organisation of [our] constituent parts remains sufficiently nearly intact” (1999b: 237).

But this focus on the functional organization of animal bodies should be taken neither as discounting altogether the significance of the life processes emphasized by organicists nor as affirming a traditional bodily criterion of persistence. On the contrary, on this view, a human animal’s

life is both a consequence or inseparable function of its origin and the continuing explanation of its structure and parts at any moment of its existence. Life is essential to the thing in so far as it is inconceivable that it (this thing) should have come into existence as a non-living thing. (Ayers 1991: vol. 2: 224)

“But”, Ayers continues, “that is not to say that when it dies the thing itself will cease to exist: merely that an explanation of the existence and structure of the thing will then refer to a life that is over” (ibid.).

In contrast with their organicist counterparts, these animalists answer the persistence question along the following lines:

the persistence of biological organisms depends on their retaining (enough of) the organisation of parts that is the product of their natural biological development, and that makes them apt for life, while stopping short of saying that life itself is necessary. (D. Mackie 1999b: 236)

In short:

Given a human animal, x, existing at one time, \(t_1\), and something, y, existing at a later time, \(t_2\), y is identical with x if and only if y retains a sufficient degree of the life-apt structure of constituent parts previously exhibited by x.

Hereafter, ‘somatic animalism’ will refer to the conjunction of (1) and (2b). In addition to Ayers and Mackie, notable somaticists include Carter (1989, 1999) and Feldman (1992).

It is worth emphasizing that the debate between somatic and organic animalists is not merely verbal and that the sort of linguistic evidence sometimes marshaled (e.g., by D. Mackie 1999b) is—while germane—unlikely to settle the question at issue. The debate between somaticist and organicist conceptions of the conditions of animal continuity reflects a substantive (if, as yet, inadequately explored) disagreement about the nature of (human) animals. (Are they essentially living? How ought life itself be understood?) Moreover, while the issue of whether something can be both an animal and dead illustrates the somaticist-organicist debate, it is hardly the only context in which that debate manifests itself. The same debate could be illustrated when considering unborn human fetuses, human animals in suspended animation, etc.

2. The Lockean Legacy

Toward the end of his magisterial two-volume commentary on John Locke, Ayers writes that

for all the transformation of our motives, indeed, of our general philosophical theory … the debate on personal identity has hardly moved on since the innovations of the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries. (1991: vol. 2: 281)

In a similar spirit, S. Shoemaker recently adapted Whitehead’s famous remark, observing that “the history of the topic of personal identity has been a series of footnotes to Locke” (2008: 313). It is certainly undeniable that no single discussion of personal identity has done more to shape the current debate than the chapter titled “Of Identity and Diversity” that Locke added to the second edition of his Essay Concerning Human Understanding (II.xxvii). (Hereafter, all textual references to Locke are to this work, Locke 1689 [1975].) Also undeniable is the effect these pages have had on the emergence of the animalist alternative to the Lockean approach to personal identity. For whatever intuitive appeal animalism may seem to have in our secular, post-Darwinian climate, in the wake of Locke’s work, the falsity of animalism was long taken for granted.

2.1 Locke’s Human/Person Distinction

From an animalist perspective, the most significant aspect of Locke’s famous discussion is the sharp distinction he draws between the human animal (“man”) and the person. Unlike a mass of matter—which consists merely in “the Cohesion of Particles … any how united” (II.xxvii.4)—a living organism (e.g., oak tree, horse, human animal) is a structurally complex material object whose functional organization is conducive to continued life. A person, by contrast, is a “thinking intelligent Being, that has reason and reflection, and can consider it self as it self, the same thinking thing in different times and places; which it does by that consciousness, which is inseparable from thinking” (II.xxvii.9).

By classifying “man” with other organisms and then drawing a distinction between organisms and persons, Locke recognizes that he is prying apart the traditional notion of “man” as rational, on the one hand, and animal, on the other. Against this traditional understanding, he introduces a thought experiment involving a rational parrot (II.xxvii.8). Our unwillingness to call this parrot a “man” simply because it is an animal possessed of language and reason illustrates that not all rational animals are men. Nor are all men rational animals: “whoever should see a Creature of his own Shape and Make, though it had no more reason all its Life, than a Cat or a Parrot, would call him still a Man” (ibid.). The human/person distinction gains traction once it is coupled with one of the Essay’s key insights, viz. that sortal concepts (e.g., human animal, person) are often (though not always) associated with different identity criteria. “Identity”—as he puts it in the title of the section in which this insight is first registered—is “suited to the Idea”: “such as is the Idea belonging to [a] Name, such must be the Identity” (II.xxvii.7). Locke is keenly aware of the significance of this principle; “if it had been a little more carefully attended to”, he admonishes, it “would possibly have prevented a great deal of that Confusion, which often occurs about this Matter … especially concerning Personal Identity” (ibid.). And indeed, it is this insight about the association of sortal concepts and identity criteria that encourages the thought in Locke that human animals and persons are governed by different criteria of identity. Whereas a human animal persists just in case “the same continued Life [is] communicated to different Particles of Matter, as they happen successively to be united to that organiz’d living Body” (II.xxvii.8), when one “consider[s] what Person stands for”, Locke contends, one finds that its persistence consists in “the sameness of a rational Being”. He explains: “as far as this consciousness can be extended backwards to any past Action or Thought, so far reaches the Identity of that Person” (II.xxvii.9).

The impetus behind Locke’s human/person distinction was the ongoing debate amongst seventeenth- and eighteenth-century theologians and philosophers concerning the metaphysics of resurrection. Their challenge was to account for the Biblical prediction that the dead would be resurrected on judgment day. But what is it exactly that gets resurrected? The physical particles associated with a living organism are in a state of constant flux. The set of particles associated with an organism changes from one moment to the next and may turnover completely (perhaps several times) during the course of an organism’s life. Moreover, whether due to decomposition and/or because they are consumed by other organisms, the particles associated with an organism at its death will be widely dispersed. These facts alone make it unlikely, if not impossible, that the resurrection of each individual will involve the reconstitution of that individual’s former “body”. The human/person distinction supplies Locke with the resources to resolve this problem because, on his view, something is a person not because of the material or immaterial substance in which it is grounded—a question on which Locke remains steadfastly agnostic, though he is inclined to think the underlying substance is immaterial (II.xxvii.25)—but in virtue of the psychological capacities it exercises, viz. self-consciousness and rationality. And a person persists “as far as” the exercise of those capacities “reaches” (II.xxvii.9): “For the same consciousness being preserv’d, whether in the same or different Substances, the personal Identity is preserv’d” (II.xxvii.13). Thus the way is clear for Locke to assert that one and the same person may be resurrected even if that person comes to inhabit an altogether different body than any with which she was previously associated (II.xxvii.15).

It is in the context of his solution to this problem that Locke introduces the famous thought experiment involving the prince and the cobbler—not as a puzzle in need of explanation, but as a case whose apparent plausibility vindicates the human/person distinction (and thereby, his solution to the problem of the resurrection). If “the soul of the prince, carrying with it the consciousness of the Prince’s past Life, [were to] enter and inform the Body of a Cobler as soon as deserted by his own Soul”, Locke enjoins his reader, “every one sees, he would be the same Person with the Prince, accountable only for the Prince’s Actions: But who would say it was the same Man?” (II.xxvii.15, emphasis added). This thought experiment is often taken to support a psychological criterion of personal identity. The precise form of such a criterion has been the subject of much dispute, both in Locke’s time and subsequently. Locke himself is sometimes said (probably incorrectly) to have advocated a memory criterion, according to which a person, x, existing at one time, \(t_1\), and a person, y, existing at a later time, \(t_2\), y is identical with x if and only if y remembers experiences had by x. Whether or not this was Locke’s view, generally speaking, psychological criteria of personal identity assert that a psychological relation of some sort (i.e. a relation involving memory, characteristics and dispositions, beliefs, desires, rationality, etc.) is necessary and/or sufficient for each of us to persist through time.

Another important dimension of the human/person distinction is also signaled in this example, viz. the person as locus of moral accountability. On Locke’s view, it is in virtue of their capacities for self-consciousness and rationality that persons not only persist through time, but also are prudentially concerned and morally and legally responsible for actions committed at other times. According to Locke, a person should be punished only for those actions that she can remember having committed (II.xxvii.20). This is true not only in the case of divine law carried out on judgment day—when “the secrets of all Hearts shall be laid open” and rewards and punishments meted out for the good and bad deeds undertaken throughout the course of our lives (II.xxvii.26)—but also, more generally, in the course of everyday legal and moral affairs. So it is that ‘person’ functions as “a Forensick Term appropriating Actions and their Merit” (ibid.) and in “personal Identity is founded all the Right and Justice of Reward and Punishment” (II.xxvii.18).

In discussing these normative aspects of personhood, Locke raises and answers an obvious objection in a way that anticipates some strains of the contemporary debate. “Suppose”, he says,

I wholly lose the memory of some parts of my Life, beyond a possibility of retrieving them, so that perhaps I shall never be conscious of them again; yet am I not the same Person, that did those Actions, had those Thoughts, that I was once conscious of, though I have now forgot them? (II.xxvii.20)

Locke replies that, although they typically refer to both the same human animal and the same person, self-referring personal pronouns can be equivocal. So the question “Did I do such and so?” can be ambiguous as between “Did the person to which ‘I’ presently refers do such and so?” and “Did the human animal to which ‘I’ presently refers do such and so?” In Locke’s amnesiac case, the answer to the first question is no, while the answer to the second question is yes: “the Word I is applied to … the Man only” (ibid.).

Two aspects of Locke’s discussion of this case are salient to the contemporary discussion. The first, of course, is the view that, if I am incapable of recalling having done this or that, then the person responsible for the action in question is not the person I am, even if the person who is responsible for that action occupied the same human animal presently occupied by the person I am (see Johansson 2016, D. Shoemaker 2009, 2016, and Sauchelli 2017a). The second is the idea that the first-person pronoun can refer equivocally in a way that tracks the human/person distinction (see section 3.2).

A host of interpretive questions can be raised concerning the historical distinction between human animals and persons, and some of these may be of interest to participants in the contemporary debate between animalism and its rivals. For example, whether Locke’s distinction reflects a conceptual or an ontological difference remains a point of controversy amongst historians of the period (e.g., Bolton 1994; Chappell 1989; Thiel 1997 and 1998). But setting aside these scholarly matters, the features of Locke’s distinction that are uncontroversially endorsed by Locke as well as especially relevant for the current debate include the following:

  1. our capacities for self-consciousness and rationality are tied not to our being human animals, but to our being persons;
  2. the locus of moral responsibility is not the human animal, but the person;
  3. persons, but not human animals, persist just in case their psychological states are linked in appropriate ways; and
  4. during the course of its life, a human animal may coincide with zero, one, or more than one person, and something need not be a human animal in order to be occupied by a person (e.g., Locke’s rational parrot).

2.2 Animalism and the Human/Person Distinction

It should be emphasized at this point that animalists do not deny that there is a distinction to be drawn between human animals and persons. This, in part, is why the formulation of (1) that is sometimes ascribed to animalists—“persons are human animals”—is misleading. In fact, there are several aspects of Locke’s discussion that animalists uphold.

For example, animalists often ally their answer to the persistence question with Locke’s identity criteria for human animals (e.g., Olson 2007: 28). Of course, since organic animalists affirm and somatic animalists deny that being alive is a necessary condition of our persistence, Locke cannot be an ally to both camps. For his part, D. Mackie (1999b: 235–39) classifies Locke as an organicist. However, enough passages from the Essay suggest otherwise (some of which Mackie himself acknowledges—e.g., in II.xxvii.4–5) that the more circumspect conclusion may be that Locke was either inconsistent or just ambivalent on the matter. Animalists are also sympathetic to Locke’s account of personhood—albeit with a different understanding of the type of concept person is—and this alternative understanding allows animalists to endorse element (d) above.

What animalists reject is Locke’s claim that ‘person’ names a sortal concept (e.g., Snowdon 2014: ch. 3). Rather, following Olson (1997: ch. 2), most animalists insist that ‘person’ names only a phase sortal concept (or status concept, see Hacker 2007). (The idea of a “phased sortal”, as he called them, is due to Wiggins [1967, 2001].) Unlike a sortal concept, which determines the persistence conditions of its instances, a phase sortal concept is a concept to which its instances belong temporarily, for only a phase of their existence (e.g., teenager). Simply by reaching a particular age, for example, something that was not a teenager can become a teenager without ceasing to exist. Likewise, something that was a teenager can cease to be a teenager without ceasing to exist. So too, animalists say, with person. Personhood, they claim, is a phase that something begins upon acquiring the psychological capacities that Locke identifies (self-consciousness and rationality) and concludes upon losing those capacities. In this way, being a person is a matter of what something can do, rather than what something is. In Olson terminology, person is a “functional kind”, akin to locomotor (1997: 31–37). A locomotor is anything that is able to move about under its own power, be it a garden slug or a ballistic missile. Likewise, Olson argues (following Locke), a person is anything that is able to think in certain ways—anything that “is rational, … ordinarily conscious and aware of itself as tracing a path through time and space, … [and] morally accountable for its actions” (1997: 32). Many things besides human animals can be persons on this view: an angel, a god, a machine, an animal, an immaterial soul, an alien, etc.. In the case of human animals, we ordinarily become persons not at conception or at birth, but around the age of two. And while it is possible for a human animal to go out of existence at the same moment that she ceases to be a person (e.g., if she steps on an active landmine), it is also possible for a human animal to continue existing long after he has ceased to be a person (e.g., if he lapses into a persistent vegetative state).

2.3 Animalism(s) vs. Neo-Lockeanism(s)

Animalism’s principal rival is not infrequently identified as “neo-Lockeanism”. This way of staging the debate dates back at least as far as a prominent exchange between Noonan (1998, 2001) and D. Mackie (1999a). Also, the first monograph dedicated to animalism mounts a sustained attack on the “psychological approach” to personal identity—an approach whose “best-known advocate … is, of course, Locke” (Olson 1997: 20). And the “animalism vs. neo-Lockeanism” opposition remains common in contemporary discussions (e.g., S. Campbell 2001; Hershenov 2012; Johnston 2010; Robinson 2016; S. Shoemaker 2008).

In one respect, setting things up in this way is fairly harmless. Views classified as “neo-Lockean” share a common commitment to a psychological criterion of personal identity (whether that criterion requires direct psychological connectedness or merely overlapping chains of psychological continuity) that animalists universally oppose. But ultimately, the simple “animalism vs. neo-Lockeanism” dichotomy is too coarse-grained and exclusionary to provide a particularly informative taxonomy of the contemporary debate. For example, whilst all animalists resist a psychological criterion of persistence, the distinction between organic and somatic animalisms (section 1.2) shows us that the source of this resistance varies significantly. And, as the list given above indicates (section 1.1), animalism’s answer to the fundamental nature question is opposed by a wide range of views, not all of which are properly classified as neo-Lockean. Moreover, as we shall see in what follows, the “neo-Lockeanism” label both obscures importantly different varieties of neo-Lockeanism and ignores different rationales given for those views.

Whilst a comprehensive taxonomy of alternatives to animalism is neither feasible nor necessary in the present context, one step in the right direction would be to differentiate those neo-Lockean views that rely on the notion of material constitution from those that do not. Those that do—call this type of view “constitutionalist neo-Lockeanism”—are today regarded as the leading opposition to animalism. Advocates of this form of neo-Lockeanism (including Baker, Johnston, and S. Shoemaker) contend that each of us “is” an animal only in the sense that (according to some) a statue “is” the piece of marble, viz. by being materially colocated and yet distinguished by one or more modal, temporal, and/or relational properties. On this view, we are persons non-identically constituted by human animals.

Despite this common reliance on the notion of material constitution, there are significant differences between the views advocated by animalism’s constitutionalist neo-Lockean opponents. According to S. Shoemaker (1984), for instance, it is the capacity for thought that distinguishes the mental subject you are from the human animal that constitutes you. Partly because it is embedded within his broader, functionalist response to the mind/body problem, Shoemaker’s arguments against animalism and animal thought are complex (see section 3.2 for further discussion). But roughly, on his view, animals are incapable of thinking because they do not persist under the appropriate conditions. Psychological continuity is sufficient for the persistence of any being endowed with the capacity to think, and since psychological continuity is not sufficient for a (human) animal to persist, animals are not thinking beings. And because each of us is a thinking being, we are not animals. (For a thorough presentation of Shoemaker’s most recent thinking on this topic, see his 1999, 2004, 2008, 2011, 2016.)

Perhaps the most extensive elaboration of the constitutionalist approach has been given by Baker (2000, 2002, 2007). On her view, the property that distinguishes the persons we are from the human animals that constitute us is a form of self-consciousness that she calls the “first-person perspective” (2000: ch. 3). It is from this perspective that “one thinks of oneself as an individual facing a world, as a subject distinct from everything else”; it is what enables us “to conceive of one’s body and mental states as one’s own” (2000: 60, 4). On her view, persons have their first-person perspectives essentially, and they “persist as long as [their] first-person perspectives are exemplified” (2016: 51; see also 2000: 132–41).

At the heart of this view is what Baker has recently labeled her “Key Distinction” (2007: 43; 2016: 53). Constitutionalists maintain that constituting objects (e.g., pieces of marble) and constituted objects (e.g., statues) can share some of their properties. For instance, a statue shares its physical and aesthetic properties with the piece of marble that constitutes it; likewise, Baker will claim, a person shares its physical and psychological properties with the human animal that constitutes it. But these objects cannot share all of their properties in the same way, or else there would be no difference between the constituting and the constituted. So Baker draws an exhaustive and mutually exclusive distinction between two ways that objects can instantiate properties: derivatively or nonderivatively. Roughly, an object has a property derivatively if it instantiates it only in virtue of being colocated with another object, whereas an object instantiates a property nonderivatively if it instantiates that property independently of being colocated with another object. We might express this distinction more perspicuously as follows. If one object (x) constitutes another object (y) and both objects instantiate some property (F), then

  1. x (the constituting object) instantiates F nonderivatively in the event it would instantiate F even if it did not constitute y (the constituted object);
  2. y instantiates F nonderivatively in the event that x would fail to instantiate F if x did not constitute y; and
  3. y instantiates F derivatively in the event that x would instantiate F even if it did not constitute y.

Consider, for example, a marble statue of a giant ogre. In this case, (i) the piece of marble instantiates the property of being three meters tall nonderivatively (because it would be three meters tall even if it did not constitute the statue); (ii) the statue instantiates the property of being ugly nonderivatively (because the piece of marble with which it is colocated would not be ugly if it did not constitute a statue); and (iii) the statue instantiates the property of being three meters tall derivatively (because the piece of marble would be three meters tall even if it did not constitute the statue). (Still more precise elaborations of Baker’s Key Distinction are given in her 2000: 46–58 and 2007: 166–69. A number of critics have argued that the distinction generates more heat than light; see, e.g., Hershenov 2009; Olson 2007: ch. 3; Zimmerman 2002; and contributions to the Field Guide to the Philosophy of Mind online symposium on Baker 2000.)

Baker argues by analogy that, as it goes for marble statues, so it goes for human persons. On her view, each of us is an animal, but (contra the animalist) only derivatively. Baker’s answer to the fundamental nature question is that we are persons; each of us possesses the first-person perspective essentially and nonderivatively. In the course of ordinary development, a human animal develops increasingly sophisticated psychological capacities (just like the piece of marble develops aesthetic characteristics as the sculptor chisels away at it). Once these capacities include a first-person perspective, a person comes into existence, and this person is constituted by the human animal (2000: 115–16; cf. 2007: 72–82). Since the animal would not have a first-person perspective if it did not come to constitute the person, it shares this perspective with the person in the same way that the piece of marble shares the property of being ugly with the statue of the ogre, viz. derivatively.

On Baker’s view, the first-person perspective is unique to persons. Without this perspective, she argues, a being cannot refer to itself using first-person pronouns, for this ability requires that one be able to conceive of oneself both as the subject of mental events and as the object that embodies the subject of those events. Because the human animal that constitutes you possesses a first-person perspective only derivatively, then, it is unable to self-refer. That said, Baker does not claim that person-constituting human animals lack cognitive and experiential capacities altogether. Nor does she claim that they possess these capacities only derivatively. Like many of the “higher” nonhuman animals, human animals are subjects of an array of mental phenomena, including pains and pleasures, beliefs and desires. Such phenomena require not the “strong” or “robust” first-person perspective characteristic of persons, but only what Baker calls a “weak” or “rudimentary” first-person perspective—roughly, the capacity to experience the world from an egocentric point of view (2000: 60–64). And just as the statue inherits the property of being three meters tall from the piece of marble, so too the person possesses these lesser psychological capacities only derivatively because the human animal would possess these capacities even if it did not constitute the person.

Neo-Lockean resistance to animalism that is not linked to constitutionalism is an even more diverse lot. One of the prevailing views in the non-constitutionalist neo-Lockeanism category rejects animalism by identifying the person with a proper part of the human animal—typically, the brain or one of its (spatial or temporal) parts. On this view, the human animal thinks only derivatively, in virtue of having a thinking brain as a part. Among those who advocate views along this line are Puccetti (1973), Persson (1999), McMahan (2002), Hudson (2001), and more recently Parfit (2012). Animalist responses to these views are given by Hershenov (2005b, 2016) and Olson (2007: ch. 4). Also relevant are the various thought experiments raised by non-constitutionalist neo-Lockeans (e.g., Lewis 1976; Parfit 1984) that seem to count against animalism; for instance, thought experiments involving teletransportation and transplantation. See section 3.4 for some discussion of these cases.

3. Arguments for and Objections to Animalism

Particularly when introduced in isolation, animalism—especially (1)—might strike one as obviously true. In his book-length treatment of the view, Snowdon demonstrates at length how animalism “represents the default conception of ourselves” (2014: 106). And in an earlier article, he notes:

The central claim of animalism is in some ways a curious proposition to assert. It is natural to respond to its assertion in the words of Wittgenstein: “Only whom are we informing of this? And on what occasion?”. (1995: 72; Wittgenstein 1953: 101e)

Olson echoes this sentiment, writing that we certainly

seem to be animals. When you eat or sleep or talk, a human animal eats, sleeps, or talks. When you look in the mirror, and animal looks back at you. Most ordinary people suppose that we are animals. … Compared with [competing] proposals, the idea that we are animals looks like plain common sense. (2007: 23)

But common sense will not settle the issue because some of animalism’s rivals are supported by other, equally intuitive considerations. In addition to common sense, then, what arguments can be marshaled in support of animalism?

3.1 Thinking Animal Argument

The standard argument for (1) is variously referred to as the “thinking animal argument” (Olson 1997, 2003), the “too many minds objection” (S. Shoemaker 1999), the “two lives objection” (S. Campbell 2006), and the “too many thinkers problem” (Parfit 2012: 7). It was developed by Snowdon (1990: 91), Carter (1988), McDowell (1997: 237), and Ayers (1991, vol. 2: 283). It has since been sharpened and popularized by Olson (1997: 106–09, 2003: 325–30, 2007: 29–39). Here it is:

Presently sitting in your chair is a human animal.
The human animal sitting in your chair is thinking.
You are the thinking being sitting in your chair.
Therefore, the human animal sitting in your chair is you.

Whilst none of (P1), (P2), and (P3) is incontestable, nor is any one of them easily contested. Save perhaps for far-reaching metaphysical reasons (e.g., an antecedent commitment to idealism), few would deny the very existence of animals, nor the fact that a perfectly good specimen of the species Homo sapiens is presently seated in your chair. So (P1) is not easily rejected.

Moreover, concerning (P2), since it would be odd (to say the least) to deny that human animals think while accepting that porpoises and porcupines do, and since we can assume that the human animal in your chair is not atypical of its kind, whatever reasons one has for accepting that various nonhuman animals think apply equally to the human animal in your chair. While there are those who deny (in a sense) that any animal can think (e.g., Descartes, Johnston, S. Shoemaker), their positions strain empirical credibility and/or depend on fairly sophisticated metaphysical machinery. At first glance, anyway, (P2) is much easier to accept.

(P3) is also difficult to resist, since its denial would seem to require positing the existence of a thinking being in your chair other than yourself. For if (P1) and (P2) are true, and if it is true that you exist and are thinking, then denying (P3) results in the implication that you are but one of (at least) two thinkers seated in your chair. Such a view faces a host of difficult questions: practical questions (e.g., which of these beings owns the car parked out front?), epistemic questions (how do you determine which of these beings you are?), linguistic questions (to which of these beings do instances of the first-person pronoun refer?), ontological questions (what is the relationship between you and the qualitatively identical being with which you are associated?), and so on. These challenges have not passed unnoticed, and serious attempts have been made to address them. But, the animalist says, the trouble can be avoided from the start simply by conceding the truth of (P3).

So, while not necessarily unanswerable or insurmountable, the questions and problems that await one who rejects any of (P1) through (P3) are not insignificant. Animalism, then, has at least this much going for it.

3.2 Replies to the Thinking Animal Argument

Not all replies to the thinking animal argument have focused exclusively on, or even addressed themselves directly, to one or the other of the three premises that make up that argument. Nevertheless, many replies to animalism do concern questions raised by the thinking animal argument and may fruitfully be seen as addressing one or another of its premises.

For instance, according to Baker’s (2000, 2007) constitution view, (P3) should be rejected, since “thinking being sitting in your chair” is ambiguous as between the constituted person who thinks nonderivatively and the constituting human animal who thinks derivatively (section 2.3). And Noonan (1998, 2001) also detects an ambiguity in (P2) and (P3). According to his revisionist view of personal pronoun use, first-person thoughts and utterances refer only to persons, not to animals. On his view, we must distinguish between the referent of first-person thoughts and utterances, on the one hand, and the thinker of those thoughts and utterances, on the other hand. Noonan does not deny that the human animal sitting in your chair is capable of first-personal thinking. Nor does he deny that such thoughts (and the utterances that express them) successfully refer. But he does insist that, when the animal has a first-person thought or utters ‘I’, that thought or utterance refers not to the animal who thinks the thought but to the person with whom the animal shares its thoughts. (For further discussion, see Noonan 2012 and Olson 2002a, 2007: 37–39.)

And, although not initially developed as a response to the thinking animal argument, S. Shoemaker’s (1984, 1999, 2004) view represents a direct and formidable challenge to (P2). On his account, the human animal sitting in your chair is not thinking because no animal is capable of thinking. This in turn is because the capacity for thought requires persistence conditions that all animals, human or otherwise, lack: “mental properties”, Shoemaker writes, “can belong only to things having psychological persistence conditions” (2004: 528). A thinker’s psychological states play characteristic causal roles, and these states (in combination with others) tend to cause the thinking being whose states they are to behave in certain ways. Thus, for example, the state of being in pain may be caused by bodily damage of some kind and may dispose the one who is in pain to cry out or recoil.

The linchpin of Shoemaker’s view is his claim that the causal role of any psychological state as well as any other states involved in that causal role must all be states of one and the same thinking being (1999: 300). In other words, the effects typically brought about by a being’s psychological states cannot fail to occur in that very being. Olson summarizes the consequence of this commitment as follows:

if your cerebrum gets put into my head tomorrow, your current mental states will have their characteristic effects in the being who ends up with that organ, and not in the empty-headed thing left behind. By Shoemaker’s reasoning, the subject of those states—you—must therefore be the being who ends up with your transplanted cerebrum. Any being whose later states or actions are caused in the appropriate way by your current mental states must be you. In other words, psychological continuity of a sort must suffice for you or any other mental being to persist through time. Since no sort of psychological continuity suffices for any organism to persist … it follows that no organism could have mental properties. The nature of mental properties makes it metaphysically impossible for animals to think. (Olson 2007: 33–34.)

Shoemaker’s functionalist theory of mind has received considerable attention in the philosophy of mind. His view that animals cannot think and the implications of that claim for the thinking animal argument are discussed in Árnadóttir 2010, Hershenov 2006, Olson 2002b, and S. Shoemaker 2004, 2008, 2011, 2016.

Beyond these discussions of (P2) and (P3), much of the recent discussion concerning animalism has focused on such questions as whether one or more than one thinker is sitting in your chair; if more than one, which one is doing the thinking; and in what sense. Zimmerman (2008), for instance, objects to (P1) by noting that the rationale for the claim that a human animal is located where you are—in effect, that it is just obvious that there is an instance of the species Homo sapiens currently located where you are—extends equally to such things as “mere hunk of matter”, “mere body”, “psychological person”, and the like. Since the animalist does not accept that we are identical to any of these non-animals, the evident truth of (P1) will not be sufficient to establish the thinking animal argument’s conclusion. What is required, in other words, is not simply a reason for believing that (P1) is true—animalists, let us assume, are correct in insisting that few would deny it—but also a reason for denying the presence of other things besides a human animal. This is the “rival candidates problem”.

Closely related to this problem is another. The “thinking parts problem” charges that, even if you are a thinking being, no reason has been given to suppose that you are a thinking animal rather than any of the other thinking beings currently located where you are. To begin, consider all the parts of a human animal that are plausibly regarded as thinking: the head, the brain, the right-leg complement (i.e., the entire animal body minus the right leg), the entire animal from the waist up (torso, neck, and head), the left-arm complement minus a single electron in the animal’s liver, the left-arm complement minus a different electron in the animal’s liver, etc. For each of these thinking parts, an argument structurally analogous to the thinking animal argument could be constructed. For instance:

There is a human head currently located where you are.
The human head currently located where you are is thinking.
You are the thinking being located in your chair.
Therefore, the human head located where you are is you.


There is a torso-neck-and-head currently located where you are.
The torso-neck-and-head currently located where you are is thinking.
You are the thinking being located in your chair.
Therefore, the torso-neck-and-head located where you are is you.

And so on. If the thinking animal argument were sound, then it would follow (per impossibile) that you are identical with each of an infinite number of nonidentical thinking parts. Since you could be identical with no more than one of those things, and since the animalist has provided no principled explanation for why you are the whole animal and not one or another of the animal’s thinking parts, the thinking animal argument should be rejected.

Much of the discussion about animalism has been concerned with the rival candidates and thinking parts problems. (See, for instance, Blatti 2016; Lowe 2001; Madden 2016a; Olson 2007: 215–19 and 2015; Parfit 2012; Yang 2015.) One line of response draws on van Inwagen’s (1990) view of composite material beings. According to van Inwagen’s answer to what he calls the “special composition question”, the only composite objects that exist are living organisms. Only a living organism unifies the particles that compose it at any given moment, on this view. Such things as “mere hunk of matter” and “right-leg complement” are gerrymandered objects. And since they are not genuine composite objects, they are neither genuine rivals nor genuine thinkers. Olson (2008: 38–42) is, however, quick to acknowledge that this riposte will be welcomed only by those antecedently persuaded of van Inwagen’s view. And proponents of the rival candidates and thinking parts problems are particularly unlikely to count among van Inwagen’s supporters.

3.3 Animal Ancestors Argument

Even if these objections to the thinking animal argument can be answered, there is some irony in the fact that the fate of the hallmark argument for animalism should hang in the balance of disputes over the nature of mental properties and the individuation of thinkers. Thought is an essential ingredient not in animalism’s theory of our fundamental nature, but in the theories advanced by animalism’s neo-Lockean rivals. It is precisely our capacity for thought that animalists deny is essential to us; on the contrary, animalists say, each of us was once a non-thinking fetus and each of us may yet become a non-thinking persistent-vegetative-state patient.

Thus, a second argument attempts to ground animalism’s defense in a broader naturalistic context. The “animal ancestors argument” takes the form of a reductio. If (1) is false and we are not animals, then nor are our parents animals, in which case nor are our parents’ parents, nor our parents’ grandparents, and so on, as far back as our ancestries extend. But in that case, the falsity of animalism entails the rejection of evolutionary theory (or at least that theory’s applicability to us), since it denies that our distant ancestries includes beings who were animals. But, since the rejection of evolutionary theory is too high a price to pay, it is instead the assumption of animalism’s falsity that ought to be rejected. Whilst Blatti (2012) argues that this argument withstands a number of extant objections, it also faces challenges (Daly and Liggins 2013, Gillett 2013).

3.4 Further Objections, Implications, and Questions

The rival candidates and thinking parts problems are instances of what we might call “multiplication objections” to animalism. These objections try to demonstrate how advocates of animalism are committed to claiming (or incapable of denying) that one thing (you or me, say) is identical to each of two or more things. Yet another such objection is inspired by a rare type of conjoined twinning called dicephalus, which occurs when a human zygote divides only partially before implanting in the uterine wall. The result is twins conjoined below the neck. These twins look like a two-headed person, with distinct heads and necks sprouting from a single torso (Miller 1996). According to McMahan (2002: 35), because a pair of dicephalic twins is two people but only one animal, dicephalic twins appear to present a walking, talking counterexample to animalism’s hallmark claim, (1). (For further discussion, see Blatti 2007; T. Campbell and McMahan 2016; Liao 2006; Olson 2014; Reid 2016.)

Other objections aim to reveal animalism’s counterintuitive verdicts concerning the seemingly endless litany of fantastical thought experiments (many of them updated versions of Locke’s prince-cobbler case, see section 2.1) debated in the recent personal identity literature (S. Shoemaker 1963; Lewis 1976; Wiggins 1980; Parfit 1984). In one scenario, we are to imagine removing all or part (e.g., cerebrum) of your brain and transplanting it into a different (brain-less or cerebrum-less) human animal, with the (ex hypothesi) result that your psychological life and characteristics are continued in a different animal from the one you presently occupy. Another scenario envisions a similar feat via fanciful technology that can record all of your brain states and transfer that information into a different animal’s brain (previously wiped clean). Still another thought experiment imagines transporting you à la Star Trek by creating a blueprint of your physical and psychological states at one location, destroying you, and then replicating you at some distant location by creating a new object with all of the same physical and psychological states.

The differences between the details of these thought experiments are not insignificant. But for present purposes, let us collect them together under the label “transfer objections”, since the intuition all of them aim to arouse is that you can be relocated from one animal or location to another as a result of the processes described, so long as your memories, beliefs, desires, character traits, etc. are preserved. If the transferability intuition is correct, then (1) cannot be true, since psychological continuity is not sufficient for the persistence of a human animal. Indeed, for any of the procedures described in these cases—brain-transplant, brain-state transplant, teletransportation—given the choice between undergoing this procedure and annihilation, animalism entails that there is no self-interested reason to prefer the former.

The felt conviction of our prima facie beliefs about what would happen in these scenarios seems undeniable. Moreover, there is evidence to suggest that intuitions supporting some version of the psychological criterion are not only firmly felt, but quite common (Nichols and Bruno 2010). So how do animalists respond? While many animalists will concede the intuitions we have about these and other cases, they will also point out that we harbor many other pre-philosophical commitments besides. We are, for instance, strongly inclined to believe that many animals (human and otherwise) are capable of thinking (including remembering, believing, desiring, etc.). Likewise, we believe that there is just one thinker located where each of us is. But if, say, the intuition in the brain-transplant case is correct and you go with your brain when it gets transplanted into another body, then either the human animal left behind was never capable of thinking (since the brain was thinking and there was only one thinker in the vicinity) or there were multiple thinkers thinking your thoughts prior to the transplant (your animal and your brain). Surely these implications offend our pre-philosophical beliefs about ourselves too. Consequently, if there are answers to be had to the fundamental nature and persistence questions, then it is likely that those answers will reveal some of our pre-philosophical convictions to be correct, others not. (For further discussion, see Gendler 2002; Madden 2016b; Olson 1997; Snowdon 1991, 1995, 2014: chs. 10–11; and Wilkes 1988. And see Snowdon 2003 for a more thorough taxonomy of objections to animalism.)

Finally, beyond its contribution to the ancient debate over personal identity, animalism raises practical questions of great contemporary significance. For example, animalists are committed to claiming that each of us was once or might someday become a non-person (e.g., a fetus in a mother’s womb, a hospital patient in a persistent vegetative state). How are we to reconcile these implications of a metaphysical view with our ethical commitments regarding abortion and euthanasia? More generally, if animalism is correct, then our fundamental nature is indistinguishable from that of blue whales, myna birds, bonobo chimpanzees, and ring-tailed lemurs. How, in the light of this metaphysical view, are the ethical, legal, and policy debates that assume a sharp human/animal (us/them) contrast to be recalibrated? Such questions are only beginning to be explored (see, e.g., Johansson 2016; Sauchelli forthcoming, 2017a: ch. 5; D. Shoemaker 2009, 2013, 2016).


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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


The author is grateful to Remy Debes, Eric Olson, Gideon Rosen, and Paul Snowdon for helpful feedback on various drafts of this entry.

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