Notes to Locke’s Philosophy of Science

1. Throughout this section, I am indebted to the insightful discussions of Margaret Osler, “John Locke and the Changing Ideal of Scientific Knowledge” (1970), and Peter Dear, Chapter 1, Discipline and Experience.

2. See also Osler on this point: “Implicit in his claim that we possess scientific knowledge when ‘we know the cause on which the fact depends, as the cause of that fact and no other’ is the further claim that scientific knowledge comprises knowledge of the essential natures of things; for, without such knowledge, how could we know the ultimate causes of the facts in question?” (Osler 1970, p.4)

3. On this point, see Dear’s discussion, Discipline and Experience, pp. 22–23: “True scientific knowledge should be demonstratively certain, which required that its premises themselves be certain. Natural philosophy, however, as later scholastic writers often admitted, tended to fall short of this idea because of the merely ‘probable’ status of many of its experiential principles; it then represented ‘dialectical’ rather than demonstrative reasoning.”

4. On monstrous occurrences, see Dear, Discipline and Experience, pp. 18 and 20–21.

5. Dear discusses the variety of phenomena that could serve as experience: “For Aristotle, the nature of experience depended on its embeddedness in the community; the world was construed through communal eyes. Experience provided phenomena, and phenomena were, literally, data, ‘givens’; they were statements about how things behave in the world….The sources of phenomena were diverse, including common opinion and the assertions of philosophers as well as personal sense perception” (Dear, Discipline and Experience, p. 23).

6. On Aristotle, see, for example, Robin Smith’s interpretation. Aristotle avoids the regress threatened by a demonstration’s experience-based premises because he holds that “our minds are already so constituted as to be able to recognize the right objects, just as our eyes are already so constituted as to be able to perceive the colors that exist”; experience “actualizes the relevant potentialities in the soul” (Smith, “Aristotle’s Logic”, SEP). For the conception of knowledge extending from Aristotle, see Osler, “John Locke and the Changing Ideal of Scientific Knowledge” (1970). She identifies the following epistemological assumptions grounding the Aristotelian conception: “(1) that the world corresponds to our conceptions, and (2) that, consequently, it is possible for us to know the real natures of essences of substances existing in the world” (Osler 1970, p. 3).

7. See Park and Daston, pp. 3–4 on this point: “The medieval Latin scientia, although cognate with the modern English “science”, referred to any rigorous and certain body of knowledge that could be organized (in precept though not always in practice) in the form of syllogistic demonstrations from self-evident premises. Under this description, rational theology belonged to scientia—indeed, it was the ‘queen of sciences’—because its premises were the highest and most certain. Excluded, however, were disciplines that studied empirical particulars, such as medical therapeutics, natural history and alchemy, because there can be no absolute certainty about particular phenomena” (Park and Daston, pp. 3–4).

8. On the use of experiments to reveal fundamental principles in connection with demonstrations, see Wisan 1978; Jardine 1991, p. 110; Dear 1995, p. 22 and chapter 5. The extent and purposes of Galileo’s experiments has become a focus of investigation and some controversy. Recent discussions include Palmieri 1998; 2009; Van Dyck 2005.

9. As Osler writes, “During the Renaissance and seventeenth century, the growth of empirical investigation, especially in natural history, yielded less-than-certain knowledge about the world, making it increasingly difficult to assimilate natural philosophy into the Aristotelian apodictic model for science” (Osler 1998, p. 91).

10. Responding to an objection about the conflict of his law with observations, Descartes writes: “It often happens that experience can seem initially to be incompatible with the rules which I have just explained, but the reason for this is obvious. For the rules presuppose that the two bodies B and C are perfectly hard and are so separated from all other bodies that there is none other in their vicinity which could either help or hinder their movement. And we see no such situation in this world” (AT IXB 93, translated and discussed in Desmond Clarke, “Descartes’ philosophy of science”, Cambridge Companion to Descartes, p. 269).

11. Mandelbaum writes “It was…characteristic of Descartes’ ideal of knowledge…[that] effects were to be explained through their causes, that is, properties through the substances which served as their grounds. However, Boyle reversed this order, and insisted that knowledge proceed from effects to causes; knowledge for him was to be observational and empirical, not rational. Locke wholly agreed with Boyle’s method. It was because he agreed with this method, and because he none the less adopted the stricter Cartesian definition of ‘knowledge,’ that Locke refused to characterize our information concerning material bodies as knowledge” (Mandelbaum 1964, p. 53).

12. A good discussion of this point may be found in Jolley 1999, Ch. 4 (“The Philosophy of Matter”). It should be noted that people might disagree at different times or places about which set of qualities identifies any given kind; that is to say, the nominal essence, by which we classify particular things as belonging to a natural kind, might vary across times and communities. There is thus a distinction to drawn between that set of intrinsic qualities from which any given nominal essence flows, and that set of intrinsic qualities responsible for all of the thing’s qualities. Lisa Downing (2007, Section 6) suggests, in concurrence with Paul Guyer, that we avoid confusion by ‘regimenting’ Locke’s terminology, using the term ‘real essence’ to refer to the former, and ‘real constitution’ to refer to the latter. Although I have not adopted it, this is certainly a worthy suggestion.

13. The term ‘tertiary qualities’ has arisen in the secondary literature to refer to the qualities that Locke describes as follows:

“To these might be added a third sort which are allowed to be barely Powers though they are as much real Qualities in the Subject, as those which I to comply with the common way of speaking call Qualities, but for distinction secondary Qualities. For the power in Fire to produce a new Colour, or consistency in Wax or Clay by its primary Qualities, is as much a quality in Fire, as the power it has to produce in me a new Idea or Sensation of warmth or burning, which I felt not before, by the same primary Qualities, viz. The Bulk, Texture, and Motion of its insensible parts” (E II.viii.10, p. 135).

14. The example is not Locke’s.

15. See Jolley, 2002, pp. 68–69.

16. Wilson has argued that “Locke’s views about the relation of thought and matter turn out ultimately to undercut the central claim that a body’s sensible qualities flow from the primary qualities of insensible particles—and with it the notion that secondary qualities are explainable in terms of primary ones” (Wilson, 1999, p. 198).

17. Hill (2004, p. 627, 628) argues that the concept of superaddition “is quite out of place” in connection with cohesion, because Locke regards cohesion as a foundational problem, which thwarts our efforts to conceive of body. Yet in the passage just quoted (E IV.iii.29, pp. 559–560), Locke does appear to attribute cohesion to God in the same way that he attributes sensation and impulse.

18. “Body as far as we can conceive being able only to strike and affect Body: and Motion, according to the utmost reach of our Ideas, being able to produce nothing but Motion, so that when we allow it to produce pleasure or pain, or the Idea of a Colour, or Sound, we are fain to quit our Reason, go beyond our Ideas, and attribute it wholly to the good pleasure of our Maker. For since we must allow he has annexed Effects to Motion, which we can no way conceive Motion able to produce, what reason have to we conclude, that he could not order them as well to be produced in a Subject we cannot conceive capable of them, as well as in a Subject we cannot conceive the motion of Matter can any way operate upon? I say not this, that would any way lessen the belief of the Soul’s Immateriality: I am not here speaking of Probability, but Knowledge” (E IV.iii.6, p. 540–541).

19. On this point, see Mandelbaum, 1964, p. 22. See also Downing, 1998, p. 391.

20. See Stein, 1990, p. 32.

21. “The primary Ideas we have peculiar to Body, as contradistinguished to Spirit, are the cohesion of solid, and consequently separable parts, and a power of communicating Motion by impulse. These, I think, are the original Ideas proper and peculiar to Body: for Figure is but the consequence of infinite Extension” (E II.xxiii.17, p. 306).

22. ULC, Add. MS 1965, translated and discussed by Koyre, 1965, pp. 271–272, quoted in and discussed by Rogers, p. 223; see also Rogers p. 236.

23. See Mandelbaum, 1964, chapter 2; McGuire, “Atoms and the Analogy of Nature”, pp. 77–89. The problem was originally termed ‘transdiction’, as identified by Donald Williams and discussed by Mandelbaum, 1964, chapter 2.

24. Principia, Book 3, p. 795.

25. See E IV.iii.6, p. 542: “Who, either on the one side, indulging too much to their Thoughts immersed altogether in Matter, can allow no existence to what is not material: Or, who on the other side, finding not Cognition within the natural Powers of Matter, examined over and over again, by the utmost Intention of Mind, have the confidence to conclude, that Omnipotency it self, cannot give Perception and Thought to a Substance, which has the Modification of Solidity. He that considers how hardly Sensation is, in our Thoughts, reconcilable to extended Matter; or Existence to any thing that hath no Extension at all, will confess, that he is very far from certainly knowing what his Soul is. ‘Tis a Point, which seems to me, to be put out of the reach of our Knowledge: And he who will give himself leave to consider freely, and look into the dark and intricate part of each Hypothesis, will scarce find his Reason able to determine him fixedly for, or against, the Soul’s Materiality. Since on which side soever he views it, either as an unextended Substance, or as a thinking extended Matter; the difficulty to conceive either, will, whilst either alone is in his Thoughts, still drive him to the contrary side.”

26. The problem is discussed in the entry on John Locke.

27. Newton 2004, p. 29. See also Stein’s (2002) discussion, pp. 277–79.

28. See, for example, Cohen 2002, p. 61.

29. Against Woolhouse’s view, see Janiak, 2008, pp. 120–122.

30. For an overview of the debate concerning Newton, see Kochiras (2011, Section 5).

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