Notes to Deontic Logic

1. The term “deontic logic” appears to have arisen in English as the result of C. D. Broad’s suggestion to von Wright (von Wright 1951a); Mally used “Deontik” earlier to describe his work (Mally 1926). Both terms derive from the Greek term, δεον, for “that which is binding”, and ικ, a common Greek adjective-forming suffix for “after the manner of”, “of the nature of”, “pertaining to”, “of”, thus suggesting roughly the idea of a logic of duty. (The intervening “τ” in “δεοντικ” is inserted for phonetic reasons.)

2. To be sure, some of these notions (e.g., “ought”) have received more attention in deontic logic than others. However, virtually everyone working in this area would see logical systems designed to model the logical contributions of these notions as part of deontic logic proper.

3. We will assume the reader is at least familiar with classical proposition logic for this entry.

4. But also to evaluate states of affairs, as in “it ought to be the case that there is no past injustice”.

5. Section 4 can itself be seen as the first and most well-known expansion on the approaches in Sections 1–3.

6. For brevity, supplements like this one to Mally are occasionally used to provide additional info of value that is not central to understanding the point in the text. Footnotes are for more minor asides, such as short proofs; but also for often annotated bibliographical paragraphs associated with a topic.

7. In keeping with wide practice in logic over the past century or so, we will treat both modal notions and deontic notions as sentential (or propositional) operators unless otherwise stated. Although it is controversial whether the most fundamental (if there are such) modal and deontic notions have the logical form of propositional operators, focusing on these forms allowed for essentially seamless integration of these logics with propositional logics (especially classical truth-functional logic).

8. The color-coded key indicated will be relied on throughout for similar diagrams. Propositions are said to be contraries if they can’t both be true, sub-contraries if they can’t both be false, and contradictories if they always have opposing truth-values. The arrows, indicate proper entailment (if the arrow’s source is true, then so is its destination, but not necessarily the reverse). So for example, the square implies that no proposition is both necessarily and impossible, and a necessary proposition is possible, and possible if and only not impossible. The square can be easily augmented as a hexagon by including nodes for contingency. Cf. the deontic hexagon below.

9. For some deontic schemes in Islamic thought, see for example Carney 1983, Reinhart 1983, Hourani 1985, and more recently, Rahman et al. 2019, Rahman et al. forthcoming.

10. Deontic operators will appear with an initial boldface letter. These abbreviations are not standard. “O” is routinely used instead of “\(\OB\)”, and “O” is often read as “It ought to be the case that”, “P” is used instead of “\(\PE\)”, and if used at all, “F” (for “forbidden”) is used instead of “\(\IM\)” and “I” (for “indifference”) is used instead of “\(\OP\)”. Deontic non-necessity, here denoted by “\(\OM\)” is seldom labeled, and likewise for non-optionality. The double letter choices used here are easy mnemonics expressing all six basic conditions, and they will facilitate later discussion involving just what notions to take SDL and kin to be modeling, and how it might be enriched to handle other related normative notions. Both deontic logic and ethical theory are fraught with difficulties when it comes to interchanging allegedly equivalent expressions for one another. Here we choose to read the primitive operator as “it is obligatory that” so that all continuity with permissibility, impermissibility, and optionality is retained. “It is obligatory that” may also be read personally, but non-agentially as “it is obligatory for Jones that”. (See Krogh & Herrestad 1996 and McNamara 2004a. We will return to these issues again in Section 5.2.

11. In this essay we will slough over the distinction between abbreviational definitions of operators not officially in the formal language, and axiom systems with languages containing these operators, and axioms directly encoding the force of such definitions as equivalences.

12. See for example, Knuuttila 2008, Kilcullen & Scott 2001 for Ockham, and Lenzen 2004, for Leibniz.

13. See Hruschka 1990, Tierney 2007, Johns 2014 on the modern period. Islamic thought embraced TTC as far back as the eleventh century, since TTC is clearly entailed by a more fine-grained five-fold partition embraced in Islamic thought. See for example, the second section of Hilpinen and McNamara 2013 and some references there.

14. Likewise for adding contingency and non-contingency to the modal square. For important new work on developing theories generalizing squares of opposition and oppositional relations, see for example Moretti 2004 and Béziau & Payette 2012, Béziau 2012, and the many references there, as well as the conference series World Congress on the Square of Opposition.

15. The logic of Mally 1926 was saddled with the T-analog above. Mally reluctantly embraced it since it followed from premises that seemed faultless to him. See the entry on Mally’s deontic logic.

16. In a monadic system one can easily define dyadic deontic operators of sorts Hintikka 1971. For example, we might define “deontic implication” as \(\OB (p \rightarrow q)\) . We will consider non-monadic systems in Section 4.

17. “\(\vdash\)“ before a formula indicates it is a theorem of the relevant system.

18. Note that this axiomatization, and all others here, use “axiom schemata”: schematic specifications by syntactic pattern of classes of axioms (rather than particular axioms generalized via a substitution rule). We will nonetheless slough over the distinction here and often refer to such schemes as just “axioms”.

19. Compare the rule that contradictions are not permissible: if \(\vdash \neg p\) then \(\vdash \neg \PE p\). \(\OB\)-NEC is often said to be equivalent to “not everything is permissible”, and thus to rule out only “normative systems” that have no normative force at all.

20. SDL is a normal modal logic often called “D” (for “Deontic”) or “KD”, and the “No Conflicts” axiom, NC, is often referred to as the “D axiom”, in the context of normal modal logics, the characteristic axiom of system D.

21. \(\OB\)-OD should not be confused with NC. \(\OB\)-OD asserts that no single logical contradiction can be obligatory, whereas NC asserts that there can no (binary) deontic conflicts.

22. \(\OB\)-RE is the fundamental rule for “Classical Systems of modal logic”, a class that includes normal modal logics as a proper subset. See Chellas 1980.

23. For \(\OB(\OB p \rightarrow p) \rightarrow(\OB \OB p \rightarrow \OB p)\) is just a special instance of \(\OB\)-K.

24. See Chellas 1980, 193–194, for a concise critical discussion of the comparative plausibility of these two formula. (Note that the chapters on deontic logic in this seminal textbook are gems.)

25. For an earlier critical discussion of deontic iteration, see Marcus 1966.

26. Likewise for the assumptions that the omissible is the disjunction of the permissible and the obligatory and that the permissible is the disjunction of the obligatory and the optional.

27. Widely endorsed as indicated in the prior historical references where TDS is endorsed, along with either of these three: NC itself, or TTC, or the DS, and something like RE is presupposed. As we’ve just seen, anyone of these three commits one to the others once RE and TDS are endorsed. That the resulting logic is only a fragment is easy to show using neighborhood semantics (see Section 6.3 for a sketch.). The Standard Semantics for SDL is too strong. See Chellas 1980 for examples of the sort of proof needed to show this “only a fragment” claim semantically.

28. Von Wright 1951b and Prior 1955 [1962] (already in 1st ed., 1955).

29. The first person known to informally endorse a simplified version of the possible world semantics we are about to describe was Leibniz. See Lenzen 2004.

30. A cluster of others also devised similar semantic frameworks around the same time. See Wolenski 1990, Copeland 2002, and Goldblatt 2006 for excellent overviews, as well as the entry on modern origins of modal logic.

31. The worlds related to \(i\) by \(A\) are also often called “ideal worlds”. We will return to this terminology later.

32. See Hilpinen and McNamara 2013 for a more formal identification of the semantics.

33. Kanger 1957 [1971] (circulating in 1950 as a manuscript) and Anderson 1967, 1958.

34. K is the basic (weakest) normal modal logic. (See Chellas 1980, or the entry modal logic.) Traditionally, and in keeping with the intended interpretation of modal operators when employed for the reduction, the underlying modal logic had T as a theorem, indicating that necessity is here truth-implicating. We begin with K instead because T generates a system stronger than SDL. We will look at the addition of T shortly. Åqvist 2002 is an excellent source on the meta-theory of the relationship between SDL-ish deontic logics and corresponding Andersonian-Kangerian modal logics, as well as the main dyadic (primitive conditional operator) versions of these logics. Smiley 1963 is a landmark in the comparative study of such deontic systems.

35. First consider the very simple proof of a mixed formula \(\OB d\): By PC, we have \(d \rightarrow d\) as a theorem. Then by NEC, it follows that \(\Box(d \rightarrow d)\), that is, \(\OB d\). Next consider a proof of a key formula of SDL, NC, \(\OB p \rightarrow \neg \OB \neg p\). As usual, in proofs with deontic operators, we make free use of the rules and theorems that carry over from the normal modal logic K. For reductio, assume \(\neg(\OB p \rightarrow \neg \OB \neg p)\), that is,

\[\neg(\Box(d\rightarrow p) \rightarrow \neg \Box(d\rightarrow \neg p)).\]


\[\Box(d \rightarrow p) \amp \Box(d \rightarrow \neg p).\]

and then from the modal logic K, \(\Box(d \rightarrow(p \amp \neg p))\) follows. But then along with \(\Diamond d, \Diamond(p \amp \neg p)\) follows in modal logic K. Yet it is a theorem of K that \(\neg \Diamond(p \amp \neg p)\), so we get a contradiction.

36. See for example Åqvist 2002 or Åqvist 1987.

37. Scare quotes because Kant’s law is more accurately rendered as involving agency (if Doe is obligated to bring something about then Doe is able to do so), but the label is often used in deontic logic for almost any implication from something’s being obligatory to something’s being possible, roughly any formula that comes close to saying “if obligatory \(p\) then possible (in some sense) \(p\).

38. We proved the first above, and given our definition of \(\OB\), RM′ and NEC′ follow from standard features of the modal logic K alone, but Kant’s Law and NC′ also depend on the distinctive deontic axiom, \(\Diamond d\).

39. By T, \(\vdash \Box(d \rightarrow p) \rightarrow(d \rightarrow p)\). Then by PC, we can get \(\vdash d \rightarrow[\Box(d \rightarrow p) \rightarrow p]\). From this in turn, by NEC, we have \(\vdash \Box(d \rightarrow[\Box(d \rightarrow p) \rightarrow p])\), that is, \(\OB (\OB p \rightarrow p)\), by definition of \(\OB\).

40. See Anderson 1967 , where a system (called “R”) of “relevant implication” is favored.

41. Note that this means that, for generality, we assume that what is possible may vary from one world to another. This is standard in this sort of semantics for modal logics. For example, if we wanted to model physical possibility and necessity, what is physically possible for our world, may not be so for some other logically possible world with different fundamental physical laws than ours. By adding certain constraints, we can generate a picture where what is possible does not vary at all from one world to another. See the entry on modal logic.

42. Note that we could add an ordering-relation semantics like that described at the end of Section 2 in order to generate the DEM component of these models. The main difference would be that instead of a set of world-relative ordering relations, one for each world (e.g., \(\ge_i )\) there would be just one ordering relation, \(\ge\), whereby all worlds in W (in a given model) would be ranked just once. This relation would be reflexive, transitive and connected, while satisfying the limit assumption in W. DEM would then be the set of all the best worlds in W, and then the truth conditions for \(d\) and the six deontic operators would be cast via DEM so generated.

43. More explicitly, since \(\OB p \eqdf \Box(d \rightarrow p)\), we need only look at \(\Box(d \rightarrow p)\). The latter will be true at a world \(i\), iff \((d \rightarrow p)\) is true at all the \(i\)-accessible worlds. But given the truth-conditions for the material conditional “\(\rightarrow\)“, that just amounts to saying \(p\) is true at all those \(i\)-accessible worlds (if any) where \(d\) is true, which in turn holds iff \(p\) is true at all the \(i\)-accessible worlds falling within DEM, i.e., at their intersection (which is non-empty by strong seriality). Similarly for the other deontic operators.

44. A more dramatic case is the Gentle Murderer Paradox (Forrester 1984), which concerns the obligation to kill gently, in case one will violate the obligation to not kill at all. Prakken and Sergot 1996 presented a famous variant that avoids temporal or agential solutions to the contrary-to-duty paradox, involving stative obligations for a housing community: there is a dog; it is obligatory that there not be a dog; if there is a dog, it is obligatory that there be a “beware of dog” sign. A forerunner of CTDs is the “paradox of derived obligation/commitment” Prior 1954.

45. Von Wright 1956 takes the now-classic non-componential dyadic operator approach to the syntax of CTDs. Danielsson 1968; B. Hansson 1969 [1971]; Lewis 1973, 1974; and Feldman 1986 provide samples of a “next best thing” approach: the interpretation of conditional obligations via a primitive non-componential dyadic operator, in turn interpreted via a preference ordering of the possible worlds where the (perhaps obligation-violating) antecedent holds; see also Åqvist 1987, 2002 for extensive systematic presentations of this sort of approach, and al-Hibri 1978 for an early widely-read systematic discussion of a number of approaches to CTDs. van Fraassen 1972; Loewer & Belzer 1983; and Jones & Pörn 1985 also offer influential discussions of CTDs and propose distinct formal solutions. Tomberlin 1981 contains a very influential informal discussion of various approaches to conditional obligations. Åqvist & Hoepelman 1981, and Van Eck 1982 (and again, Loewer & Belzer 1983) are classic representatives of attempts to solve the puzzle by incorporating temporal notions into deontic logic. Jones 1990 contains an influential argument against any temporal-based general solution to the puzzle. Castañeda 1981 argued that by carefully distinguishing between (very roughly) propositions and actions in the scope of deontic operators, Chisholm’s puzzle, as well as most puzzles for deontic logic, can be resolved; Meyer 1988 offers a version of this general approach using dynamic logic. Prakken & Sergot 1996 contains an influential argument against any such action-based general solution to the puzzle. For later work on CTDs in the context of a branching time framework with agency represented a la Horty-Belnap, see Horty 1996, Bartha 1999, and Bartha’s contribution (chapter 11) to Belnap et al. 2001. A recent source that reviews a good deal of the literature on CTDs and proposes its own solution is Carmo & Jones 2002; but see also material on this problem in Nute 1997. See also Saint Croix & Thomason 2014, which argues that there are a set of puzzles, not all involving conditionals for Chisholm’s case, and Cariani Forthcoming, which discusses more recent approaches to the Chisholm puzzle, especially those in the philosophy of deontic language.

46. Alchourrón 1993 is a salient exception to this approach. More recently, Van De Putte, Frijters, & Meheus 2018 introduced a logic for “Holistic Detachment” in which “detached, unconditional obligations” are independent of “obligations conditional on the verum”.

47. The turnstile is sometimes replaced with a material conditional symbol, and then FD/DD appear as axioms or theorems.

48. Smith 1994 notes that adding factual detachment to SDL with \(\OB (q\mid p)\) interpreted as \(\OB (p \rightarrow q)\), yields Mally’s problem: \(\vdash \OB p \leftrightarrow p\). Smith, crediting Andrew Jones, shows that already in PC, \(\OB\)-D, \(\OB\)-RE, and FD yields \(\OB p \rightarrow p\), which is still enough to make Voltaire, who chastised Leibniz for claiming this was the best of all possible words, grin. Clearly a non-material conditional is essential here.

49. Mott 1973 and Chellas 1974 (and Chellas 1980), and Thomason 1981b are early advocates for analyses of the puzzle that combine a non-material conditional and a unary deontic operator to form a genuine componential compound, \(p \Rightarrow \OB q\), for representing conditionals like (3) above. DeCew 1981 is an important early critical response to this sort of approach. Tomberlin 1981 contains an influential informal discussion of various approaches. Bonevac 1998 argues against taking conditional obligation to be a primitive non-componential dyadic operator, suggesting roughly that techniques like those developed in AI (e.g., Brewka 1989) for defeasible reasoning suffice for handling woes with CTDs. Smith (1993, 1994) stresses the difference between violability and defeasibility, and the relevance of the former rather than the latter to CTDs.

50. Van Eck 1982.

51. In Chisholm’s example it is easier to accept that telling is merely ideal, but not required, since it is easy to interpret Chisholm’s example as one where giving advanced notice is what the agent perhaps ought to do, but not something the agent must do (even assuming the neighborly help is itself a must).

52. See also Åqvist 2002 for an extensive systematic presentation of this sort of approach. Important sources on the metatheory of classical and near-classical logics via classic and near-classic ordering structures for the dyadic operator are Goble 2003 (see also Goble 2004), Parent 2014, and Parent Forthcoming.

53. As Makinson 1993 notes, it was also a forerunner of semantics for defeasible conditionals generally (cf. “if \(p\), normally \(q\)”).

54. The idea is perhaps implicit in B. Hansson 1969 [1971]; it is argued for explicitly in Greenspan 1975, and adopted by many since.

55. In Benthem, Grossi, & Liu 2014, it is shown how Hansson-style deontic operators are definable in a richer language featuring normal modal operators that talk about “what is true at all worlds at least as good as the present one”. There, detachment is modeled as a dynamic operation: the formula \(\OB (p\mid q) \rightarrow[!q]\OB p\) expresses that, if \(p\) is obligatory conditional on \(q\), then a public announcement of \(q\) makes \(p\) obligatory simpliciter. See the entry on dynamic epistemic logic for an introduction to dynamic operations (including public announcements) on possible worlds models.

56. The issues discussed in this section were introduced in Urmson 1958.

57. The issues discussed in this section were introduced in Chisholm 1963b and Wertheimer 1972.

58. Jones & Pörn 1986 is an early attempt to distinguish the two formally, although “must” ends up modeled as practical necessity in their framework (that which holds in all accessible scenarios—permissible or not) rather than deontic necessity (that which holds in all permissible scenarios). McNamara 1990 provides the first model-theoretic representation of deontic “must” and “ought”, as well as a cumulative case argument that “must” not “ought” is the dual of permissibility, and thus that it is this almost universally ignored term “must”, not “ought”, that tracks the traditional concern in ethical theory and deontic logic with permissibility. See also McNamara 1996c.

59. The issues discussed in this section were introduced in McNamara 1990 and 1996c.

60. The issues discussed in this section were introduced in McNamara 1990 and 1996c.

61. The issues discussed in this section were introduced in Kanger 1957 [1971] and Kanger & Kanger 1966 [1972]. For the sake of simplicity, we focus here on some basic syntactic principles of such logics. Some key references for the logic of agency are Belnap & Perloff 1988; Belnap 1991; Belnap et al. 2001; Elgesem 1993, 1997; Hilpinen 1997a, 1997b; Segerberg 1982, 1989, 1992.

62. With two or more agents, we would need to represent agents explicitly: \(\BA_s p\), \(\BA_{s'} p\), etc. “E” is often used for this operator.

63. This “passivity” terminology, although used elsewhere, is perhaps not ideal and can’t seriously be viewed as an analysis of “passivity” per se, since one might bring about neither a proposition nor its negation, and yet be quite influential regarding it (e.g., intentionally and actively increasing its probability without making it happen), thus the longer and more cumbersome expression.

64. Note that one can introduce rough analogues to our traditional definitional schemes for deontic operators (cf. Section 2 of this entry), giving rise to other agential operators.

65. However, see Section 6.4 for arguments against \(\OB\)-RE and for the hyperintensionality of deontic operators.

66. The idea discussed in this section was introduced in Meinong 1894 [1968], 1917 [1972] and Chisholm 1963b, 1964, 1974. Chisholm attributes the idea to Nicolai Hartmann.

67. More generally, it can be seen as a reduction of an agential deontic operator to a non-agential deontic operator (but not necessarily an impersonal one) and a non-deontic agency operator Herrestad & Krogh 1993.

68. For example, see Pörn 1970, 1977, 1989; Kanger 1957 [1971]; Lindahl 1977; Horty 1996; Jones & Sergot 1996; Santos & Carmo 1996; Belnap et al. 2001. Herrestad & Krogh 1993 reinterpret the analysis so that the deontic operator is personal (rather than impersonal) yet not agential. This is arguably a more plausible way to preserve a componential analysis of agential obligation (McNamara 2004a). Horty 2001 provides an alternative non-componential analysis of agential obligation in the context of a branching-time analysis of agency. This is in contrast to the branching-time approach to deontic contexts in Belnap et al. 2001 (with Paul Bartha), where agential obligation is a componential compound of an agency operator and an obligation operator (one in turn analyzed via an Andersonian-Kangerian reduction). Another alternative to the major trend above, is the adaptation of modal logics for representing computer programs (e.g., dynamic logic) to represent actions in deontic logic. Since this deviates from SDL more than adding to it, this is covered further below. See also Segerberg 1992 for coverage and background on approaches to agency generally.

69. The theory of normative positions has been an important and active sub-area of deontic logic since its inception in Stig Kanger’s work Kanger 1957 [1971], 1972, Kanger & Kanger 1966 [1972], further developed in a book-length study by Lars Lindahl (1977), and thus sometimes referred to as “the Kanger-Lindahl theory”. It has been used in attempts to analyze legal relations, like those made famous by Hohfeld 1919, among other things. The Kanger-Lindahl theory has been further developed by Makinson 1986; Jones & Sergot 1993; Sergot 1999, 2013; Herrestad & Krogh 1995; Lindahl 2001. See also Allen 1996 for a somewhat different approach to Hohfeldian legal relations, and Pörn 1970, 1977 for a framework employed to analyze various normatively laden social positions and relations. Lindahl 2001 provides an excellent overview and orientation on Kanger’s work in this area, and various problems informing subsequent research. (Other seminal contributions of Kanger to deontic logic are discussed in Hilpinen 2001b in the same volume.) Sergot 1999, 2013 takes the formal work of normative positions to a new level of abstraction and precision. The later work mentioned above by Lindahl, Herrestad, and Krogh, continue the exploration of refinements of the earlier Kanger-Lindahl conceptual framework to adapt it better to the analysis of legal notions. More recently Dong & Roy 2017 provides a first attempt at modeling the dynamics of normative powers.

70. We explain the point here in rough terms, using a highly simplified semantics. Introducing the full semantics from Horty 2001 is beyond the scope of the present entry.

71. For Horty’s reasoning to work here, it is important that the case is seen as one of decision under uncertainty, rather than decision under risk. In other words, it does not make sense (for the agent) to think in terms of probabilities.

72. The converse can also easily be shown: suppose that by gambling, the agent risks a loss of 5$, but the agent cannot make any gains. There is however a possibility that the agent still keeps his money when gambling. Then intuitively, we would say the agent ought not to gamble. However, on the Meinong-Chisholm analysis this is false, since there is a “best” world (i.e., one in which the agent luckily keeps his money) in which the agent does gamble.

73. In addition to Horty 2001, see Murakami 2005 for an axiomatization of Horty’s deontic STIT logic. In Tamminga & Hindriks 2020 and Tamminga & Duijf 2017, an alternative semantics for these logics is developed and used to study notions such as collective responsibility, member obligations, and group plans.

74. The issue discussed in this section was introduced in Belnap et al. 2001.

75. See also Alchourrón & Bulygin 1971.

76. If one were to also reject the latter claim but keep full SDL, the modality \(\NS\) should become non-normal: necessitation for it would have to be rejected. See Section 6.3 for a discussion of (deontic) necessitation and semantics that allow one to get rid of it.

77. Two classics on time and deontic logic are Thomason 1981a, 1981b, where temporal and deontic interactions are discussed, including an distinction between deliberative “ought”s (future-oriented/decision-oriented “ought”s) versus judgmental “ought”s (past present or future oriented “ought”s from an purely evaluative, rather than action-oriented perspective). (Cf. the notion of “cues” for action in Van Eck 1982). Some other important earlier entries are Loewer & Belzer 1983; Åqvist & Hoepelman 1981; and Chellas 1969. For a sample of some more recent work, see Bailhache 1998, as well as Brown 1996a for an attempt to develop a diachronic logic of obligations, representing obligations coming to be, and being discharged over time, where, for example, someone can now have an obligation to bring about p only if p is (now) false. See Governatori, Hulstijn, et al. 2007 for a typology of deadlines framed in a modal temporal defeasible logic.

78. Von Wright 1963; Hedenius 1963 [1941]; Alchourrón & Bulygin 1971, 1981; Makinson 1999. Von Wright 1963 attributes the distinction to Ingemar Hedenius.

79. See Lemmon 1962b; Kamp 1974, 1979. It is often thought that performative utterances generally work this way Kempson 1977. For example, if a marriage ceremony conducted by a legitimate authority requires that authority to end the ceremony with the proverbial (albeit dated) “You are now husband and wife” in order to complete an act of marriage, the speech act utilizing this sentence not only marries the couple (in the context), but it appears to also be a true description of their state as of that moment.

80. Of course, there are meta-normative accounts (e.g., realist and some constructivist accounts) that would not require a system of norms to have arisen for something to be required (e.g., ethically, prudentially, rationally, or epistemically required), but in many cases, by any account, some requirements will be based on such normative systems (e.g., legal norms, municipal regulations, etiquette, rules for games). For the latter, it would seem the normative propositions derive from a set of norms, and then might not their logic need to do so as well?

81. In Straßer, Beirlaen, & Van De Putte 2016, logics are presented that characterize input/output logic (with constraints) as fragments of more traditional modal logics, thus allowing for Boolean combinations and other operations on deontic expressions.

82. See however Broersen 2004 for a critical discussion of action negations in the context of deontic logic.

83. A similar notion of strong permissibility or “deontic sufficiency” of propositions is studied in Van De Putte 2017.

84. In Kulicki & Trypuz 2017, a logic is proposed that combines both deontic claims about states of affairs and deontic claims about actions, and allows one to study their interrelation through principles such as “if action a necessarily results in a state of affairs that is forbidden, then action a is also forbidden.” Other recent papers that combine deontic logics of actions and states of affairs with PDL-like modalities for action types are Craven & Sergot 2008; Canavotto & Giordani 2019; and Ju & van Eijck 2019.

85. Von Wright 1951a notes that since the denial of \(\neg \OB\top\) is provably equivalent to \(\PE\bot\) (given the traditional definitional scheme and \(\OB\)-RE), and since both \(\OB\top\) and \(\PE\bot\) are odd, we should opt for a “principle of contingency”, which says that \(\OB\top\) and \(\PE\bot\) are both logically contingent. Von Wright 1963 argues that \(\OB\top\) (and \(\PE\)\top) do not express real prescriptions (pp.152-4). Føllesdal & Hilpinen 1971 suggests that excluding \(\OB\)-N only excludes “empty normative systems” (i.e., normative systems with no obligations), and perhaps not even that, since no one can fail to fulfill \(\OB\top\) anyway, so why worry, cf. Prior 1958. However, since it is dubious that anyone can bring it about that \(\top\), it would seem to be equally dubious that anyone can “fulfill” \(\OB\top\), and thus matters are not so simple. al-Hibri 1978 discusses various early takes on this problem, rejects \(\OB\)-N, and later develops a deontic logic without it. Note that similar observations can be coined in terms of “violations”, a notion central to CTDs. Von Wright 1963 comes close to endorsing violability as essential to any obligation (1963: 154), but the context there is more complex and less straightforward. Jones & Pörn 1985 explicitly rejects \(\OB\)-N for “ought”, taking violability to be essential to what people ought to do.

86. Prior cast it using this variant of RM: If \(\vdash p \rightarrow q\) then \(\vdash \IM q \rightarrow \IM p\) (the impermissibility of Smith being robbed then appears to wrongly imply the impermissibility of helping him who has been robbed). See also Åqvist 1967, which has been very influential.

87. This paradox can also be cast equivalently with just one agent, and via \(\IM\) as easily as \(\OB\): “The Victims Paradox” notes that the victim of the crime helps herself only if there was a crime. If it is impermissible that there be a crime, it will follow under similar symbolization that it is impermissible for the victim of the crime to help herself, which hardly sounds right. Similarly for “The Robber’s (Repenter’s) Paradox”, where now we focus on the robber making amends (or repenting) for his crime, and again we seem to get the result that it is impermissible for the robber to make amends for his crime, suggesting a rather convenient argument against all obligations to ever make amends for one’s crimes. These early variations were used to show that certain initially proposed solutions to the Good Samaritan paradox didn’t really solve the problem. Both versions are found in Nowell-Smith & Lemmon 1960.

88. Jackson 1985 argues for an approach to “ought to be” that links it to counterfactuals, and he informally explores its semantics and logic; Goble 1990a makes a similar case for “good” and “bad” (as well as “ought”), formally tying these to logical features of counterfactuals explicitly. Goble 1990b contains the main technical details and axiomatization of this approach.

89. Interestingly, the debate on the validity of RM also intersects with the issue of “actualism” and “possibilism” as these terms are used in ethical theory. Roughly, possibilism is the view that I ought to bring about \(p\) if \(p\) is part of the best overall outcome I could bring about, even if the goodness of this overall outcome, depends on all sorts of other things that I would not in fact bring about, were I to bring about \(p\). In contrast, actualism is the view that I ought to bring about \(p\) if doing so would in fact be better than not doing so, and this of course can crucially depend on what else I would do (ideal or not) were I to bring about \(p\). (For more, see the entry on actualism and possibilism in ethics.)

90. Segerberg 1971 is seminal, and the second part of Chellas 1980 is a widely cited accessible overview, with explicit ties to deontic logic. Pacuit 2017 is a more recent overview with a focus on various applications of the neighborhood semantic framework.

91. Marcus 1980 stresses the possibility of such one-principle-sourced conflicts of obligation.

92. Whether or not these obligations are both all-things-considered-non-overridden obligations is a further issue, to which we return below. For our purposes here, the point is that they appear to be obligations.

93. Since it seems clear that obligations can conflict, SDL can’t represent the general notion of an obligation. It is perhaps better to assume that any logic containing NC requires a qualified reading of \(\OB\), such as “it is overridingly obligatory that \(p\)”. NC appears to be analytic if we read the operator this way.

94. Lemmon 1962a stresses that a conflict of obligations does not entail a contradiction. Williams 1965 stresses the contingency of conflicts of obligation and contrasts this in passing with inconsistency as unrealizability in any world. Marcus 1980 stresses more explicitly the standard world-theoretic conception of consistency, and applies it to moral codes whereby a code’s consistency entails only that there is some eligible world where the code is obeyable, and that this by no means entails that the code must be obeyable in all eligible worlds Marcus 1996.

95. Here too we change the example. Plato’s case involves returning a weapon as promised to someone who now in a rage intends to unjustly kill someone with the weapon. Lemmon interprets the issues raised by Sartre’s dilemma a bit differently than we do here.

96. Von Wright 1968 suggested that minimizing evil is a natural approach to conflict resolution, thereby suggesting that a sort of minimizing (and thus reliance on an ordering) is apt. Alchourrón & Makinson 1981 provide an early formal analysis of conflict resolution via partial orderings of regulations and regulation sets. Chisholm 1964, 1974 have been very influential conceptually (as witnessed, for example, by Loewer & Belzer 1983); that work is analyzed extensively in McNamara Forthcoming. In ethical theory, the informal conceptual landmark is W. D. Ross 1939. Horty 1994 is a very influential discussion forging a link between Reiter’s default logic developed in AI (see Brewka 1989), and an early influential approach to conflicts of obligation, van Fraassen 1973, which combines a preference ordering with an imperatival approach to deontic logic. In Horty 2012, this idea is worked out much more detail. Prakken 1996 discusses Horty’s approach and an alternative that strictly separates the defeasible component from the deontic component, arguing that handling conflicts should be left to the former component only. See also Makinson 1993 for a discussion of defeasiblity and the place of deontic conditionals in this context. Other approaches to defeasibility in deontic logic that have affinities to semantic techniques developed in artificial intelligence for modeling defeasible reasoning about defeasible conditionals generally are Asher & Bonevac 1996, 1997 and Morreau 1996, all of which attempt to represent W. D. Ross-like notions of prima facie obligation, etc. Note that Alchourrón 1996; Prakken 1996; Asher & Bonevac 1996; and Morreau 1996 are all found in a special issue of Studia Logica (57(1) 1996, guest edited by Andrew J. I. Jones and Marek Sergot). Nute 1997 is dedicated to defeasibility in deontic logic with articles by many of the key players, including Nute himself. See Bartha 1999 for an approach to contrary-to-duty conditionals and to defeasible conditionals layered over a branching time framework with an agency operator. Smith 1994 contains an interesting informal discussion of conflicting obligations, defeasibility, violability and contrary-to-duty conditionals. In the framework of Adaptive Logics, various conflict-tolerant deontic logics have been developed to handle (possibly prioritized) conflicting (prima facie and/or conditional) obligations, cf. Van De Putte, Beirlaen, & Meheus forthcoming. Klein & Marra 2020 introduces a multi-modal logic in which the relation between prima facie obligations and goals of an agent are modeled and linked to the so-called enkratic principle. Finally, Goble 2013 provides a state of the art overview of formal approaches to prima facie obligations and deontic conflicts. In ethical theory, as with SDL, the dominant assumption was that obligations could not conflict (or that those that could were second class citizens to “serious” obligations), but this began to change in the latter part of the twentieth century. See for example, Gowans 1987.

97. Within truthmaker semantics one may further distinguish between different forms of truthmaking, e.g., exact vs. inexact – see Fine 2017. We gloss over all these distinctions here for the sake of space.

98. A similar idea is central in the imperative logic of Vranas 2008, 2010.

99. Cf. the deontic logic in Meyer 1988, where a set of operators for action (drawn from dynamic logic) are used along with a separate set of propositional operators.

100. The interrelationships between the rules and axioms which constitute the equivalence between these systems is taken for granted in work on deontic logic, and is thus useful to know.

101. By RE and some PC manipulations, \(\OB\)-K is equivalent to

\[\neg \neg \OB \neg(p \amp \neg q) \rightarrow(\neg \OB \neg \neg q \rightarrow \neg \OB \neg \neg p),\]

and then by definition of \(\PE\), we get

\[\neg \PE (p \amp \neg q) \rightarrow(\PE \neg q \rightarrow \PE \neg p).\]

By PC, NC is equivalent to

\[\neg \neg \OB \neg \neg p \rightarrow \neg \OB \neg p,\]

and this is equivalent by definition to \(\neg \PE \neg p \rightarrow \PE p\). Lastly, by PC, \(\OB\)-NEC is equivalent to if \(\vdash \neg p\) then \(\vdash \neg \neg \OB \neg p\), and this is equivalent by definition to: if \(\vdash \neg p\) then \(\vdash \neg \PE p\),

102. Note that this is in contrast to \(j\) itself, where the latter formula does hold, for the reader can easily verify that \((\OB p \rightarrow p)\) holds at \(k\) in this model, and \(k\) is the only world acceptable to \(j\).

103. The remaining items hold independently of seriality. Completing the proof amounts to both a proof of SDL’s soundness with respect to our semantics, and of \(\OB\)-U’s independence (non-derivability from) SDL.

104. It has been most utilized by Belnap and coworkers. See Belnap et al. 2001, and its references to prior papers.

105. But not so for the “achievement” agency operator in Belnap et al. 2001.

106. The formula (1′) is not really essential here, it just helps to clarify that (2) does not express some strange standing obligation but a transient one that emerges as a result of the de facto robbery.

107. Theoretically one could claim that we have a conflict of obligations here, but this seems quite implausible. The banks’ being robbed appears to be definitely non-obligatory.

108. However see Da Costa & Carnielli 1986 which develops a paraconsistent deontic logic.

109. Some early discussions and attempted solutions to this collapse can be found in Chellas 1980 and Schotch & Jennings 1981, both of whom use non-normal modal logics for deontic logic. Brown 1996b uses a similar approach to Chellas’ for modeling conflicting obligations, but with the addition of an ordering relation on obligations to model the relative stringency of obligations, thus moving in the direction of a model addressing Plato’s Dilemma as well.

110. More accurately, a weakened version of that law, as here no agential notion of ability is present to make it clear that I am obligated to do the paying back.

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