Free Logic

First published Mon Apr 5, 2010; substantive revision Fri Dec 11, 2020

Classical logic requires each singular term to denote an object in the domain of quantification—which is usually understood as the set of “existing” objects. Free logic does not. Free logic is therefore useful for analyzing discourse containing singular terms that either are or might be empty. A term is empty if it either has no referent or refers to an object outside the domain.

Most free logics have been first-order, their quantifiers ranging over individuals. Recently, however, some work on higher-order free logics has appeared. Corine Besson (2009) argues that internalist theories of natural kinds require second-order free logics whose quantifiers range over kinds, and she finds precedent for this idea ranging as far back as Cocchiarella (1986). Andrew Bacon, John Hawthorne, and Gabriel Uzquiano (2016) explore the possibility of using a higher-order free logic to resolve certain intensional paradoxes, but they find that this idea faces daunting difficulties. Timothy Williamson (2016) reluctantly concurs. This article, however, focuses mainly on first-order logics.

Section 1 lays out the basics of free logic, explaining how it differs from classical predicate logic and how it is related to inclusive logic, which permits empty domains or “worlds.” Section 2 shows how free logic may be represented by each of three formal methods: axiom systems, natural deduction rules and tree rules. Varying conventions for calculating the truth values of atomic formulas containing empty singular terms yield three distinct forms of free logic: negative, positive and neutral. These are surveyed in Section 3, along with supervaluations, which were developed to augment neutral logics. Section 4 is critical, examining three anomalies that infect most free logics. Section 5 samples applications of free logic to theories of description, logics of partial or non-strict functions, logics with Kripke semantics, logics of fiction and logics that are in a certain sense Meinongian. Section 6 takes a glance at free logic’s history.

1. The Basics

1.1 Definition of Free Logic

Free logic is formal logic whose quantifiers are interpreted in the usual way—that is, objectually over a specified domain \(\bD\)—but whose singular terms may denote objects outside of \(\bD\), or not denote at all. Singular terms include proper names (individual constants), definite descriptions, and such functional expressions as ‘\(2 + 2\)’. Since classical (i.e., Fregean) predicate logic requires that singular terms denote members of \(\bD\), free logic is a “nonclassical” logic. Where \(\bD\) is, as usual, taken to be the class of existing things, free logic may be characterized as logic the referents of whose singular terms need not exist.

1.2 How Free Logic Differs from Classical Predicate Logic

Karel Lambert (1960) coined the term ‘free logic’ as an abbreviation for ‘logic free of existence assumptions with respect to its terms, singular and general’. General terms are predicates. Lambert was suggesting that just as classical predicate logic generalized Aristotelian logic by, inter alia, admitting predicates that are satisfied by no existing thing (‘is a Martian’, ‘is non-self-identical’, ‘travels faster than light’), so free logic generalizes classical predicate logic by admitting singular terms that denote no existing thing (‘Aphrodite’, ‘the greatest integer’, ‘the present king of France’).

Because classical logic’s singular terms must denote existing things (when, as usual, ‘\(\exists\)’ is read as “there exists”), classical logic is unreliable in application to statements containing singular terms whose referents either do not exist or are not known to. Consider, for example, the true statement:

We detect no motion of the earth relative to the ether,

using ‘the ether’ as a singular term for the light-bearing medium posited by nineteenth century physicists. The reason why (S) is true is that, as we now know, the ether does not exist. According to classical logic, however, (S) is false, because it implies the existence of the ether. Free logic allows such statements to be true despite the non-referring singular term. Indeed, it allows even statements of the form \({\sim}\exists x\) \(x=t\) (e.g., “the ether does not exist”) to be true, though in classical logic, which presumes that \(t\) refers to an object in the quantificational domain, they are self-contradictory.

Free logic accommodates empty singular terms (those that denote no member of the quantificational domain \(\bD)\) by rejecting inferences whose validity depends on the classical presumption that they must denote members of \(\bD\). Consider, for example, the rule of universal instantiation (specification): from the premise “Every \(x\) (in \(\bD)\) satisfies \(A\)” we may infer “\(t\) satisfies \(A\).” This rule, whose formal expression is:

\[ \forall xA \vdash A(t/x), \]

is invalid in free logic; for even if every object in \(\bD\) satisfies \(A\), if \(t\) does not denote a member of \(\bD\), then \(A(t/x)\) may be false. (Here and elsewhere \(A(t/x)\) is the result of replacing all occurrences of \(x\) in \(A\) by individual constant \(t\); if there are no such occurrences, then \(A(t/x)\) is just \(A\).) Likewise invalid is existential generalization: the principle that from a formula \(A\) containing a singular term \(t\) we may infer that there is something in \(\bD\) that satisfies \(A(x//t)\), the result of replacing one or more occurrences of \(t\) in \(A\) by \(x\):

\[ A \vdash \exists xA(x//t), \]

If \(t\) does not denote an object in \(\bD\) then the truth of \(A\) does not guarantee that there exists in \(\bD\) an object that satisfies \(A(x//t)\). Though free logic rejects such classical inferences, it accepts no classically invalid inferences; hence it is strictly weaker than classical logic for a language with the same vocabulary.

To distinguish terms that denote members of \(\bD\) from those that do not, free logic often employs the one-place “existence” predicate, ‘\(\rE!\)’ (sometimes written simply as ‘\(\rE\)’). For any singular term \(t\), \(\rE!t\) is true if \(t\) denotes a member of \(\bD\), false otherwise. ‘\(\rE!\)’ may be either taken as primitive or (in bivalent free logic with identity) defined as follows:

\[ \rE !t \eqdf \exists x(x=t). \]

Using ‘E!’ we can express classical logic’s blanket presumption that singular terms denote members of \(\bD\) as an explicit premise, E\(!t\), for selected terms \(t\). Thus we can formulate the following weaker analogs of universal instantiation:

\[ \forall xA, \rE!t \vdash A(t/x) \]

and existential generalization:

\[ A, \rE!t \vdash \exists xA(x//t), \]

which are valid in free logic.

1.3 Relation of Free Logic to Inclusive Logic

Classical predicate logic presumes not only that all singular terms refer to members of the quantificational domain \(\bD\), but also that \(\bD\) is nonempty. Free logic rejects the first of these presumptions. Inclusive logic (sometimes also called empty or universally free logic) rejects them both. Thus while inclusive logic for a language containing singular terms must be free, free logics need not be inclusive.

Many existential assertions—e.g., \(\exists x(x=x),\) \(\exists x(Px \rightarrow Px),\) \(\exists x(Px \rightarrow \forall yPy)\)—are true in all nonempty domains and hence are valid in both classical logic and non-inclusive free logic. But since all existentially quantified formulas are false in the empty domain, none are valid in inclusive logic. Correlatively, since all universally quantified formulas are true in the empty domain, none are self-contradictory in inclusive logic. Even vacuously universally quantified formulas (formulas of the form \(\forall xA\), where \(x\) is not free in \(A)\) are true in the empty domain. Hence the schema:

\[ \forall xA \rightarrow A, \text{ where } x \text{ is not free in } A, \]

which is valid in both classical logic and non-inclusive free logic, is invalid in inclusive logic. Inclusive logic also invalidates some of the laws of confinement—e.g.,

\[ \forall x(P \amp A) \leftrightarrow(P \amp \forall xA), \text{ where } x \text{ is not free in } P, \]

that are used for prenexing formulas (giving quantifiers the widest possible scope) or purifying them (giving quantifiers the narrowest possible scope). And in inclusive logic the formula:

\[ \forall x(A \leftrightarrow x=t), \]

widely used in the theory of definite descriptions, is not equivalent, as it otherwise is, to:

\[ \forall x(A \rightarrow x=t) \amp A(t/x), \]

since with \(\bD\) empty and \(A(t/x)\) false, the first but not the second is true. Where there is need for such regularities, a non-inclusive free logic may be preferable to an inclusive one. Yet because inclusivity frees logic from one more existential presumption, many free logicians favor it.

2. Formal Systems

Logics may be represented in various ways. Axiom systems, natural deduction systems and trees (or, equivalently, tableaux) are among the most common. This section presents all three for the bivalent inclusive form of free logic known as Positive Free Logic (PFL) and mentions some variants. (For the meaning of the term “positive” in this context see Section 3.2). PFL is formulated in a first-order language \(\bL\) without sentence letters or function symbols, whose primitive logical operators are negation (not) ‘\({\sim}\)’, the conditional (if-then) ‘\(\rightarrow\)’, the universal quantifier (for all) ‘\(\forall\)’, identity ‘=’ and ‘E!’, the others being defined as usual. We assume for the sake of definiteness that the formulas of \(\bL\) are closed (contain no unquantified variables) and that they may be vacuously quantified (have the form \(\forall xA\) or \(\exists xA\), where \(x\) does not occur free in \(A)\). An occurrence of a variable is quantified if it lies within the scope of an operator such as ‘\(\forall\)’ or ‘\(\exists\)’ that binds that variable; otherwise it is free.

2.1 Axiom Systems

PFL may be axiomatized, with modus ponens as the sole inference rule, by adding the following schemas to the tautologies of classical propositional logic:

\[\begin{align} \tag{A1} &A \rightarrow \forall xA \\ \tag{A2} &\forall x(A \rightarrow B) \rightarrow (\forall xA \rightarrow \forall xB) \\ \tag{A3} &\forall xA(x/t), \text{ if } A \text{ is an axiom} \\ \tag{A4} &\forall xA \rightarrow (\rE!t \rightarrow A(t/x)) \\ \tag{A5} &\forall x \rE!x. \end{align}\]

Once again, \(A(x/t)\) is the result of replacing all occurrences of individual constant \(t\) in \(A\) by the variable \(x\). If there are no such occurrences, then \(A(x/t)\) is just \(A\). In (A1) the variable \(x\) is not free in \(A\) (since otherwise \(A\) would be an open formula and formulas of \(\bL\) are closed). However, \(x\) may be free in \(A\) or \(B\) in (A2) and in \(A\) in (A3) and (A4).

(A4) and (A5) are special axioms for free logic. The others are classical. (A4) modifies the classical principle:

\[\tag{A4c} \forall xA \rightarrow A(t/x) \]

by using ‘\(\rE!\)’ to restrict specification. (A4) stipulates in effect that the quantifiers range over all objects that satisfy ‘\(\rE!\)’, (A5) that they range only over objects that satisfy ‘E!’. Omitting (A5) and replacing (A4) with (A4c) yields classical logic. To obtain a non-inclusive free logic, we may add to (A1)–(A5) the axiom \(\exists x\rE!x\)—or any axiom of the form \(\exists xT\) such that for any term \(t, T(t/x)\) is a tautology.

For languages containing the identity predicate, we also need:

\[\tag{A6} s=t \rightarrow(A \rightarrow A(t//s)), \]

where, as above, \(A(t//s)\) is the result of replacing one or more occurrences of \(s\) in \(A\) by \(t\), and either

\[\tag{A7} t=t \]

if all self-identity statements, including those whose singular term is empty, are to be true or

\[\tag{A7-} \forall x(x=x) \]

if not (see Sections 3.1 and 3.2 below). If ‘E!’ is defined in terms of the identity predicate as indicated in Section 1.2, then (A4) takes the form:

\[ \forall xA \rightarrow(\exists y(y=t) \rightarrow A(t/x)). \]

‘\(\rE!\)’ cannot be defined without the identity predicate (Meyer, Bencivenga and Lambert, 1982).

Free logic can be formalized without either ‘=’ or ‘\(\rE!\)’. (A1)–(A3) remain unchanged, but (A4) and (A5) are replaced respectively by:

\[\begin{align} \tag{A\(4'\)} & \forall y(\forall xA \rightarrow A(y/x)) \\ \tag{A\(5'\)} & \forall x\forall yA \rightarrow \forall y\forall xA. \end{align}\]

(A\(4')\), like (A4), restricts specification to objects within \(\bD\), but it uses a quantifier instead of ‘\(\rE!\)’ to do so. The quantifier permutation axiom (A\(5')\) is redundant in the presence of the identity axioms but, as Fine proved in (1983), is independent of the other axioms.

The formulas used in the axiom systems discussed so far are closed, but some free logics allow open formulas—i.e., formulas that contain free variables. These logics follow one of two conventions for variable assignments. Those that assign to each free variable a member of \(\bD\) are called E\(^+\)-logics; those that do not are called E-logics. The following specification rule is valid in E\(^+\)-logics but not in E-logics:

\[ \forall xA \vdash A(v/x). \]

(Here \(A(v/x)\) is the result of replacing every occurrence of the variable \(x\) in \(A\) by a variable \(v\) that is free for \(x\) in \(A\).) Conversely, the following substitution rule is valid in E-logics but not in E\(^+\)-logics:

\[ A \vdash A(t/x). \]

But since this article employs closed formulas, the distinction between E- and E\(^+\)-logics may here be ignored. (See Williamson (1999) for an illuminating discussion of problems engendered by permitting open formulas in inclusive logics.)

2.2 Natural Deduction Rules

PFL can also equivalently be formulated in a natural deduction system. The introduction and elimination rules for the operators of propositional logic and identity are as usual. The quantifier introduction and elimination rules are restricted by use of the predicate ‘\(\rE!\)’, as follows:

\((\forall\rI)\) Given a derivation of \(A(t/x)\) from \(\rE!t\), where \(t\) is new and does not occur in \(A\), discharge \(\rE!t\) and infer \(\forall xA\).
\((\forall \rE)\) From \(\forall xA\) and E\(!t\) infer \(A(t/x)\).
\((\exists \rI)\) From \(A\) and \(\rE!t\) infer \(\exists xA(x//t)\).
\((\exists \rE)\) Given \(\exists xA\) and a derivation of a formula \(B\) from \(A(t/x) \amp \rE!t\), where \(t\) is new and does not occur in either \(A\) or \(B\), discharge \(A(t/x) \amp \rE!t\) and infer \(B\) from \(\exists xA\).

The variable \(x\) need not be free in \(A\), in which case \(A(t/x)\) is just \(A\). ‘E!’ may either be taken as primitive (in which case it requires no additional rules) or defined in terms of the identity predicate as in Section 1.2. For non-inclusive logic, we may add a rule that introduces \(\exists x\rE!x\).

2.3 Tree Rules

Jeffrey-style tree rules (Jeffrey 1991) for PFL can be obtained by replacing the classical rules for existentially and universally quantified formulas with the following:

Existential Rule: If \(\exists xA\) appears unchecked on an open path, check it, and

  1. if \(x\) is free in \(A\), choose a new individual constant \(t\) and list both \(\rE!t\) and \(A(t/x)\) at the bottom of every open path beneath \(\exists xA\), and
  2. if \(x\) is not free in \(A\), write \(A\) at the bottom of every open path beneath \(\exists xA\).

Universal Rule: If \(\forall xA\) appears on an open path, then

  1. if \(x\) is free in \(A\), then where \(t\) is an individual constant that occurs in a formula on that path, or a new individual constant if there are none on the path, split the bottom of every open path beneath \(\forall xA\) into two branches, writing \({\sim}\rE!t\) at the bottom of the first branch and \(A(t/x)\) at the bottom of the second, and
  2. if \(x\) is not free in \(A\), write \(A\) at the bottom of every open path beneath \(\forall xA\).

For languages that do not allow vacuous quantification, clause (ii) can in each case be omitted. Non-inclusive free logic needs an additional rule that introduces \(\rE!t\) for some new individual constant \(t\) if a path does not already contain a formula of this form.

3. Semantics

Semantics for free logics differ in how they assign truth-values to atomic formulas that are empty-termed—i.e., contain at least one empty singular term. There are three general approaches:

  1. Negative semantics require all empty-termed atomic formulas to be false,
  2. Positive semantics allow some empty-termed atomic formulas not of the form E!t to be true, and
  3. Neutral (or nonvalent) semantics require all empty-termed atomic formulas not of the form E!t to be truth-valueless.

3.1 Negative Semantics

A negative semantics is a bivalent semantics on which all empty-termed atomic formulas (including identity statements) are false. The inclusive version presented here makes only minimal adjustments to classical semantics to allow for non-denoting terms.

Let the language \(\bL\) be defined as in Section 2. Then a negative inclusive model for \(\bL\) is a pair \(\langle \bD,\bI\rangle\), where \(\bD\) is a possibly empty set (the domain) and \(\bI\) is an interpretation function that assigns referents to individual constants and extensions to predicates such that:

  1. for each individual constant \(t\) of \(\bL\), either \(\bI(t) \in \bD\) or \(\bI(t)\) is undefined, and
  2. for each \(n\)-place predicate \(P\) of \(\bL, \bI(P) \subseteq \bD^n\).

\((\bD^n\) is the set of \(n\)-tuples of members of \(\bD\), a 1-tuple of an object \(d\) being just \(d\) itself.) Given a model \(\langle \bD,\bI\rangle\), we recursively define a valuation function \(\bV\) that assigns truth values to formulas as follows:

\[\begin{aligned} \bV(Pt_1 \ldots t_n) &= \left\{\begin{array}{l} \rT \Leftrightarrow \bI(t_1),\ldots,\bI(t_n) \text{ are all defined and} \\ \quad\langle \bI(t_1),\ldots, \bI(t_n)\rangle \in \bI(P); \\ \rF \text{ otherwise.} \end{array}\right. \\ \bV(s=t) &= \left\{\begin{array}{l} \rT \Leftrightarrow \bI(s),\bI(t) \text{ are defined and } \bI(s)=\bI(t); \\ \rF \text{ otherwise.} \end{array}\right. \\ \bV(\rE!t) &= \left\{\begin{array}{l} \rT \Leftrightarrow \bI(t) \text{ is defined;} \\ \rF \text{ otherwise.} \end{array}\right. \\ \bV({\sim}A) &= \left\{\begin{array}{l} \rT \Leftrightarrow \bV(A) = \rF\\ \rF \text{ otherwise.} \end{array}\right. \\ \bV(A\rightarrow B) &= \left\{\begin{array}{l} \rT \Leftrightarrow \bV(A) = F \text{ or } \bV(B) = T; \\ \rF \text{ otherwise.} \end{array}\right. \\ \bV(\forall xA) &= \left\{\begin{array}{l} \rT \Leftrightarrow \text{ for all } d\in \bD, \bV_{(t,d)}(A(t/x)) = \rT \\ \quad(\text{where } t \text{ is any individual constant not in } A \\ \quad\text{and } \bV_{(t,d)} \text{ is the valuation function on the} \\ \quad\text{model } \langle \bD,\bI^*\rangle \text{ such that } \bI^* \text{ is just like } \bI\\ \quad\text{except that } \bI^*(t)= d); \\ \rF \text{ otherwise.} \end{array}\right. \end{aligned}\]

(The metalinguistic symbol ‘\(\Leftrightarrow\)’ means “if and only if.”) A logic adequate to this semantics may be axiomatized by making three changes to the axioms of PFL. The first is to add the axiom:

\[\begin{align} \tag{A-} &Pt_1 \ldots t_n \rightarrow \rE!t_i, \text{ where } 1\le i\le n \text{ and} \\ & P \text{ is any primitive } n\text{-place predicate, including \(`\)='.} \end{align}\]

This expresses the convention that an atomic formula cannot be true unless its terms refer. Second, because all empty-termed identity statements are false on a negative semantics, (A7) is invalid and must be replaced by (A7-). Third, since (A2), (A3), (A-) and (A7-) together imply (A5), (A5) may be omitted. The resulting logic is known as NFL (Negative Free Logic). For languages with function symbols, negative free logic requires in addition this axiom of strictness:

\[ \rE!f(t_1 ,\ldots ,t_n) \rightarrow \rE!t_i, \text{ where } 1\le i\le n, \]

which assures that a function has a value only if each of its arguments does. Because of its unusual treatment of identity, negative free logic validates the equivalence:

\[ t=t \leftrightarrow \rE!t. \]

(This equivalence is sometimes taken as a definition of E\(!t\).) Identity statements in negative free logic thus have existential implications. This may be problematic in certain contexts. According to Shapiro and Weir (2000), for example, use of such an “existential” notion of identity sullies the “epistemic innocence” of some recent efforts to base neo-logicist philosophies of mathematics on free logic.

Negative free logic is also peculiar in that it validates the principle of indiscernibility of nonexistents:

\[ ({\sim}\rE!s \amp{\sim}\rE!t) \rightarrow(A \rightarrow A(t//s)), \]

where \(A(t//s)\) is the result of replacing one or more occurrences of \(s\) in \(A\) by \(t\).

3.2 Positive Semantics

Positive semantics allow some empty-termed atomic formulas not of the form \(\rE!t\) to be true. They are typically bivalent, though there are variants that allow truth-value gaps or extra truth values. Only bivalent semantics are considered in this section.

Positive semantics treat formulas of the form \(t=t\) as true, whether or not \(t\) is empty. Hence they validate (A7), which affirms all self-identity statements, not merely the weaker (A(7-), which affirms only self-identities between nonempty terms.

Like negative semantics, some positive semantics require each singular term to denote either a member of \(\bD\) or nothing at all. But then when a term fails to denote, the truth value of an atomic formula containing it cannot as usual be a function of its denotation, and the formula must be evaluated in some nonstandard way. To avoid such irregularity and yet permit empty-termed formulas to be true, other positive semantics allow singular terms to denote, and predicates to be satisfied by, nonmembers of \(\bD\). These nonmembers are collected into a second or outer domain \(\bD_o\), in contrast to which \(\bD\) is described as the inner domain. The result is a dual-domain semantics.

Positive semantics with dual domains are generally the simplest. The members of the outer domain \(\bD_o\) typically represent “non-existing” things. Depending on the application, these may be theoretical or ideal entities, error objects (in computer science), fictional objects, merely possible (or even impossible) objects, and so on. Some authors make \(\bD\) a subset of \(\bD_o\), which is the convention throughout this article; others make the two disjoint. In a bivalent dual-domain semantics each singular term denotes an object in \(\bD_o\) though possibly not in \(\bD\). Thus \(\bD\), though not \(\bD_o\), may be empty. Predicates are assigned extensions from \(\bD_o\), and the truth-values of atomic formulas (whether empty-termed or not) are computed in the usual Tarskian fashion: an atomic formula is true if and only if the \(n\)-tuple of objects denoted by its singular terms, taken in order, is a member of the predicate’s extension. Identity statements are no exception. Statements of the form \(s=t\) are true if and only if \(s\) and \(t\) denote the same object. Hence, even if empty-termed, they may be true.

More formally, a dual-domain model for a language \(\bL\) of the sort defined in Section 2 is a triple \(\langle \bD,\bD_o,\bI\rangle\), where \(\bD\) is a possibly empty inner domain, \(\bD_o\) is a nonempty outer domain such that \(\bD \subseteq \bD_o\), and \(\bI\) is an interpretation function such that for every individual constant \(t\) of \(\bL, \bI(t) \in \bD_o\), and for every \(n\)-place predicate \(P\) of \(\bL, \bI(P) \subseteq \bD_o^n\). Given a model \(\langle \bD,\bD_o,\bI\rangle\), the valuation function \(\bV\) assigns truth values to atomic and quantified formulas as follows:

\[\begin{aligned} \bV(Pt_1 \ldots t_n) &= \left\{\begin{array}{l} \rT \Leftrightarrow \langle\bI(t_1),\ldots,\bI(t_n)\rangle \in \bI(P); \\ \rF \text{ otherwise.} \end{array}\right. \\ \bV(s=t) &= \left\{\begin{array}{l} \rT \Leftrightarrow \bI(s)=\bI(t); \\ \rF \text{ otherwise.} \end{array}\right. \\ \bV(\rE!t) &= \left\{\begin{array}{l} \rT \Leftrightarrow \bI(t) \in \bD; \\ \rF \text{ otherwise.} \end{array}\right. \\ \bV(\forall xA) &= \left\{\begin{array}{l} \rT \Leftrightarrow \text{ for all } d\in \bD, \bV_{(t,d)}(A(t/x)) = \rT \\ \quad(\text{where } t \text{ is not in } A \text{ and } \bV_{(t,d)} \text{ is the}\\ \quad\text{valuation function on the model } \langle \bD,\bD_o,\bI^*\rangle \\ \quad\text{such that } \bI^* \text{ is just like } \bI \text{ except that}\\ \quad\bI^*(t)= d); \\ \rF \text{ otherwise.} \end{array}\right. \end{aligned}\]

The clauses for ‘\({\sim}\)’ and ‘ \(\rightarrow\) ’ are the same as in negative free logic. PFL with classical identity — that is, the logic axiomatized by (A1)–(A7) — is sound and complete with respect to this semantics (Leblanc and Thomason 1968).

Dual-domain semantics have been criticized as ontologically extravagant. In response, some authors have advocated single-domain positive semantics, which assign no denotation to empty singular terms. In such semantics empty-termed atomic formulas require unconventional treatment. Typically such semantics determine the truth-values of atomic formulas in two different ways: a Tarksi-style calculation for formulas whose terms all refer, and a separate truth-value assignment for empty-termed atomic formulas. The details, however, tend to get complicated. Antonelli (2000), for example, advocated such a single-domain free logic, which he called proto-semantics, but more recently (2007, p. 72) he has characterized all semantics for positive free logic as “somewhat artificial” and has questioned the logical character of free quantification in general.

3.3 Neutral Semantics

Neutral semantics make all empty-termed atomic formulas not of the form E!t truth-valueless. Truth-valueless formulas are often said to have “truth-value gaps.” Neutral semantics are of two types: ordinary neutral semantics, which provide conventions for calculating the truth values of complex formulas directly from their components, even when there are empty terms, and supervaluational semantics, which calculate the truth values of complex formulas by considering all the values that their components could have if their empty terms had referents. Ordinary neutral semantics will be considered in this section, supervaluations in Section 3.4.

The uniform policy of making all empty-termed atomic formulas truth-valueless has the advantages of plausibility and simplicity at the atomic level, but it complicates the evaluation of complex formulas. How are the logical operators to function when some of the values on which they usually operate are absent? Some cases are fairly clear. The negation of a truth-valueless formula, for example, is generally taken to be truth-valueless. But:

  • If \(A\) is true and \(B\) truth-valueless, is \(A \rightarrow B\) false or truth-valueless?
  • If \(A\) is false and \(B\) truth-valueless, is \(A \rightarrow B\) true or truth-valueless?
  • Let \(A = (B \amp C)\), where \(x\) is free in \(B, B\) be true of some but not all members of \(\bD\), and \(C\) be closed and truth-valueless. Clearly this open formula is either truth-valueless of every object in \(\bD\) or truth-valueless of some and false of others. In either case, is \(\exists xA\) truth-valueless or false?

At one extreme, we might want the operators to generate as many plausible truth values as possible in order to validate as many classically valid formulas as we can. At the other, one might arrange things so that all empty-termed formulas are truth-valueless, which would produce a very weak logic (Lehman 2001). But however we choose, many formulas that are valid in both classical predicate logic and the usual forms of free logic—indeed, even in propositional logic—will become invalid. The law of noncontradiction, for example:

\[ {\sim}(A \amp{\sim}A) \]

is truth-valueless whenever \(A\) is (unless we make negations of truth-valueless statements true) and hence becomes invalid. Of course this law and many other standard logical principles remain weakly valid—i.e., not false on any model—and it is possible to construct a logic based on weak validity rather than ordinary validity. But because any such logic will still be weaker than classical logic and because its theorems need not even be true, most logicians reject this strategy. For more on neutral free logic, see Lehman 1994, 2001, and 2002, pp. 233–237.

3.4 Supervaluations

Neutral semantics can be made to validate all the theorems of standard free logics by augmenting them with supervaluations. Supervaluations were first formalized by van Fraassen (1966). The version presented here is a variant of Bencivenga’s approach (1981 and 1986).

The fundamental idea is this: when empty terms deprive a formula of truth-value, supervaluational semantics nevertheless accounts it true (or false) if all possible ways of assigning referents to those terms agree in making it true (or false). This strategy restores validity to many principles that would lose it in an ordinary neutral semantics. The following instance of the law of noncontradiction:

\[ {\sim}(Pt \amp{\sim}Pt), \]

for example, is truth-valueless when \(t\) is nondenoting (assuming an ordinary neutral semantics that makes the negation of a truth-valueless formula truth-valueless). Hence in such a semantics the law itself is invalid. Yet were we to assign a referent to \(t\), that referent would either be in the extension of \(P\) or not. If it were, then \(Pt\) would be true. If it were not, then \(Pt\) would be false. In either case \({\sim}(Pt \amp{\sim}Pt)\) would be true. Thus, since all possible ways of assigning referents to \(t\) agree in making \({\sim}(Pt \amp{\sim}Pt)\) true, we should count \({\sim}(Pt \amp{\sim}Pt)\) itself as true. In this way the law of noncontradiction can be preserved.

More explicitly, a supervaluation begins with a neutral model \(\bM\) with a single, possibly empty domain. We then construct the set of completions of \(\bM\). These may be regarded as bivalent dual-domain positive models whose inner domain is the domain of \(\bM\), but which also have an outer domain \(\bD_o\) to provide referents for the empty terms. In each completion, singular terms that are nonempty in \(\bM\) retain their referents, and those that are empty in \(\bM\) denote a member of \(\bD_o - \bD\). For each \(n\)-place predicate \(P\), the extension of \(P\) is a subset of \(\bD_o^n\) and a superset of \(P\text{'s}\) extension in \(\bM\).

From these completions we now construct a supervaluation. A supervaluation of \(\bM\) is a partial assignment of truth-values to formulas that makes a formula true if all completions of \(\bM\) make it true, false if they all make it false, and truth-valueless if they disagree. A formula is valid on a supervaluational semantics if and only if it is true on all supervaluations. This semantics validates all and only the theorems of PFL (Bencivenga 1981, Morscher & Simons 2001, pp. 14–18).

Supervaluations employ what Bencivenga (1986) calls a “counterfactual theory” of truth: an empty-termed statement is true if it would be true on any assignment of referents to its empty terms. This has struck many critics as simply false. Moreover, the logic itself leaves much to be desired. For one thing, supervaluational consequence is too strong. Thus, for example, although the formula \(Pt \rightarrow \rE!t\) is (quite properly) not valid on a supervaluational semantics, nevertheless since \(\rE!t\) is true on every supervaluation on which \(Pt\) is true, the sequent (derivability statement) \(Pt \vdash \rE!t\) is improperly semantically valid. Therefore, although PFL is sound on supervaluational semantics and every semantically valid formula is a theorem of PFL, not all semantically valid sequents are provable in PFL. In fact, supervaluational consequence is not axiomatizable by any extension of free logic. This follows from a result of Woodruff (1984), who has shown that supervaluational semantics has many of the undesirable properties of second-order semantics. Jerry A. Fodor and Ernest Lapore (1996) argue, furthermore, that the completions needed to construct supervaluations are not meaning-preserving. Hence, they conclude, two alleged advantages of supervaluations—that they explain the meaningfulness of sentences with truth value gaps and that they allow us to preserve classical logic—are illusory. Finally, since supervaluations are built from completions that are in effect positive dual-domain models, we may wonder whether the detour through supervaluations is worth the trouble, since positive dual-domain models alone are simpler and more adequate to PFL.

4. Generic Anomalies

While problems noted above are specific to particular forms of free logic, there are anomalies that infect all, or nearly all, forms. This section considers three: (1) a cluster of problems related to the application of primitive predicates to empty terms, (2) the failure of substitutivity salva veritate of co-referential expressions, and (3) the inability of free logic to express sufficient conditions for existence.

4.1 Problems with Primitive Predicates

In classical logic and in positive free logic any substitution instance of a valid formula (or form of inference) is itself a valid formula (or form of inference). But in negative or neutral free logic this is not the case. A substitution instance is the result of replacing primitive non-logical symbols by possibly more complex ones of the same semantic type—\(n\)-place predicates with open formulas in \(n\) variables, and individual constants with singular terms—each occurrence of the same primitive symbol being replaced by the same possibly complex symbol. The replacement of an occurrence of a primitive \(n\)-place predicate \(P\) in some formula \(B\) by an open formula \(A\) with free variables \(x_1 ,\ldots ,x_n\) is performed as follows: where \(t_1 ,\ldots ,t_n\) are the individual constants or variables immediately following \(P\) in that occurrence, replace P\(t_1 \ldots t_n\) in \(B\) by \(A(t_i /x_i)\)—the result of replacing \(x_i\) by \(t_i\) in \(A\), for each \(i\), \(1\le i\le n\).

Let \(P\), for example, be a primitive one-place predicate. Then if the semantics is negative, \(Pt \rightarrow \rE!t\) is valid. But now consider the substitution instance \({\sim}Pt \rightarrow \rE!t\), in which the open formula \({\sim}Px\) is substituted for \(P\). This substitution instance is false when \(t\) is empty. Hence valid formulas may have invalid substitution instances. The same holds for ordinary neutral semantics that make conditionals true whenever their consequents are true.

In a negative semantics, moreover, the truth value of an empty-termed statement depends arbitrarily on our choice of primitive predicates. Consider, for example, a negative free logic interpreted over a domain of people that takes as primitive the one-place predicate ‘\(A\)’, meaning “is an adult,” and defines “is a minor” by this schema:

\[ Mt \eqdf {\sim}At. \]

For any non-denoting name \(t, At\) is false in this theory; hence \(Mt\) is true. If we take ‘is a minor’ as primitive instead, the truth-values of \(At\) and \(Mt\) are reversed. But why should truth-values depend on primitiveness in this way?

Positive semantics avoid these anomalies. But, if bivalent, in application they force us to assign truth values to empty-termed formulas in some other way, often without sufficient reason. Consider, for example, these three formulas, all of which contain the empty singular term ‘\(1/0\)’ (where ‘\(/\)’ is the division sign):

\[\begin{aligned} 1/0 &= 1/0 \\ 1/0 &\gt 1/0 \\ 1/0 &\le 1/0 \end{aligned}\]

Assuming a bivalent positive semantics, which ones should we make true and which false? Since the semantics is positive, ‘\(1/0 = 1/0\)’ is automatically true. One might argue further that since ‘\(\le\)’ expresses a relationship weaker than ‘=’ and since ‘\(1/0 = 1/0\)’ is true, ‘\(1/0 \le 1/0\)’ should be true as well. But that is merely to mimic with empty terms an inference pattern that holds for denoting terms. To what extent is such mimicry justified? Suppose we do decide to make ‘\(1/0 \le 1/0\)’ true; should we therefore make ‘\(1/0 \gt 1/0\)’ false? There are no non-arbitrary criteria for answering such questions. To a large extent, of course, the answers don’t matter. There are no facts here; any consistent convention will do. But that’s just the problem. Some convention is needed, and establishing one can be a lot of bother for nothing.

4.2 Substitutivity Failures

Classical predicate logic has the desirable feature that co-extensive open formulas may be substituted for one another in any formula salva veritate—i.e., without changing that formula’s truth value. (Open formulas \(A\) and \(B\) in \(n\) free variables \(x_1 ,\ldots ,x_n\) are coextensive if and only if \(\forall x_1 \ldots \forall x_n (A \leftrightarrow B)\) is true.) But, as Lambert noted in 1974, this principle fails for nearly all free logics with identity. Consider, for example, the formula \(t=t\), where \(t\) is empty, which is an instance of the open formula \(x=x\). Now \(x=x\) is coextensive with both \((x=x \amp \rE!x)\) and \((\rE!x \rightarrow x=x)\), since all three formulas are satisfied by all members of \(\bD\). Hence if co-extensive open formulas could be exchanged salva veritate, \((t=t \amp \rE!t)\) and \((\rE!t \rightarrow t=t)\) would have the same truth value as \(t=t\). But on nearly all free logics this is not the case. Positive free logic and the supervaluations described in Section 3.4 make \(t=t\) true and \((t=t \amp \rE!t)\) false; negative free logic makes \(t=t\) false and \((\rE!t \rightarrow t=t)\) true; and any ordinary neutral free logic whose conditionals are true whenever their antecedents are false makes \(t=t\) truth-valueless and \((\rE!t \rightarrow t=t)\) true. Many find this troubling because, since Frege, it has been widely held that (1) extensions of complex linguistic expressions should be functions of the extensions of their components (so that co-extensive components should be exchangeable without affecting the extension of the whole) and (2) the extension of a formula (or statement) is a truth value.

One possible response is to reject (2). Leeb (2006) develops for a version of PFL a dual-domain semantics in which the extensions of formulas are abstract states of affairs. In this semantics, co-referential open sentences are exchangeable not salve veritate, but (as he puts it) salve extensione; that is, the exchange does not alter the state of affairs designated by the statement in which it occurs. But Leeb’s state-of-affairs semantics is so complex that it may discourage application.

Those who wish to retain (2) may be consoled by the following observation: though substitutivity salve veritate of co-extensive open formulas fails for nearly all free logics, a related but weaker principle, the substitutivity salve veritate of co-comprehensive open formulas, is valid for positive free logics. Open formulas \(A\) and \(B\) in \(n\) free variables \(x_1 ,\ldots ,x_n\) are co-comprehensive if every assignment of denotations in the outer domain \(\bD_o\) to \(x_1 ,\ldots ,x_n\) satisfies \(A\) if and only if it satisfies \(B\). Among the open formulas mentioned in the previous paragraph, for example, \(x=x\) and \((\rE!x \rightarrow x=x)\) are co-comprehensive in a dual-domain positive free logic, being satisfied by all members of \(\bD_o\), but \((x=x \amp \rE!x)\) is not co-comprehensive with them, since it is satisfied only by the members of \(\bD\). Unlike co-extensiveness, however, co-comprehensiveness is not expressible in the language of PFL. But it becomes expressible with the introduction of quantifiers over the outer domain—a strategy considered in Section 5.5.

4.3 Inexpressibility of Existence Conditions

‘Whatever thinks exists,’ ‘Any necessary being exists’, ‘That which is immediately known exists’: such statements of sufficient conditions for existence are prominent in metaphysical debates. But, somewhat surprisingly, they are not expressible in free logic. Their apparent form is \(\forall x(A \rightarrow \rE!x)\). But because the universal quantifier ranges just over \(\bD\), which is also the extension of E!, this form is valid in free logic—as it is in classical logic with \(\rE!x\) expressed as \(\exists y\,y=x\). No statement of this form—not even ‘all impossible things exist’—can be false. Hence on free logic all such statements are equally devoid of content. Argument evaluation suffers as a result. Consider, for example, the obviously valid inference:

I think.
Whatever thinks exists.
\(\therefore\) I exist.

Its natural formalization in free logic is \(Ti, \forall x(Tx \rightarrow \rE!x) \vdash \rE!i\). But this form is invalid. To obtain the conclusion, we must first deduce \(Ti \rightarrow \rE!i\) by specification from the second premise and then use modus ponens with the first. But since the logic is free, specification requires the question-begging premise \(\rE!i\).

Unsatisfactory entailments involving “existence hedges”—predications that entail the existence of their objects—have recently come up in discussions of neutral free logic in particular. Daniel Yeakel (2016, p. 379) argues that “on any neutral free logic either some existence hedges will entail some undesired existence claims, or they will not entail some desired existence claims.” But the example of the previous paragraph works for negative and positive free logics as well. A remedy is not to be found in free logic alone, but again quantification over the outer domain of a dual-domain semantics may help (see Section 5.5).

5. Some Applications

This section considers applications of free logic in theories of definite descriptions, languages that allow partial or non-strict functions, logics with Kripke semantics, logics of fiction and logics that are in a certain sense “Meinongian.” Free logic has also found application elsewhere—most prominently in theories of predication, programming languages, set theory, logics of presupposition (with neutral semantics), and definedness logics. For more on these and other applications, see Lambert 1991 and 2001b; Lehman 2002, pp. 250–253; and Nolt 2006, pp. 1039–1053.

5.1 Theories of Definite Descriptions

The earliest and most extensive applications of free logic have been to the theory of definite descriptions. A definite description is a phrase that may be expressed in the form “the \(x\) such that \(A\),” where \(A\) is an open formula with only \(x\) free. Formally, this is written using a special logical operator, the definite description operator ‘\(\iota\)’, as \(\iota xA\). Contra Russell, free logic treats definite descriptions not as merely apparent singular terms in formulas whose logical form is obtainable only by elaborate contextual definitions, but as genuine singular terms. Thus, like an individual constant, \(\iota xA\) may be attached to predicates and (under appropriate conditions) substituted for variables. For any object \(d\) in the domain \(\bD, \iota xA\) denotes \(d\) if and only if among all objects in \(\bD\), \(d\) and only \(d\) satisfies \(A\). If in \(\bD\) there is more than one object satisfying \(A\), or none, \(\iota xA\) is empty. The description operator therefore satisfies:

\[\tag{LL} \forall y(y=\iota xA \leftrightarrow \forall x(A \leftrightarrow x=y)), x \text{ free in } A. \]

(This formula is sometimes called “Lambert’s Law,” though the earliest published mention of it was apparently in Hintikka (1959), p. 83. In the context of Hintikka’s system, however, it had various unwelcome consquences (see Lambert 1962; van Fraassen 1991, pp. 8–10).) Adding (LL) to the free logic defined by (A1)–(A6) and (A7-) gives the minimal free definite description theory MFD. MFD is the core of virtually all free description theories, which therefore differ only in the additional principles they endorse.

There is plenty of room for variation, for MFD fails to specify truth conditions for atomic formulas (including identities) when they contain empty descriptions, and there are many ways to do it. Making all atomic formulas containing empty descriptions false yields a negative free description theory axiomatizable by adding (LL) to NFL (Burge 1974, Lambert 2001h). The result is essentially Bertrand Russell’s theory of definite descriptions, but with the description operator taken as primitive rather than contextually defined.

The simplest positive free description theory makes all identities between empty terms true. Known as FD2, it may be axiomatized by adding (LL) and:

\[ ({\sim}\rE!s \amp{\sim}\rE!t) \rightarrow s=t \]

to PFL. FD2 is akin to Gottlob Frege’s theory of definite descriptions; but whereas Frege chose a single arbitrary existing object to serve as the conventional referent for empty singular terms, FD2 makes this object non-existent. FD2 is readily modeled in a dual-domain positive semantics with just one object in the outer domain.

On FD2 all empty descriptions are intersubstitutable salve veritate. But this result is subject to counterexamples in ordinary language. This statement:

The golden mountain is a possible object,

for instance, is true, while this one:

The set of all non-self-membered sets is a possible object,

is false—though each applies the same predicate phrase ‘is a possible object’ to an empty description. Thus we may prefer a more flexible positive free description theory on which identities between empty terms may be false. The literature presents a surprising diversity of these (Lambert 2001a, 2003c, 2003d, 2003h; Bencivenga 2002, pp. 188–193; Lehman 2002, pp. 237–250).

5.2 Logics with Partial or Non-Strict Functions

Some logics employ primitive n-place function symbols—symbols that combine with \(n\) singular terms to form a complex singular term. Thus, for example, the plus sign ‘+’ is a two-place function symbol that, when placed between, say, ‘2’ and ‘3’, forms a complex singular term, ‘\(2 + 3\)’ that denotes the number five. Similarly, ‘\(^2\)’ is a one-place function symbol that, when placed after a term denoting a number, forms a complex singular term that denotes that number’s square. Semantically, the extension of a function symbol is a function whose arguments are members of the quantificational domain \(\bD\), and the resulting complex term denotes the result of applying that function to the referents of the \(n\) component singular terms, taken in the order listed. Since classical logic requires every singular term (including those formed by function symbols) to refer to an object in \(\bD\), for each such function symbol \(f\), it requires that:

\[ \forall x_1 \ldots \forall x_n\exists y(y = f(x_1, \ldots, x_n)). \]

Hence classical logic prohibits primitive function symbols whose extensions are partial functions—functions whose value is for some arguments undefined. Such, for example, is the binary division sign ‘/’, since when placed between two numerals the second of which is ‘0’, it forms an empty singular term. Similarly, the limit function symbol ‘lim’ yields an empty singular term when applied to the name of a non-coverging sequence. Classical logic can accommodate function symbols for partial functions via elaborate contextual definitions. But then (as with Russellian definite descriptions) the form in which these function symbols are usually written is not their logical form. Free logic provides a more elegant solution. Because it allows empty singular terms, symbols for partial functions may simply be taken as primitive.

In applications of free logic involving partial functions, the existence predicate ‘\(\rE!\)’ is often replaced by the postfix definedness predicate ‘\(\downarrow\)’. For any singular term \(t, t\downarrow\) is true if and only if \(t\) has some definite value in \(\bD\). Thus, for example, the formula ‘\((1/0)\downarrow\)’ is false. While some writers (e.g., Feferman (1995)) distinguish ‘\(\downarrow\)’ from ‘\(\rE!\)’, the literature as a whole does not, and ‘\(\downarrow\)’ is often merely a syntactic variant of ‘\(\rE!\)’.

In addition to partial functions, positive free logics can also readily handle non-strict functions. A non-strict function is a function that may yield a value even if not all of its arguments are defined. The binary function \(f\) such that \(f(x,y) = x\), for instance, can yield a value even if the \(y\)-term is empty. So, for example, the formula \(f(1, 1/0) = 1\) can be regarded as true. Logics for non-strict functions must be positive because in a negative or neutral logic empty-termed atomic formulas, such as \(f(1, 1/0) = 1\), cannot be true. Free logics involving non-strict functions find application in some programming languages (Gumb 2001, Gumb and Lambert 1991). Such logics may employ a dual-domain semantics in which the referents of empty functional expressions such as ‘1/0’ are regarded as error objects—objects that correspond in the running of a program to error messages. Thus, for example, an instruction to calculate \(f(1, 1/0)\) might return the value 1, but an instruction to calculate \(f(1/0, 1)\) would return an error message.

5.3 Logics with Kripke Semantics

Kripke semantics for quantified modal logics, tense logics, deontic logics, intuitionistic logics, and so on, are often free. This is because they index truth to certain objects that we shall call “worlds,” and usually some things that we have names for do not exist in some of these worlds. Worlds may be conceived in various ways: they may, for example, be understood as possible universes in alethic modal logic, times or moments in tense logic, permissible conditions in deontic logic, or epistemically possible states of knowledge in intuitionistic logic. Associated with each world \(w\) is a domain \(\bD_w\), of objects (intuitively, the set of objects that exist at \(w)\). An object may exist in (or “at”) more than one world but need not exist in all. Thus, for example, Kripke semantics for tense logic represents the fact that Bertrand Russell existed at one time but exists no longer by Russell’s being a member of the domains of certain “worlds”—that is, times (specifically, portions of the last two centuries)—but not others (the present, for example, or all future times). Two natural assumptions are made here: that the same object may exist in more than one world (this is the assumption of transworld identity), and that some singular terms—proper names, in particular—refer not only to an object at a given world, but to that same object at every world. Such terms are called rigid designators. Any logic that combines rigid designators with quantifiers over the domains of worlds in which their referents do not exist must be free.

Kripke semantics gives predicates different extensions in different worlds. Thus, for example, the extension of the predicate ‘is a philosopher’ was empty in all worlds (times) before the dawn of civilization and more recently has varied. For rigidly designating terms, this raises the question of how to evaluate atomic formulas at worlds in which their referents do not exist. Is the predicate ‘is a philosopher’ satisfied, for example, by Russell in worlds (times) in which he does not exist—times such as the present? The general answers given to such questions determine whether a Kripke semantics is positive, negative or neutral.

For negative or neutral semantics, the extension at \(w\) of an \(n\)-place predicate \(P\) is a subset of \(\bD_w^n\). An atomic formula can be true at \(w\) only if all its singular terms have referents in \(\bD_w\); if not, it is false (in negative semantics) or truth-valueless (in neutral semantics). In a positive semantics, atomic formulas that are empty-termed at \(w\) may nevertheless be true at \(w\). Predicates are usually interpreted over the union \(\bU\) of domains of all the worlds, which functions as a kind of outer domain for each world, so that the extension of an \(n\)-place predicate \(P\) at a world \(w\) is a subset of \(\bU^n\). Some applications, however, require predicates to be true of—and singular terms to be capable of denoting—objects that exist in no world. If so, we may collect these objects into an outer domain that is a superset of \(\bU\). (They might be fictional objects, timeless Platonic objects, impossible objects, or the like.)

Quantified formulas, like all formulas, are true or false only relative to a world. Thus \(\exists xA\), for example, is true at a world \(w\) if and only if some object in \(\bD_w\) satisfies \(A\). Except in intuitionistic logic, where it has a specialized interpretation, the universal quantifier is interpreted similarly: \(\forall xA\) is true at \(w\) if and only if all objects in \(\bD_w\) satisfy \(A\). Kripke semantics often specify that for each \(w, \bD_w\) is nonempty, so that the resulting free logic is non-inclusive—but we shall not do so.

Any of various free modal or tense logics can be formalized by adding to a language \(\bL\) of the sort defined in Section 2 the sentential operator ‘\(\Box\)’. If \(A\) is a formula, so is \(\Box A\). In alethic modal logic, this operator is read “it is necessarily the case that.” More generally, it means “it is true in all accessible worlds that,” where accessibililty from a given world is a different relation for different modalities: possibility for alethic logics, permissibility for deontic logics, various temporal relations for tense logics, and so on. A typical bivalent Kripke model \(\bM\) for such a language consists of a set of worlds, a binary accessibility relation \(\bR\) defined on that set; an assignment to each world \(w\) of a domain \(\bD_w\); an “outer” domain \(\bD_o\) of objects (which typically is either \(\bU\) or a superset thereof); and a two-place interpretation function \(\bI\) that assigns denotations at worlds to individual constants and extensions at worlds to predicates. For each individual constant \(t\) and world \(w, \bI(t,w)\in \bD_o\). In such a model, a singular term is a rigid designator if and only if for all worlds \(w_1\) and \(w_2\), \(\bI(t,w_1) = \bI(t,w_2)\). For every \(n\)-place predicate \(P, \bI(P,w) \subseteq \bD_w^n\) if the semantics is negative or neutral; if it is positive, \(\bI(P,w) \subseteq \bD_o^n\). Truth values at the worlds of a model \(\bM\) are assigned by a two-place valuation function \(\bV\) (where \(\bV(A,w)\) is read “the truth value \(\bV\) assigns to formula \(A\) at world \(w\)”) as follows:

\[\begin{aligned} \bV(Pt_1 \ldots t_n,w) &= \left\{\begin{array}{l} \rT \Leftrightarrow \langle\bI(t_1,w),\ldots,\bI(t_n,w)\rangle \in \bI(P,w); \\ \rF \text{ otherwise.} \end{array}\right. \\ \bV(s=t,w) &= \left\{\begin{array}{l} \rT \Leftrightarrow \bI(s,w)=\bI(t,w); \\ \rF \text{ otherwise.} \end{array}\right. \\ \bV(\rE!t,w) &= \left\{\begin{array}{l} \rT \Leftrightarrow \bI(t,w) \in \bD_w; \\ \rF \text{ otherwise.} \end{array}\right. \\ \bV({\sim}A,w) &= \left\{\begin{array}{l} \rT \Leftrightarrow \bV(A,w) = \rF\\ \rF \text{ otherwise.} \end{array}\right. \\ \bV(A\rightarrow B,w) &= \left\{\begin{array}{l} \rT \Leftrightarrow \bV(A,w) = F \text{ or } \bV(B,w) = T; \\ \rF \text{ otherwise.} \end{array}\right. \\ \bV(\Box A,w) &= \left\{\begin{array}{l} \rT \Leftrightarrow \text{ for all } u \text{ such that } w\bR u, \bV(A,u) = \rT\\ \rF \text{ otherwise.} \end{array}\right. \\ \bV(\forall xA,w) &= \left\{\begin{array}{l} \rT \Leftrightarrow \text{ for all } d\in \bD_w, \bV_{(t,d)}(A(t/x),w) = \rT \\ \quad(\text{where } t \text{ is not in } A \text{ and } \bV_{(t,d)} \text{ is the}\\ \quad\text{valuation function on the model just like } \bM \\ \quad\text{except that its interpretation function } \bI^* \text{ is} \\ \quad\text{such that for each world } w, \bI^*(t,w)= d); \\ \rF \text{ otherwise.} \end{array}\right. \end{aligned}\]

Under the stipulations that admissible models make all individual constants rigid designators and that \(\bI(P,w) \subseteq \bD_o^n\), the standard free logic PFL, together with the modal axioms and rules appropriate to whatever structure we assign to \(\bR\), is sound and complete on this semantics.

Modal semantics thus defined call for free logic whenever worlds are allowed to have differing domains—that is whenever we may have worlds \(u\) and \(w\) such that \(\bD_u \ne \bD_w\). For in that case there must be an object \(d\) that exists in one of these domains (let it be \(\bD_w)\), but not the other, so that any singular term \(t\) that rigidly designates \(d\) must be empty at world \(u\). Hence \({\sim}\exists x(x=t)\) (which is self-contradictory in classical logic) must be true at world \(u\). Such a semantics also requires free logic when \(\bD_o\) contains objects not in \(\bU\), for in that case rigid designators of these objects are empty in all worlds. Finally, this semantics calls for inclusive logic if any world has an empty domain. Thus, given this semantics, the only way to make the resulting logic unfree is to require that domains be fixed—i.e., that all worlds have the same domain \(\bD\), that \(\bD\) be non-empty, and that \(\bD_o = \bD\).

Just this trio of requirements was in effect proposed by Saul Kripke in his ground-breaking (1963) paper on modal logic as one of two strategies for retaining classical quantification. (The other, more draconian, strategy was to allow differing domains but ban individual constants and treat open formulas as if they were universally quantified.) But such fixed-domain semantics validate the implausible formula:

\[ \forall x\Box \exists y(y = x), \]

which asserts that everything exists necessarily and the equally implausible Barcan formula:

\[ \forall x\Box A \rightarrow \Box \forall xA \]

(named for Ruth Barcan, later Ruth Barcan Marcus, who discussed it as early as the late 1940s). To see its implausibility, consider this instance: ‘If everything is necessarily a product of the big bang, then necessarily everything is a product of the big bang’. It may well be true that everything (in the actual world) is necessarily a product of the big bang—i.e., that nothing in this world would have existed without it. But it does not seem necessary that everything is a product of the big bang, for other universes are possible in which things that do not exist in the actual world have other ultimate origins. Because of the restrictiveness and implausibility of fixed-domain semantics, many modal logicians loosen Kripke’s strictures and adopt free logics.

We may also drop the assumption that singular terms are rigid designators and thus allow nonrigid designators. On the semantics considered here, these are singular terms \(t\) such that for some worlds \(w_1\) and \(w_2, \bI(t,w_1) \ne \bI(t,w_2)\). Definite descriptions, understood attributively, are the best examples. Thus the description “the oldest person” designates different people at different times (worlds)—and no one at times before people existed (“worlds” \(w\) at which \(\bI(t,w)\) is undefined).

Nonrigid designators, if empty at some worlds, require free logics even with fixed domains. (Thus classical logic with nonrigid designators is possible only if we require for each singular term \(t\) that at each world \(w\), \(t\) denotes some object in \(\bD_w\).) On some semantics for nonrigid designators, the quantifier rule must differ from that given above, and other adjustments must be made. For details, see Garson 1991, Cocchiarella 1991, Schweitzer 2001 and Simons 2001.

Intuitionistic logic, too, has a Kripke semantics, though special valuation clauses are needed for ‘\({\sim}\)’, ‘\(\rightarrow\)’ and ‘\(\forall\)’ in order to accommodate the special meanings these operators have for intuitionists, and ‘\(\Box\)’ is generally not used. The usual first-order intuitionistic logic, the Heyting predicate calculus (HPC)—also called the intuitionistic predicate calculus—has the theorem \(\exists x(x=t)\) and hence is not free. But intuitionists admit the existence only of objects that can in some sense be constructed, while classical mathematicians posit a wider range of objects. Therefore users of HPC cannot legitimately name all the objects that classical mathematicians can. Worse, they cannot legitimately name objects whose constructibility has yet to be determined. Yet some Kripke-style semantics for HPC do allow use of names for such objects (semantically, names of objects that “exist” at worlds accessible from the actual world but not at the actual world itself). Some such semantics, though intended for HPC, have turned out, unexpectedly, not to be adequate for HPC. An obvious fix, advocated by Posy (1982), is to adopt a free intuitionistic logic. For more on this issue, see Nolt 2007.

5.4 Logics of Fiction

Because fictions use names that do not refer to literally existing things, free logic has sometimes been employed in their analysis. So long as we engage in the pretense of a story, however, there is no special need for it. It is true, for example, in Tolkien’s The Lord of the Rings that Gollum hates the sun, from which we can legitimately infer that in the story there exists something that hates the sun. Thus quantifiers may behave classically so long as we consider only what occurs and what exists “in the story.” (The general logic of fiction, however, is often regarded as nonclassical, for two reasons: (1) a story may be inconsistent and hence require a paraconsistent logic, and (2) the objects a story describes are typically (maybe always) incomplete; that is, the story does not determine for each such object \(o\) and every property \(P\) whether or not \(o\) has \(P\).)

The picture changes, however, when we distinguish what is true in the story from what is literally true. For this purpose logics of fiction often deploy a sentence operator that may be read “in the story.” Here we shall use ‘\(\mathbf{S}_x\)’ to mean “in the story \(x\),” where ‘\(x\)’ is to be replaced by the name of a specific story. Anything within the scope of this operator is asserted to be true in the named story; what is outside its scope is to be understood literally. (For a summary of theories of what it means to be true in a story, see Woods 2006.)

With this operator the statement ‘In the story, The Lord of the Rings, Gollum hates the sun’ may be formalized as follows:

\[\tag{GHS} \mathbf{S}_{The\: Lord\: of\: the\: Rings}(\text{Gollum hates the sun}). \]

The statement that in The Lord of the Rings something hates the sun is:

\[ \mathbf{S}_{The\: Lord\: of\: the\: Rings}\exists x(x \text{ hates the sun}). \]

This second statement follows from the first, even though Gollum does not literally exist. But it does not follow that there exists something such that it, in The Lord of the Rings, hates the sun:

\[ \exists x \mathbf{S}_{The\: Lord\: of\: the\: Rings}(x \text{ hates the sun}). \]

and indeed that statement is not true, for, literally, Gollum does not exist. Since the sun, however, exists both literally and in the story, the statement:

\[ \exists x\mathbf{S}_{The\: Lord\: of\: the\: Rings}(\text{Gollum hates } x) \]

is true and follows by free existential generalization from (GHS) together with the true premise ‘\(\rE!(\text{the sun})\)’. Thus free logic may play a role in reasoning that mixes fictional and literal discourse.

Terms for fictional entities also occur in statements that are entirely literal, making no mention of what is true “in the story.” Consider, for example, the statement:

\[\tag{G} \text{Gollum is more famous than Gödel.} \]

Mark Sainsbury (2005, ch. 6) holds that reference failure invariably makes such statements false and hence that they are best represented in a negative free logic. Others, however—including Orlando 2008 and Dumitru and Kroon 2008—question Sainsbury’s treatment, maintaining that statements like (G) are both atomic and true. If so, they require a positive free logic. The logic must be free because it deals with an empty singular term, and it must be positive, because only on a positive semantics can empty-termed atomic statements be true. One must still decide, however, whether the name ‘Gollum’ is to be understood as having no referent or as having a referent that does not exist.

If ‘Gollum’ has no referent, then (G) might be handled by a single-domain positive semantics. But that semantics would have to treat atomic formulas non-standardly; it could not, as usual, stipulate that (G) is true just in case the pair \(\langle\)Gollum, Gödel\(\rangle\) is a member of the extension of the predicate ‘is more famous than’; for if there is no Gollum, there is no such pair. On such a semantics ‘Gollum is more famous than Gödel’ would not imply that something is more famous than Gödel.

If, on the other hand, terms such as ‘Gollum’ refer to non-existent objects, then those objects could inhabit the outer domain of a dual-domain positive free logic. Dumitru (2015), for example, lays out such a dual-domain semantics for fictional discourse using free descriptions and compares it with a supervaluational approach that also uses free descriptions. In a such a dual-domain semantics, atomic formulas have their standard truth conditions: (G) is true just in case \(\langle\)Gollum, Gödel\(\rangle\) is a member of the extension of ‘is more famous than’. Moreover, if we allow quantifiers over that outer domain, then ‘Something is more famous than Gödel’ (where the quantifier ranges over the outer domain) does follow from ‘Gollum is more famous than Gödel’, though ‘There literally exists something more famous than Gödel’ (where the quantifier ranges over the inner domain) does not. Meinongian logics of fiction employ this strategy.

5.5 Meinongian Logics

Alexius Meinong is best known for his view that some objects that do not exist nevertheless have being. His name has been associated with various developments in logic. Some free logicians use it to describe any dual-domain semantics. For others, Meinongian logic is something much more elaborate: a rich theory of all the sorts of objects we can think about—possible or impossible, abstract or concrete, literal or fictional, complete or incomplete. In this section the term is used to describe logics stronger than the first type but possibly weaker than the second: positive free logics with an extra set of quantifiers that range over the outer domain of a dual-domain semantics.

Whether such logics can legitimately be considered free is controversial. On older conceptions, free logic forbids any quantification over non-existing things (see Paśniczek 2001 and Lambert’s reply in Morscher and Hieke 2001, pp. 246–8). But by anybody’s definition, Meinongian logics in the sense intended here at least contain free logics when the inner domain is interpreted as the set of existing things. Moreover, on the strictly semantic definition used in this article (Section 1.1), which is also that of Lehman 2002, whether the members of \(\bD\) exist is irrelevant to the question of whether a logic is free. For a defense of this definition, see Nolt 2006, pp. 1054–1057.

Historically, quantification over domains containing objects that do not exist has been widely dismissed as ontologically irresponsible. Quine (1948) famously maintained that existence is just what an existential quantifier expresses. Yet nothing forces us to interpret “existential” quantification over every domain as expressing existence—or being of any sort. Semantically, an existential quantifier on a variable \(x\) is just a logical operator that takes open formulas on \(x\) into truth values; the value is T if and only if the open formula is satisfied by at least one object in the quantifier’s domain. That the objects in the domain have or lack any particular ontological status is a philosophical interpretation of the formal semantics. Alex Orenstein (1990) argues that “existential” is a misnomer and that we should in general call such quantifiers “particular.” That suggestion is followed in the remainder of this section.

Quantifiers ranging over the outer domain of a dual-domain semantics are called outer quantifiers, and those ranging over the inner domain inner quantifiers. If the inner particular quantifier is interpreted to mean “there exists” and the members of the outer domain are possibilia, then the outer particular quantifier may mean something like “there is possible a thing such that” or “for at least one possible thing.” We shall use the generalized product symbol ‘\(\Pi\)’ for the outer universal quantifier and the generalized sum symbol ‘\(\Sigma\)’ for its particular dual. This notation enables us to formalize, for example, the notoriously puzzling but obviously true statement ‘Some things don’t exist’ (Routley 1966) as:

\[ \Sigma x{\sim}\rE!x. \]

Since in a dual-domain semantics all singular terms denote members of the outer domain, the logic of outer quantifiers is not free but classical. With ‘E!’ as primitive, the free inner quantifiers can be defined in terms of the classical outer ones as follows:

\[\begin{aligned} \forall xA &\eqdf \Pi x(\rE!x \rightarrow A) \\ \exists xA &\eqdf \Sigma x(\rE!x \amp A). \end{aligned}\]

The outer quantifiers, however, cannot be defined in terms of the inner.

Logics with both inner and outer quantifiers have various applications. They enable us, for example, to formalize substantive sufficient conditions for existence and hence adequately express the argument of Section 4.3, as follows:

\[ Ti, \Pi x(Tx \rightarrow \rE!x) \vdash \rE!i. \]

This form is valid. The co-comprehensiveness of open formulas \(A\) and \(B\) in \(n\) free variables \(x_1 ,\ldots ,x_n\) (see Section 4.2), can likewise be formalized as:

\[ \Pi x_1 \ldots \Pi x_n (A \leftrightarrow B). \]

Richard Grandy’s (1972) theory of definite descriptions holds that \(\iota xA=\iota xB\) is true if and only if \(A\) and \(B\) are co-comprehensive and thus is readily expressible in a Meinongian logic. Free logics with outer quantifiers have also been employed in logics that are Meinongian in the richer sense of providing a theory of objects (including, in some cases, fictional objects) that is inspired by Meinong’s work (Routley 1966 and 1980, Parsons 1980, Jacquette 1996, Paśniczek 2001, Priest 2005 and 2008, pp. 295–7).

6. History

Inclusive logic was conceived and formalized before free logic per se was. Thus, since inclusive logic with singular terms is de facto free, the inventors of inclusive logics were, perhaps unwittingly, the inventors of free logic. Bertrand Russell suggested the idea of an inclusive logic in (1919, p. 201, n.). Andrezej Mostowski (1951) seems to have been among the first to formalize such a logic. But Morscher and Simons (2001, p. 27, note 3) document earlier discussions of the idea, and Bencivenga (2014) holds that Jaśkowski (1934) contains, at least implicitly, the first inclusive logic. Theodore Hailperin (1953), Czeslaw Lejewski (1954) and W. V. O. Quine (1954) made important early contributions. It was Quine who dubbed such logics “inclusive.”

Henry S. Leonard (1956) was the first to develop a free logic per se, though he used a defective definition of ‘E!’. Karel Lambert began his prolific series of contributions to the field in (1958), critiquing Leonard’s definition, and then coining the term “free logic” in (1960). The early systems of free logic were positive. Negative free logic was developed by Rolf Schock in a series of papers during the 1960s, culminating in (1968). Timothy Smiley suggested the idea of a neutral free logic in (1960), but the first thoroughgoing treatment appeared in Lehman 1994. Supervaluations were described in Mehlberg 1958, pp. 256–260, as a device for handling, not neutral free logic, but vagueness. But their formalization and application to free logic began with van Fraassen 1966, in which the term “supervaluation” was introduced. Dual-domain semantics were discussed in lectures by Lambert, Nuel Belnap and others as early as the late 1950s, but it appears that Church 1965 and Cocchiarella 1966 were the first published accounts.


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The author thanks Ian Orr and Eddy Falls for help in researching this article, and Karel Lambert and İskender Taşdelen for useful comments on, or corrections to, earlier versions.

Copyright © 2020 by
John Nolt

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