Supplement to Inductive Logic

In this section we’ll see that for the special case of enumerative inductions probabilistic inductive logic satisfies the Criterion of Adequacy (CoA) stated at the beginning of this article. That is, under some plausible conditions, given a reasonable amount of evidence, the degree to which that evidence comes to support a hypothesis through enumerative induction is very likely to approach 1 for true hypotheses. We will now see precisely how this works.

Recall that in enumerative inductions the idea is to infer the proportion, or relative frequency, of an attribute in a population from how frequently the attribute occurs in a sample of the population. Examples 1 and 2 at the beginning of the article describe two such inferences. Enumerative induction is only a rather special case of inductive inference. However, such inferences are very common, and so worthy of careful attention. They arise, for example, in the context of polling and in many other cases where a population frequency is estimated from a sample. We will establish conditions under which such inferences give rise to highly objective posterior probabilities, posterior probabilities that are extremely stable over a wide range of reasonable prior plausibility assessments. That is, we will consider all of the inductive support functions in an agent’s vagueness set V or in a community’s diversity set D. We will see that under some very weak suppositions about the make up of V or of D, a reasonable amount of data will bring all of the support functions in these sets to agree that the posterior degree of support for a particular frequency hypothesis is very close to 1. And, we will see, it is very likely these support functions will converge to agreement on a true hypothesis.


1. Convergence to Agreement

Suppose we want to know the frequency with which attribute A occurs among members of population B. We randomly select a sample S from B consisting of n members, and find that it contains m members that exhibit attribute A.[21] On the basis of this evidence, what is the posterior probability p of the hypothesis that the true proportion (or frequency) of As among Bs is within a given region R around the sample proportion \(m/n\)? And to what extent does that bound depend on the prior probabilities of the various possible alternative frequency hypotheses. More generally, for a given vagueness or diversity set, what bounds can we place on the values of p.

Put more formally, we are asking for what values of p and q does the following inequality hold:

\[ P_{\alpha}\left[ \begin{split} & (m/n) - q \lt F[A,B] \lt(m/n)+q \\ & \begin{split} {} \pmid b & \cdot F[A,S] =m/n \\ &\cdot \Rnd[S,B,A] \\ &\cdot \Size[S] =n \end{split} \end{split} \right] \gt p? \]

It turns out that we need only a very weak supposition about the values of prior probabilities of support functions \(P_{\alpha}\) in vagueness or diversity sets to legitimize such inferences, an supposition that almost always holds in the context of enumerative inductions.

Boundedness Assumption for Estimation:
There is a region R of possible values near the sample frequency \(m/n\) (e.g., R is the region between \((m/n)-q\) and \((m/n)+q\) , for some margin of error q of interest) such that no frequency hypothesis outside of region R is overwhelmingly more initially plausible than those frequency hypotheses inside of region R.

What does it mean for no frequency hypothesis outside of region R to be overwhelmingly more initially plausible than those frequency hypotheses inside of region R (where R is some specific region in which the sample frequency, \(F[A,S]=m/n\), lies)? The main idea is that there is some (perhaps very large) bound K on how much more plausible frequency hypotheses outside of region R may be than those frequency hypotheses inside of region R. We state this condition carefully by considering two kinds of cases, depending on whether or not the population B is known to be bounded in size by some specific (perhaps overly large) integer u. (The first case will be simpler because it doesn’t suppose that the support functions involved may be characterized by probability density functions, while the second case does suppose this.)

Case 1. Suppose the size of the population B is finite. We need not know how big B is. We merely suppose that for some positive integer u that is at least as large as the size of B, but might well be many times larger, the following condition holds for all support functions \(P_{\alpha}\) in the vagueness or diversity set under consideration.

There is some specific positive factor K (possibly very large, perhaps as large as 1000, or larger) such that for any pair of hypotheses of form \(F[A,B] = v/u\) inside region R and of form \(F[A,B] = w/u\) outside of region R (where \(u, v\), and w are non-negative integers), the hypothesis outside of region R is no more than K times more plausible than the hypothesis within region R (given plausibility consideration within b)—i.e., for all ratios \(v/u\) inside region R and all ratios \(v/u\) outside region R,

\[\frac{P_{\alpha}[F[A,B]=w/u \pmid b]}{P_{\alpha}[F[A,B]=v/u \pmid b]} \le K.\]

For Case 1 we also assume (as seems reasonable) that in the absence of information about the observed sample frequency, the claim ‘\(\textrm{Random}[S,B,A] \cdot \Size[S]=n\)’, that the sample is randomly selected and of size n, should be irrelevant to the initial plausibilities of possible population frequencies—i.e., we suppose that

\[P_{\alpha}\left[\begin{split} & F[A,B] =k/u \\ & \begin{split} {} \pmid \Rnd[S,B,A] & \cdot \Size[S] =n \\ & \cdot b \end{split} \end{split} \right] = P_{\alpha}\left[F[A,B] =k/u \pmid b \right] \]

for each integer k from 0 through u.

Case 2. Alternatively, suppose that there is no positive integer u at least as large as the size of population B that satisfies the conditions of case 1. But suppose that the prior probabilities of the various competing hypotheses can be represented (at least very nearly) by a probability density function \(p_{\alpha}[F[A,B]=r \pmid b]\)—i.e., for any specific values v and u, the value of

\[ P_{\alpha}[ v \lt F[A,B] \lt u \pmid b] = \int_{v}^u p_{\alpha}[F[A,B]=r \pmid b] dr,\]

or at least very nearly so. Then we just need the following condition to be satisfied by all support functions \(P_{\alpha}\) in the vagueness or diversity set under consideration.

There is some specific positive factor K (possibly very large, perhaps as large as 1000, or larger) such that for any pair of hypotheses of form \(F[A,B] = r\) inside region R and of form \(F[A,B] = s\) outside of region R (where r and s are non-negative real numbers no larger than 1), the value of the probability density function for the hypothesis outside of region R is no more than K times larger than the value of the probability density function for the hypothesis within region R (given plausibility consideration within b), where the density function within region R is never less than some (perhaps very tiny) positive lower bound—i.e., for all values r inside region R and all values s outside region R,

\[\frac{p_{\alpha}[F[A,B]=s \pmid b]}{p_{\alpha}[F[A,B]=r \pmid b]} \le K,\]

where for all r within region R, \(p_{\alpha}[F[A,B]=r \pmid b] \ge g\) for some small \(g \gt 0\).

For Case 2 we also assume (as seems reasonable) that in the absence of information about the observed sample frequency, the claim ‘\(\textrm{Random}[S,B,A] \cdot \Size[S]=n\)’, that the sample is randomly selected and of size n, should be irrelevant to the initial plausibilities of possible population frequencies—i.e., in particular, we suppose that for each probability density function \(p_{\alpha}\) under consideration,

\[ p_{\alpha}\left[ \begin{split} & F[A,B] =q \\ & \begin{split} {} \pmid \Rnd[S,B,A] & \cdot \Size[S] =n \\ & \cdot b \end{split} \end{split} \right] = p_{\alpha}\left[F[A,B]=q \pmid b\right] \]

for real numbers q from 0 through 1.

When either of these two Cases hold, let us say that for the support functions \(P_{\alpha}\) in the vagueness or diversity sets under consideration, the prior probabilities are K bounded with respect to region R. Then we have the following theorem about enumerative inductions, which shows that the posterior probability that the true frequency must lie within a small region R around the sample frequency \(m/n\) quickly approaches 1 as the sample size n becomes large.

Theorem: Frequency Estimation Theorem:[22]
Suppose, for all support functions \(P_{\alpha}\) in the vagueness or diversity set under consideration, the prior probabilities are K bounded with respect to region R, where region R contains the fraction \(m/n\) (for positive integer n and non-negative integer \(m \le n)\). Then, for all support functions \(P_{\alpha}\) in the vagueness or diversity set,

\[ P_{\alpha} \left[\begin{split} &F[A,B]\in R \\ &\begin{split} {}\pmid b & \cdot F[A,S]=m/n \\ & \cdot \Rnd[S,B,A] \\ & \cdot \Size[S]=n \end{split} \end{split}\right] \ge \frac{1}{1 + K\times\left[\left(\frac{1}{\beta[R, m+1, n-m+1]}\right) - 1\right]}. \]

For any given region R containing sample frequencies \(m/n\), this lower bound approaches 1 rapidly as n increases.

The expression ‘\(\beta[R, m+1, n-m+1]\)’ represents the beta-distribution function with parameters \(m+1\) and \(n-m+1\) evaluated over region R. By definition

\[\beta[R, m+1, n-m+1] = \frac{\int_{R} r^{m} (1-r)^{n-m} dr}{\int_{0}^1 r ^m (1-r)^{n-m} dr}.\]

When region R contains an interval around \(m/n\), the value of this function is a fraction that approaches 1 for large n. In a moment we will see some concrete illustrations of the implications of this theorem for specific values of m and n and specific regions R.

The values of the beta-distribution function may be easily computed using a version of the function supplied with most mathematics and spreadsheet programs. The version of the function supplied by such programs usually takes the form \(\BETADIST(x, y, z)\), which computes the value of the beta distribution from 0 up to to x, and where y and z are the “parameters of the distribution”. For our purposes, where the sample S of n selections from B yields m that exhibit As, these parameters need to be \(m+1\) and \(n-m+1\). So if the region R of interest (wherein the sample frequency m/n lies) is between the values v and u (where v is the lower bound on region R and u is the upper bound on region R), then the program should be asked to compute the value of

\[\beta[R, m+1, n-m+1] = \frac{\int_{v}^u r^{m} (1-r)^{n-m} dr}{\int_{0}^1 r ^m (1-r)^{n-m} dr} \]

by having it compute

\[\BETADIST[u, m+1, n-m+1]- \BETADIST[v, m+1, n-m+1].\]

So, to have your mathematics or spreadsheet program compute a lower bound on the value of

\[ P_{\alpha}\left[\begin{aligned} & v \le F[A,B] \le u \\ & \begin{split} {} \pmid b & \cdot F[A,S] =m/n \\ & \cdot \Rnd[S,B,A] \\ & \cdot \Size[S] =n \end{split} \end{aligned} \right] \]

for a given upper bound K (on how much more initially plausible it is that the true population frequency lies outside the region between v and u than it is that the true population frequency lies inside that region), you may be able to simply paste the following expression into your program and then plug in desired values for K, u, v, m, n in this expression:

\[ \frac{1}{1 + K*\left(\frac{1}{ \BETADIST(u, m+1, n-m+1) - \BETADIST(v, m+1, n-m+1)} - 1\right)} \]

In many real cases it will not be initially more plausible that the true frequency value lies outside of the region of interest between v and u than that it lies inside that region. In such cases set the value of K to 1. However, you will find that for any moderately large sample size n, this function yields very similar values for all plausible values of K you might try out, even when the values of K are quite large. (We’ll see examples of this fact in the computed tables below.)

This theorem implies that for large samples the values of prior probabilities don’t matter much. Given such evidence, a vary wide range of inductive support functions \(P_{\alpha}\) will come to agree on high posterior probabilities that the proportion of attribute A in population B is very close to the sample frequency. Thus, all support functions in such vagueness or diversity sets come to near agreement. Let us look at several numerical examples to make clear how strong this result really is.

The first section of this article provided two examples of enumerative inductive inferences. Consider Example 1. Let ‘B’ represent the population of all ravens. Let ‘A’ represent the class of black ravens. Now consider those hypotheses of form ‘\(F[A,B] = r\)’ for r in the interval between .99 and 1. This collection of hypotheses includes the claim that “all ravens are black” together with those alternative hypotheses that claim the frequency of being black among ravens is within .01 of 1. The alternatives to these hypotheses are just those that assert ‘\(F[A,B] = s\)’ for values of s below .99.

Suppose none of the support functions represented in the vagueness or diversity set under consideration rates the prior plausibility of any of the hypotheses ‘\(F[A,B] = s\)’ with s less than .99 to be more than twice as plausible as the hypotheses ‘\(F[A,B] = r\)’ for which r is between .99 and 1. That is, suppose, for each \(P_{\alpha}\) in the vagueness or diversity set under consideration, the prior plausibility \(P_{\alpha}[F[A,B] = s \pmid b]\) for hypotheses with s below .99 is never more than \(K = 2\) times greater than the prior plausibility \(P_{\alpha}[F[A,B] = r \pmid b]\) for hypotheses with r between .99 and 1. Then, on the evidence of 400 ravens selected randomly with respect to color, the theorem yields the following bound for all \(P_{\alpha}\) in the vagueness or diversity set:

\[ P_{\alpha} \left[ \begin{aligned} & F[A,B] \gt .99 \\ & \begin{split} {} \pmid b & \cdot F[A,S] = 1 \\ & \cdot \Rnd[S,B,A] \\ & \cdot \Size[S] = 400 \end{split} \end{aligned} \right] \ge .9651. \]

The following table describes similar results for other upper bounds K on values of prior probability ratios and other sample sizes n:

Table 1: Values of lower bound p on the posterior probability

\(m/n = 1\)
\(F[A,B] \gt .99\)
Sample-Size \(= n\)
(number of As in Sample of Bs \(= m = n)\)
Prior Ratio K
\(\downarrow\)
400 800 1600 3200
1 0.9822 0.9997 1.0000 1.0000
2 0.9651 0.9994 1.0000 1.0000
5 0.9170 0.9984 1.0000 1.0000
10 0.8468 0.9968 1.0000 1.0000
100 0.3560 0.9691 1.0000 1.0000
1,000 0.0524 0.7581 0.9999 1.0000
10,000 0.0055 0.2386 0.9990 1.0000
100,000 0.0006 0.0304 0.9898 1.0000
1,000,000 0.0001 0.0031 0.9068 1.0000
10,000,000 0.0000 0.0003 0.4931 1.0000
\[ P_{\alpha}\left[\begin{aligned} & F[A,B]\gt.99 \\ & \begin{split} {} \pmid b & \cdot F[A,S]=1 \\ & \cdot \Rnd[S,B,A] \\ & \cdot \Size[S]=n \end{split} \end{aligned}\right] \ge p, \]

for a range of Sample-Sizes n (from 400 to 3200), when the prior probability of any specific frequency hypothesis outside the region between .99 and 1 is no more than K times more than the lowest prior probability for any specific frequency hypothesis inside of the region between .99 and 1.

(All probabilities with entries ‘1.0000’ in this table and the next actually have values slightly less than one, but nearly equal 1.0000 to four significant decimal places.)

To see what the table tells us, consider the third to last row. It represents what happens when a vagueness or diversity set contains at least some support functions that assign prior probabilities (i.e., prior plausibilities) nearly one hundred thousand times higher to some hypotheses asserting frequencies not between .99 and 1 than it assigns to hypotheses asserting frequencies between .99 and 1. The table shows that even in such cases, a random sample of 1600 black ravens will, nevertheless, pull the posterior plausibility level that “the true frequency is above .99” to a value above .9898, for every support function in the set. And if the vagueness or diversity set contains support functions that assign even more extreme priors, say, priors that are nearly ten million times higher for some hypotheses asserting frequencies below .99 than for hypotheses within .99 of 1 (the table’s last row), this poses no great problem for convergence-to-agreement. A random sample of 3200 black ravens will yield posterior probabilities (i.e., posterior plausibilities) indistinguishable from 1 for the claim that “more than 99% of all ravens are black”.

Strong support can be gotten for a narrower range of hypotheses about the percentage of black birds among the ravens, provided that the sample size is increased enough. We’ll return to this in a later subsection.

Now consider the second example of an enumerative induction provided at the beginning of this article, involving the poll about the presidential preferences of voters. The posterior probabilities for this example follow a pattern similar to that of the first example. Let ‘B’ represent the class of all registered voters on February 20, 2004, and let ‘A’ represent those who prefer Kerry to Bush. In sample S (randomly drawn from B with respect to A) consisting of 400 voters, 248 report preference for Kerry over Bush—i.e., \(F[A,B] = 248/400 = .62\). Suppose, as seems reasonable, that none of the support functions in the vagueness or diversity set under consideration rates the hypotheses ‘\(F[A,B] = r\)’ for values of r outside the interval \(.62\pm.05\) as more initially plausible than they rate alternative frequency hypotheses having values of r inside this interval. That is, suppose, for each \(P_{\alpha}\) under consideration, the prior probabilities \(P_{\alpha}[F[A,B] = s \pmid b]\) when s is not within \(.62\pm.05\) is never more than \(K = 1\) times as great as the prior probabilities \(P_{\alpha}[F[A,B] = r \pmid b]\) for hypotheses having r within \(.62\pm.05\). Then, the theorem yields the following lower bound on the posterior plausibility ratings, for all \(P_{\alpha}\) in the vagueness or diversity set under consideration:

\[ P_{\alpha}\left[\begin{aligned} & .57 \lt F[A,B] \lt .67 \\ & \begin{split} {} \pmid b & \cdot F[A,S] =.62 \\ & \cdot \Rnd[S,B,A] \\ & \cdot \Size[S] =400 \end{split} \end{aligned} \right] \ge .9614. \]

The following table gives similar results for other sample sizes, and for upper bounds on ratios of prior probabilities that may be much larger than 1. In addition, this table shows what happens when we tighten up the interval around the frequency hypotheses being supported to \(.62\pm.025\)—i.e., it shows the bounds p on support for the hypothesis \(.595 \lt F[A,B] \lt .645\) as well:

Table 2: Values of lower bound p on the posterior probability

\(m/n = .62\) \(F[A,B] =\)
\(m/n \pm q\)
Sample-Size \(= n\)
(number of As in Sample of Bs \(= m\):
where \(m/n = .62\))
Prior Ratio K
\(\downarrow\)
\(q = .05\)
or .025
400
(248)
800
(496)
1600
(992)
3200
(1984)
6400
(3968)
12800
(7936)
1 \(.05 \rightarrow\)
\(.025 \rightarrow\)
0.9614
0.6982
0.9965
0.8554
1.0000
0.9608
1.0000
0.9964
1.0000
1.0000
1.0000
1.0000
2 \(.05 \rightarrow\)
\(.025 \rightarrow\)
0.9256
0.5364
0.9930
0.7474
0.9999
0.9246
1.0000
0.9929
1.0000
0.9999
1.0000
1.0000
5 \(.05 \rightarrow\)
\(.025 \rightarrow\)
0.8327
0.3163
0.9827
0.5420
0.9998
0.8306
1.0000
0.9825
1.0000
0.9998
1.0000
1.0000
10 \(.05 \rightarrow\)
\(.025 \rightarrow\)
0.7133
0.1879
0.9661
0.3717
0.9996
0.7103
1.0000
0.9656
1.0000
0.9996
1.0000
1.0000
100 \(.05 \rightarrow\)
\(.025 \rightarrow\)
0.1992
0.0226
0.7402
0.0559
0.9963
0.1969
1.0000
0.7371
1.0000
0.9962
1.0000
1.0000
1,000 \(.05 \rightarrow\)
\(.025 \rightarrow\)
0.0243
0.0023
0.2217
0.0059
0.9639
0.0239
1.0000
0.2190
1.0000
0.9637
1.0000
1.0000
10,000 \(.05 \rightarrow\)
\(.025 \rightarrow\)
0.0025
0.0002
0.0277
0.0006
0.7277
0.0024
0.9999
0.0273
1.0000
0.7261
1.0000
0.9999
100,000 \(.05 \rightarrow\)
\(.025 \rightarrow\)
0.0002
0.0000
0.0028
0.0001
0.2109
0.0002
0.9994
0.0028
1.0000
0.2096
1.0000
0.9994
1,000,000 \(.05 \rightarrow\)
\(.025 \rightarrow\)
0.0000
0.0000
0.0003
0.0000
0.0260
0.0000
0.9940
0.0003
1.0000
0.0258
1.0000
0.9943
10,000,000 \(.05 \rightarrow\)
\(.025 \rightarrow\)
0.0000
0.0000
0.0000
0.0000
0.0027
0.0000
0.9433
0.0000
1.0000
0.0026
1.0000
0.9457
\[ P_{\alpha} \left[\begin{aligned} & .62-q \lt F[A,B] \lt .62+q \\ & \begin{split} {} \pmid F[A,S] = .62 & \cdot \Rnd[S,B,A] \\ & \cdot \Size[S] = n \end{split} \end{aligned}\right] \ge p, \]

for two values of q (.05 and .025) and a range of Sample-Sizes n (from 400 to 12800), when the prior probability of any specific frequency hypothesis outside of \(.62 \pm q\) is no more than K times more than the lowest prior probability for any specific frequency hypothesis inside of \(.62 \pm q\).

Notice that even if the vagueness or diversity set includes prior plausibilities nearly ten million times higher for hypotheses asserting frequency values outside of \(.62\pm.025\) than for hypotheses asserting frequencies within \(.62\pm.025\), a random sample of 12800 registered voters will, nevertheless, bring about a posterior plausibility value greater than .9457 for the claim that “the true frequency of preference for Kerry over Bush among all registered voters is within \(.62\pm.025\)”, for all support functions \(P_{\alpha}\) in the set.

2. Convergence to the Truth

The Frequency Estimation Theorem is a Bayesian Convergence-to-Agreement result. It does not, on its own, show that the Criterion of Adequacy (CoA) is satisfied. The theorem shows, for enumerative inductions, that as evidence accumulates, diverse support functions will come to near agreement on high posterior support strengths for those hypotheses expressing population frequencies near the sample frequency. But, it does not show that the true hypothesis is among them—it does not show that the sample frequency is near the true population frequency. So, it does not show that these converging support functions converge on strong support for the true hypothesis, as a CoA result is supposed to do.

However, there is such a CoA result close at hand. It is a Weak Law of Large Numbers result that establishes that each frequency hypothesis of form ‘\(F[A,B] = r\)’ implies, via direct inference likelihoods, that randomly selected sample data is highly likely to result in sample frequencies very close to the value r that it claims to be the true frequency. Of course each frequency hypothesis says that the sample frequency will be near its own frequency value; but only the true hypothesis says this truthfully. Add this result to the previous theorem and we get that, for large sample sizes, it is very likely that a sample frequency will occur that yields a very high degree of support for the true hypothesis. Thus the CoA is satisfied.

Here is the needed result.

Theorem: Weak Law of Large Numbers for Enumerative Inductions.
Let r be any frequency between 0 and 1.

For \(r = 0\),

\[ P\left[\begin{aligned} & F[A,S] =0 \\ & \begin{split} {} \pmid F[A,B] =0 & \cdot \Rnd[S,B,A] \\ & \cdot \Size[S]=n \end{split} \end{aligned} \right] = 1. \]

For \(r = 1\),

\[ P\left[\begin{aligned} & F[A,S] =1 \\ & \begin{split} {} \pmid F[A,B] =1 & \cdot \Rnd[S,B,A] \\ & \cdot \Size[S] =n \end{split} \end{aligned} \right] = 1. \]

For \(0 \lt r \lt 1\), let q be any real number such that r is in the region,

\[0 \lt (r-q) \lt r \lt (r+q) \lt 1.\]

Given a specific q (which identifies a specific small region of interest around r), for each given positive integer n that’s large enough to permit it, we define associated non-negative integers v and u such that \(v \lt u\), where by definition:

v is the non-negative integer for which \(v/n\) is the smallest fraction greater than \((r-q)\), and

u is the non-negative integer for which \(u/n\) is the largest fraction less than \((r+q)\).

Then,

\[ \begin{align} P&\left[\begin{aligned} & r-q \lt F[A,S] \lt r+q \\ & \begin{split} {} \pmid F[A,B] =r & \cdot \Rnd[S,B,A] \\ & \cdot \Size[S] =n \end{split} \end{aligned} \right] \\ & = \sum^{u}_{m=v} \frac{n!}{m! \times(n-m)!} \times r^m (1-r)^{n-m} \\ & \approx 1 - 2 \times \Phi\left[\frac{-q}{((r\times(1-r))/n)^{\tfrac{1}{2}}}\right] \\ &\ge 1 - 2 \times \Phi\left[-2\times q\times n^{\frac{1}{2}}\right], \end{align} \]

which goes to 1 quickly as n increases.

Here \(\Phi[x]\) is the area under the Standard Normal Distribution up to point x. The first equality is a version of the binomial theorem. The approximation of the binomial formula by the normal distribution is guaranteed by the Central Limit Theorem. This approximation is very close for n near 20, and gets extremely close as n gets larger.

Notice that the degree of support probability in this theorem is a direct inference likelihood—all support functions should agree on these values.[23]

This Weak Law result together with the Simple Estimation Theorem yields the promised CoA result: for large sample sizes, it is very likely that a sample frequency will occur that has a value very near the true frequency; and whenever such a sample frequency does occur, it yields a very high degree of support for the true frequency hypothesis.

This result only applies to enumerative inductions. In the next section of the main article we establish a CoA result that applies much more generally. It applies to the inductive support of hypotheses in any context where competing hypotheses are empirically distinct enough to disagree, at least a little, on the likelihoods of possible evidential outcomes.

3. Tighter Bounds on the Margin of Error

If we want strong support for hypotheses claiming more than 99.9% of all ravens are black, the following extension of Table 1 applies.

Table 3: Values of lower bound p on the posterior probability

\(m/n = 1\)
\(F[A,B] \gt .999\)
Sample-Size \(= n\)
(number of As in Sample of Bs \(= m = n)\)
Prior Ratio: K
\(\downarrow\)
400 800 1600 3200 6400 12800 25600
1 0.3305 0.5513 0.7985 0.9593 0.9983 1.0000 1.0000
2 0.1980 0.3805 0.6645 0.9219 0.9967 1.0000 1.0000
5 0.0899 0.1973 0.4421 0.8252 0.9918 1.0000 1.0000
10 0.0470 0.1094 0.2838 0.7023 0.9837 1.0000 1.0000
100 0.0049 0.0121 0.0381 0.1909 0.8578 0.9997 1.0000
1,000 0.0005 0.0012 0.0039 0.0231 0.3763 0.9973 1.0000
10,000 0.0000 0.0001 0.0004 0.0024 0.0569 0.9733 1.0000
100,000 0.0000 0.0000 0.0000 0.0002 0.0060 0.7849 1.0000
1,000,000 0.0000 0.0000 0.0000 0.0000 0.0006 0.2674 1.0000
10,000,000 0.0000 0.0000 0.0000 0.0000 0.0001 0.0352 0.9999
\[ P_{\alpha}\left[\begin{aligned} & F[A,B] \gt .999 \\ & \begin{split} {} \pmid b & \cdot F[A,S] =1 \\ & \cdot \Rnd[S,B,A] \\ & \cdot \Size[S] =n \end{split} \end{aligned}\right] \ge p, \]

for a range of Sample-Sizes n (from 400 to 25600), when the prior probability of any specific frequency hypothesis outside the region between .999 and 1 is no more than K times more than the lowest prior probability for any specific frequency hypothesis inside of the region between .999 and 1.

The lower right corner of the table shows that even when the vagueness or diversity sets include support functions with prior plausibilities up to ten million times higher for hypotheses asserting frequency values below .999 than for hypotheses making frequency claims between .999 and 1, a sample of 25600 black ravens will, nevertheless, pull the posterior plausibility above .9999 that “the true frequency is over .999” for every support function in the set.

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Copyright © 2018 by
James Hawthorne <hawthorne@ou.edu>

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