#### Supplement to Inductive Logic

## Likelihood Ratios, Likelihoodism, and the Law of Likelihood

The versions of Bayes’ Theorem provided by Equations 9–11 show that for probabilistic inductive logic the influence of empirical evidence (of the ind for which hypotheses express likelihoods) is completely captured by the ratios of likelihoods,

\[\frac{P[e^n \pmid h_{j}\cdot b\cdot c^{n}]}{P[e^n \pmid h_{i}\cdot b\cdot c^{n}]}.\]The evidence \((c^{n}\cdot e^{n})\) influences the posterior probabilities in no other way. So, the following “Law” is a consequence of the logic of probabilistic support functions.

**General Law of Likelihood**:

Given any pair of incompatible hypotheses \(h_i\) and \(h_j\),
whenever the likelihoods \(P_{\alpha}[e^n \pmid h_{j}\cdot b\cdot
c^{n}]\) and \(P_{\alpha}[e^n \pmid h_{i} \cdot b\cdot c^{n}]\) are
defined, the evidence \((c^{n}\cdot e^{n})\) supports \(h_i\) over
\(h_j\), given *b*, *if and only if*

The ratio of likelihoods

\[\frac{P_{\alpha}[e^n \pmid h_{i}\cdot b\cdot c^{n}]}{P_{\alpha}[e^n \pmid h_{j}\cdot b\cdot c^{n}]}\]
measures the *strength of the evidence* for \(h_i\) over
\(h_j\) given *b*.

Two features of this law require some explanation. As stated, the
**General Law of Likelihood** does not presuppose that
likelihoods of form \(P_{\alpha}[e^n \pmid h_{j}\cdot b\cdot c^{n}]\)
and \(P_{\alpha}[e^n \pmid h_{i}\cdot b\cdot c^{n}]\) are always
*defined*. This qualification is introduced to accommodate a
conception of evidential support called *Likelihoodism*, which
is especially influential among statisticians. Also, the likelihoods
in the law are expressed with the subscript \(\alpha\) attached to
indicate that the law holds for each *inductive support
function* \(P_{\alpha}\), even when the values of the likelihoods
are not objective or agreed on by all agents in a given scientific
community. These two features of the law are closely related, as we
will see.

Each *probabilistic support function* satisfies the axioms in
Section 2.
According to these axioms the conditional probability of one sentence
on another is always defined. So, in the context of the *inductive
logic of support functions* the likelihoods are always defined,
and the qualifying clause about this in the **General Law of
Likelihood** is automatically satisfied. For *inductive
support functions*, all of the versions of Bayes’ theorem
(Equations 8–11) continue to hold even when the likelihoods are
not objective or intersubjectively agreed on by the scientific
community. In many scientific contexts there will be general agreement
on the values of likelihoods; but whenever such agreement fails the
subscripts \(\alpha , \beta\), etc. must remain attached to the
support function likelihoods to indicate this. Even so, the
**General Law of Likelihood** continues to hold for each
support function.

There is a view, or family of views, called *likelihoodism*
that maintains that the inductive logician or statistician should only
be concerned with whether the evidence provides *increased* or
*decreased support* for one hypothesis over another, and only
in cases where this evaluation is based on the ratios of
*completely objective* likelihoods. (Prominent likelihoodists
include Edwards (1972) and Royall (1997); also see Forster & Sober
(2004) and Fitelson (2007).) When the likelihoods involved are
objective, the ratios

provide a *pure, objective measure* of how strongly the
evidence supports \(h_i\) as compared to \(h_j\), a measure that is
“untainted” by prior plausibility considerations.
According to likelihoodists, only this kind of *pure measure*
is scientifically appropriate for the assessment of how evidence
impacts hypotheses. (It should be noted that the *classical school
of statistics*, associated with R.A. Fisher (1922) and with Neyman
and Pearson (1967), reject both the Bayesian logic of evidential
support and the claim about the nature of evidential support expressed
by the **General Law of Likelihood**.)

Likelihoodists maintain that it is not appropriate for statisticians
to incorporate assumptions about prior probabilities of hypotheses
into the assessment of evidential support. It is not their place to
compute *recommended values* of posterior probabilities for the
scientific community. When the results of experiments are made public,
say in scientific journals, only objective likelihoods should be
reported. The evaluation of the impact of objective likelihoods on
agents’ posterior probabilities depends on each agent’s
individual *subjective* prior probability, which represents
plausibility considerations that have nothing to do with the evidence.
So, likelihoodists suggest, posterior probabilities should be left for
individuals to compute, if they desire to do so.

The conditional probabilities between most pairs of sentences fail to
be objectively defined in a way that suits likelihoodists. So, for
likelihoodists, the general *logic of evidential support
functions* (captured by the axioms in
Section 2
and the forms of Bayes’ theorem discussed above) cannot
represent an *objective logic* of evidential support for
hypotheses. Because they eschew the logic of support functions,
likelihoodist do not have Bayes’ theorem available, and so
cannot derive the **Law of Likelihood** from it. Rather,
they must state the **Law of Likelihood** as an
*axiom* of their particular version of inductive logic, an
axiom that applies only when the likelihoods have
*well-defined* objective values.

*Likelihoodists* tend to have a very strict conception of what
it takes for likelihoods to be *well-defined*. They consider a
likelihood to be *well-defined* only when it is (what we
referred to earlier as) a *direct inference likelihood*—
i.e., only when either, (1) the hypothesis (together with background
and experimental conditions) logically entails the data, or (2) the
hypothesis (together with background) logically entails an explicit
*simple statistical hypothesis* that (together with
experimental conditions) specifies precise statistical probabilities
for each of the events that make up the evidence.

*Likelihoodists* contrast *simple statistical
hypotheses* with *composite statistical hypotheses*, which
only entail vague, or imprecise, or *directional* claims about
the statistical probabilities of evidential events. Whereas a
*simple statistical hypothesis* might say, for example,
“the chance of *heads* on tosses of the coin is precisely
.65”, a composite statistical hypothesis might say, “the
chance of *heads* on tosses is either .65 or .75”, or it
may be a *directional hypothesis* that says, “the chance
of *heads* on tosses is greater than .65”.
*Likelihoodists* maintain that *composite hypotheses*
are not an appropriate basis for well-defined likelihoods. Such
hypotheses represent a kind of disjunction of simple statistical
hypotheses. The *direction hypothesis*, for instance, is
essentially a disjunction of the various *simple statistical
hypotheses* that assign specific values above .65 to the chances
of heads on tosses. Likelihoods based on such hypotheses are not
*appropriately objective* by the lights of the
*likelihoodist* because they must in effect depend on factors
that represent the degree to which the *composite hypothesis*
supports each of the *simple statistical hypotheses* that it
encompasses; and *likelihoodists* consider such factors *too
subjective* to be permitted in a logic that should permit only
objective
likelihoods.^{[24]}

Taking all of this into account, the version of the **Law of
Likelihood** appropriate to *likelihoodists* may be
stated as follows.

**Special Law of Likelihood**:

Given a pair of incompatible hypotheses \(h_i\) and \(h_j\) that imply
simple statistical models regarding outcomes \(e^n\) given \((b\cdot
c^n)\), the likelihoods \(P[e^n \pmid h_{j}\cdot b\cdot c^{n}]\) and
\(P[e^n \pmid h_{i}\cdot b\cdot c^{n}]\) are well defined. For such
likelihoods, the evidence \((c^{n}\cdot e^{n})\) supports \(h_i\) over
\(h_j\), given *b*, *if and only if*

the ratio of likelihoods

\[\frac{P[e^n \pmid h_{i}\cdot b\cdot c^{n}]}{P[e^n \pmid h_{j}\cdot b\cdot c^{n}]} \]
measures the *strength of the evidence* for \(h_i\) over
\(h_j\) given *b*.

Notice that when either version of the **Law of
Likelihood** holds, the absolute size of a likelihood is
irrelevant to the strength of the evidence. All that matters is the
relative size of the likelihoods for one hypothesis as compared to
another. That is, let \(c_1\) and \(c_2\) be the conditions for two
distinct experiments having outcomes \(e_1\) and \(e_2\),
respectively. Suppose that \(e_1\) is 1000 times more likely on
\(h_i\) (given \(b\cdot c_1)\) than is \(e_2\) on \(h_i\) (given
\(b\cdot c_2)\); and suppose that \(e_1\) is also 1000 times more
likely on \(h_j\) (given \(b\cdot c_1)\) than is \(e_2\) on \(h_j\)
(given \(b\cdot c_2)\)—i.e., suppose that

and

\[P_{\alpha}[e_1 \pmid h_j\cdot b\cdot c_1] = 1000 \times P_{\alpha}[e_2 \pmid h_j\cdot b\cdot c_2].\]
Which piece of evidence, \((c_1\cdot e_1)\) or \((c_2\cdot e_2)\), is
stronger evidence with regard to the comparison of \(h_i\) to \(h_j\)?
The **Law of Likelihood** implies both are equally
strong. All that matters evidentially are the ratios of the
likelihoods, and they are the same:

Thus, the **General Law of Likelihood** implies the
following principle.

**General Likelihood Principle**:

Suppose two different experiments or observations (or two sequences of
them) \(c_1\) and \(c_2\) produce outcomes \(e_1\) and \(e_2\),
respectively. Let \(\{ h_1, h_2 , \ldots \}\) be any set of
alternative hypotheses. If there is a constant *K* such that for
each hypothesis \(h_j\) from the set,

then the *evidential import* of \((c_1\cdot e_1)\) for
distinguishing among hypotheses in the set (given *b*) is
precisely the same as the *evidential import* of \((c_2\cdot
e_2)\).

Similarly, the **Special Law of Likelihood** implies a
corresponding **Special Likelihood Principle** that
applies only to hypotheses that express simple statistical
models.^{[25]}

Throughout the remainder of this article we will not assume that
likelihoods must be based on simple statistical hypotheses, as
*likelihoodist* would have them. However, most of what will be
said about likelihoods, especially the convergence result in
Section 4,
applies to *likelihoodist* likelihoods as well. We will,
however, continue to suppose that likelihoods are *objective*
in the sense that all members of the scientific community agree on
their numerical values. In
Section 5
we will see how even this supposition may be relaxed in scientific
contexts where completely objective values for likelihoods are not
realistically available.