Logic and Ontology
A number of important philosophical problems are at the intersection of logic and ontology. Both logic and ontology are diverse fields within philosophy and, partly because of this, there is not one single philosophical problem about the relation between them. In this survey article we will first discuss what different philosophical projects are carried out under the headings of “logic” and “ontology” and then we will look at several areas where logic and ontology overlap.
- 1. Introduction
- 2. Logic
- 3. Ontology
- 4. Areas of overlap
- 4.1 Formal languages and ontological commitment. (L1) meets (O1) and (O4)
- 4.2 Is logic neutral about what there is? (L2) meets (O2)
- 4.3 Formal ontology. (L1) meets (O2) and (O3)
- 4.4 Carnap’s rejection of ontology. (L1) meets (O4) and (the end of?) (O2)
- 4.5 The fundamental language. (L1) meets (O4) and (the new beginning of?) (O2)
- 4.6 The structure of thought and the structure of reality. (L4) meets (O3)
- 5. Conclusion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Both logic and ontology are important areas of philosophy covering large, diverse, and active research projects. These two areas overlap from time to time and problems or questions arise that concern both. This survey article is intended to discuss some of these areas of overlap. In particular, there is no single philosophical problem of the intersection of logic and ontology. This is partly so because the philosophical disciplines of logic and of ontology are themselves quite diverse and there is thus the possibility of many points of intersection. In the following we will first distinguish different philosophical projects that are covered under the terms ‘logic’ and ‘ontology’. We will then discuss a selection of problems that arise in the different areas of contact.
‘Logic’ and ‘ontology’ are big words in philosophy, and different philosophers have used them in different ways. Depending on what these philosophers mean by these words, and, of course, depending on the philosopher’s views, sometimes there are striking claims to be found in the philosophical literature about their relationship. But when Hegel, for example, uses ‘logic’, or better ‘Logik’, he means something quite different than what is meant by the word in much of the contemporary philosophical scene. We will not be able to survey the history of the different conceptions of logic, or of ontology. Instead we will look at areas of overlap that are presently actively debated.
There are several quite different topics put under the heading of ‘logic’ in contemporary philosophy, and it is controversial how they relate to each other.
On the one hand, logic is the study of certain mathematical properties of artificial, formal languages. It is concerned with such languages as the first or second order predicate calculus, modal logics, the lambda calculus, categorial grammars, and so forth. The mathematical properties of these languages are studied in such subdisciplines of logic as proof theory or model theory. Much of the work done in this area these days is mathematically difficult, and it might not be immediately obvious why this is considered a part of philosophy. However, logic in this sense arose from within philosophy and the foundations of mathematics, and it is often seen as being of philosophical relevance, in particular in the philosophy of mathematics, and in its application to natural languages.
A second discipline, also called ‘logic’, deals with certain valid inferences and good reasoning based on them. It does not, however, cover good reasoning as a whole. That is the job of the theory of rationality. Rather it deals with inferences whose validity can be traced back to the formal features of the representations that are involved in that inference, be they linguistic, mental, or other representations. Some patterns of inference can be seen as valid by merely looking at the form of the representations that are involved in this inference. Such a conception of logic thus distinguishes validity from formal validity. An inference is valid just in case the truth of the premises guarantees the truth of the conclusion, or alternatively if the premises are true then the conclusion has to be true as well, or again alternatively, if it can’t be that the premises are true but the conclusion is false. Validity so understood is simply a modal notion, a notion about what has to be the case. Others might think of validity as involving a more fine grained hyperintensional notion, but in any case, validity so understood is not what logic is concerned with. Logic is concerned with formal validity, which can be understood as follows. In a system of representations, for example a language, it can be that some inferences are always valid as long as the representational or semantic features of certain parts of the representations are kept fixed, even if we abstract from or ignore the representational features of the other parts of the representations. So, for example, as long as we stick to English, and we keep the meanings of certain words like “some” and “all” fixed, certain patterns of inference, like some of Aristotle’s syllogisms, are valid no matter what the meaning of the other words in the syllogism. To call an inference formally valid is to assume that certain words have their meaning fixed, that we are within a fixed set of representations, and that we can ignore the meaning of the other words. The words that are kept fixed are the logical vocabulary, or logical constants, the others are the non-logical vocabulary. And when an inference is formally valid then the conclusion logically follows from the premises. This could be generalized for representations that are not linguistic, like graphic representations, though it would require a bit more work to do so. Logic is the study of such inferences, and certain related concepts and topics, like formal invalidity, proof, consistency, and so on. The central notion of logic in this sense is the notion of logical consequence. How this notion should be understood more precisely is presently widely debated, and a survey of these debates can be found in the entry on logical consequence.
A third conception of logic takes logic to be the study of special truths, or facts: the logical truths, or facts. In this sense logic could be understood as a science that aims to describe certain truths or facts, just as other sciences aim to describe other truths. The logical truths could be understood as the most general truths, ones that are contained in any other body of truths that any other science aims to describe. In this sense logic is different from biology, since it is more general, but it is also similar to biology in that it is a science that aims to capture a certain body of truths. This way of looking at logic is often associated with Frege.
This conception of logic can, however, be closely associated with the one that takes logic to be fundamentally about certain kinds of inferences and about logical consequence. A logical truth, on such an understanding, is simply one that is expressed by a representation which logically follows from no assumptions, i.e. which logically follows from an empty set of premises. Alternatively, a logical truth is one whose truth is guaranteed as long as the meaning of the logical constants is fixed, no matter what the meanings of the other parts in a representation are.
And there are other notions of ‘logic’ as well. One of them is historically prominent, but not very widely represented in the contemporary debate. We will briefly discuss it here nonetheless. According to this conception of logic, it is the study of the most general features of thoughts or judgments, or the form of thoughts or judgments. Logic thus understood will for example be concerned with the occurrence of subject and predicate structure that many judgments exhibit, and with other such general features of judgments. It will mostly be concerned with thoughts, and not directly with linguistic representations, though, of course, a proponent of this conception can claim that there is a very close connection between them. To talk about the form of a judgment will involve a subtly different notion of ‘form’ than to talk about the form of a linguistic representation. The form of a linguistic representation, basically, was what was left once we abstract from or ignore the representational features of everything except what we keep fixed, the logical constants. The form of a thought, on the other hand, is often understood as what is left over once we abstract from its content, that is, what it is about. We will briefly pursue the question below how these notions of form are related to each other. This conception of logic is associated with Kant. Kant distinguished different notions of logic (for example transcendental logic, general logic, etc.), but we won’t be able to discuss these here. See the entry on Immanuel Kant for more.
One important philosophical aspect of logic, at least in the senses that deal with logical consequence and the forms of judgements, is its normativity. Logic seems to give us a guide how we ought to reason, and how we ought to draw inferences from one representation to another. But it is not at all clear what guide it gives us, and how we should understand more precisely what norms logic puts on our reasoning. For example, logic does not put us under the norm “If you believe \(A\) and you believe if \(A\) then \(B\) then you ought to believe \(B\).” After all, it might be that I should not believe \(A\) and if \(A\) then \(B\) in the first place. So, in particular I shouldn’t believe \(B\). A reductio ad absurdum is a form of argument that illustrates this. If I believe A and if A then \(0=1\), then this should lead me to abandon my belief in A, not lead to a belief that \(0=1\). The consequences of my beliefs can lead me to abandon them. Still, if I have some reasons for my beliefs then I have at least some prima facie, but not necessarily conclusive, reason to hold the consequences of those beliefs. Logic might thus tell us at least this much, though: whenever I have some reason to believe \(A\) and if \(A\) then \(B\), then I have a prima facie reason to believe \(B\). See (Harman 1986) for the view that logic has no distinctive normative role, and (Field 2009) for a nice critical discussion of Harman’s view and an argument why logic should be tied to norms of rationality.
And, of course, logic does not tell us how we ought to reason or infer in all particular cases. Logic does not deal with the particular cases, but only with the most generally valid forms of reasoning or inference, ones that are valid no matter what one reasons about. In this sense logic is often seen to be topic neutral. It applies no matter what one is thinking or reasoning about. And this neutrality, or complete generality of logic, together with its normativity, is often put as “logic is about how we ought to think if we are to think at all” or “logic is the science of the laws that we ought to follow in our thinking no matter what we think about”. There are well known philosophical puzzles about normativity, and these apply to logic as well if it is normative. One is why it is that thinkers are under such norms. After all, why shouldn’t I think the way I prefer to think, without there being some norm that governs my thinking, whether I like it or not? Why is there an “ought” that comes with thinking as such, even if I don’t want to think that way? One idea to answer this is to employ the notion of a ‘constitutive aim of belief’, the idea that belief as such aims at something: the truth. If so then maybe one could argue that by having beliefs I am under the norm that I ought to have true ones. And if one holds that one of the crucial features of logically valid inferences is that they preserve truth then one could argue that the logical laws are norms that apply to those who have beliefs. See (Velleman 2000) for more on the aim of belief. The normativity of logic will not be central for our discussion to follow, but the topic neutrality and generality will be.
Overall, we can thus distinguish four notions of logic:
- (L1) the study of artificial formal languages
- (L2) the study of formally valid inferences and logical consequence
- (L3) the study of logical truths
- (L4) the study of the general features, or form, of judgements
There is, of course, a question how these different conceptions of logic relate to each other. The details of their relationship invite many hard questions, but we should briefly look at this nonetheless.
How (L1) and (L2) relate to each other is subject of controversy. One straightforward, though controversial view, is the following. For any given system of representations, like sentences in a natural language, there is one and only one set of logical constants. Thus there will be one formal language that best models what logically valid inferences there are among these natural representations. This formal language will have a logical vocabulary that captures the inferential properties of the logical constants, and that models all other relevant features of the natural system of representation with non-logical vocabulary. One especially important system of representations is our natural language. Thus (L1) is the study of formal languages of which one is distinguished, and this one distinguished language nicely represents the fixed and non-fixed features of our natural language, through its logical and non-logical vocabulary. And validity in that formal language, a technical notion defined in the appropriate way for that formal language, nicely models logical validity or logical consequence in our natural language system of representations. Or so this view of the relationship between (L1) and (L2) holds.
This view of the relationship between (L1) and (L2), however, assumes that there is one and only one set of logical constants for each system of representations. A contrary view holds that which expressions are treated as logical constants is a matter of choice, with different choices serving different purposes. If we fix, say, ‘believes’ and ‘knows’ then we can see that ‘\(x\) believes that \(p\)’ is implied by ‘\(x\) knows that \(p\)’ (given widely held views about knowledge and belief). This does not mean that ‘believes’ is a logical constant in an absolute sense. Given other interests, other expressions can be treated as logical. According to this conception, different formal languages will be useful in modeling the inferences that are formally valid given different set of ‘logical constants’ or expressions whose meaning is kept fixed.
This debate thus concerns whether there is one and only one set of logical constants for a system of representations, and if so, which ones are the logical ones. We will not get into this debate here, but there is quite a large literature on what logical constants are, and how logic can be demarcated. For a general discussion and further references, see for example (Engel 1991). Some of the classic papers in this debate include (Hacking 1979), who defends a proof-theoretic way of distinguishing logical constants from other expressions. The leading idea here is that logical constants are those whose meaning can be given by proof-theoretic introduction and elimination rules. On the other hand, (Mauthner 1946), (van Benthem 1986), (van Benthem 1989), and (Tarski 1986) defend semantic ways to mark that difference. The leading idea here is that logical notions are ‘permutation invariant’. Since logic is supposed to be completely general and neutral with respect to what the representations are about, it should not matter to logic if we switch around the objects that these representations are about. So, logical notions are those that are invariant under permutations of the domain. (van Benthem 1989) gives a general formulation to this idea. See the entry on logical constants for more.
The relationship between (L2) and (L3) was briefly addressed above. They seem to be closely related because a logical truth can be understood as one that follows from an empty set of premises, and A being a logical consequence of B can be understood as it being a logical truth that if A then B. There are some questions to be ironed out about how this is supposed to go more precisely. How should we understand cases of logical consequence from infinitely many premises? Are logical truths all finitely statable? But for our purposes we can say that they are rather closely related.
The relationship between (L2) and (L4) on the other hand raises some
questions. For one, of course, there is an issue about what it means
to say that judgments have a form, and whether they do in the relevant
sense. But one way in which this question could be understood directly
ties it to (L2). If thoughts, and thus judgments, are realized by
minds having a certain relation to mental representations, and if
these representations are themselves structured like a language, with
a “syntax” and a “semantics” (properly
understood), then the form of a judgment could be understood just like
the form of a sentence. Such a view of thoughts is commonly called the
Language of Thought hypothesis, see (Fodor, 1975), and if it is
correct then in the language of thought there might be logical and
non-logical vocabulary. The form of a judgment could be understood
along the lines we understood the form of a linguistic representation
when we talked about formally valid inferences. Thus the relationship
between (L2) and (L4) is rather direct. On both conceptions of logic
we deal with logical constants, the difference is that one deals with
a system of mental representations, the other with a system of
linguistic representations. Both, presumably, would deal with
corresponding sets of logical constants. Even though mental and
linguistic representations form different sets of representations,
since they are closely connected with each other, for every logical
constant in one of these sets of representations there will be another
one of the corresponding syntactic type and with the same content, or
at least a corresponding inferential role.
But this conception of their relationship assumes that the “general features of judgments” or “forms of judgment” which (L4) is concerned with deal with something like the logical constants in the language of thought. Here the judgment as a mental act is assumed to operate on a mental representation that itself has syntactic structure. And the form of the judgment was understood as the form of the representation that represents the content of the judgment, whereby the form of the representation was understood along the lines of (L2), involving logical constants. But what if we can’t understand “form of judgment” or “form of thought” that way? One way this could fail is if the language of thought hypothesis itself fails, and if mental states do not involve representations that have something like a syntactic form. The question then becomes, first how should we understand ‘form of judgement’ more precisely, and secondly, how does logic, as the discipline concerned with forms of judgments in the sense of (L4), relate to (L2)?
One way to answer the first question is to understand “form of judgment” as not being concerned with the representation that might be involved in a judgment, but rather with the content of the judgment, i.e. with what the judgment is representing to be the case. Contents of judgments can be seen as propositions, and these can be understood as entities that are structured, for example Russellian propositions. Such propositions are ordered sets whose members are objects and properties. How such a conception of (L4) relates to (L2) will in part depend on how one thinks of the logical constants in Russellian propositions. If they are higher order properties or functions that are members of these propositions alongside other objects and properties then presumably the logical constants have content. But this seems to be in conflict with an understanding of (L4) as being concerned with the form that is left once we abstract from all content. If would seem that on such an understanding of (L4) one can’t closely associate ‘form of judgment’, understood as what’s left once we abstract from all content of the judgment, with logical constants if the latter have content.
Another way to understand “form” as being concerned with what the judgment is about, rather than the judgment itself, is to think of what it is about, the world, itself as having a form. In this sense we associate “form” neither with the representation that is involved in the judgment, nor with the proposition which is its content, but rather with the world that is judged about. On such a conception the world itself has a form or basic structure. (L4) would be concerned with this structure. How (L4) relates to (L2) is then a somewhat tricky question. One way, again, could be that the logical constants that (L2) is concerned with correspond to the structure of what a representation in which they occur is about, but don’t contribute to the content of that representation. This again seems incompatible with the logical constants themselves having content. So, whether one associates form of judgment with the ‘syntactic’ structure of a representation that is involved in the judgment, or with the content of that representation, or with the structure of what the representation is about, the relationship between (L4) and (L2) will in part depend on whether one thinks the logical constants themselves contribute to content. If they do, and if form is contrasted with content, then a close association seems impossible. If the logical constants don’t have content, then it might be possible.
Finally, the relationship between (L1) and (L4) either comes down to the same as that between (L1) and (L2), if we understand ‘form of thought’ analogous to ‘form of representation’. If not, then it will again depend on how (L4) is understood more precisely.
Thus there are many ways in which (L1), (L2), (L3), and (L4) are connected, and many in which they are quite different.
As a first approximation, ontology is the study of what there is. Some contest this formulation of what ontology is, so it’s only a first approximation. Many classical philosophical problems are problems in ontology: the question whether or not there is a god, or the problem of the existence of universals, etc.. These are all problems in ontology in the sense that they deal with whether or not a certain thing, or more broadly entity, exists. But ontology is usually also taken to encompass problems about the most general features and relations of the entities which do exist. There are also a number of classic philosophical problems that are problems in ontology understood in this way. For example, the problem of how a universal relates to a particular that has it (assuming there are universals and particulars), or the problem of how an event like John eating a cookie relates to the particulars John and the cookie, and the relation of eating, assuming there are events, particulars and relations. These kinds of problems quickly turn into metaphysics more generally, which is the philosophical discipline that encompasses ontology as one of its parts. The borders here are a little fuzzy. But we have at least two parts to the overall philosophical project of ontology, on our preliminary understanding of it: first, say what there is, what exists, what the stuff of reality is made out of, secondly, say what the most general features and relations of these things are.
This way of looking at ontology comes with two sets of problems which leads to the philosophical discipline of ontology being more complex than just answering the above questions. The first set of problems is that it isn’t clear how to approach answering these questions. This leads to the debate about ontological commitment. The second set of problems is that it isn’t so clear what these questions really are. This leads to the philosophical debate about meta-ontology. Lets look at them in turn.
One of the troubles with ontology is that it not only isn’t clear what there is, it also isn’t so clear how to settle questions about what there is, at least not for the kinds of things that have traditionally been of special interest to philosophers: numbers, properties, God, etc. Ontology is thus a philosophical discipline that encompasses besides the study of what there is and the study of the general features of what there is also the study of what is involved in settling questions about what there is in general, especially for the philosophically tricky cases. How we can find out what there is isn’t an easy question to answer. It might seem simple enough for regular objects that we can perceive with our eyes, like my house keys, but how should we decide it for such things as, say, numbers or properties? One first step to making progress on this question is to see if what we believe already rationally settles this question. That is to say, given that we have certain beliefs, do these beliefs already bring with them a rational commitment to an answer to such questions as ‘Are there numbers?’ If our beliefs bring with them a rational commitment to an answer to an ontological question about the existence of certain entities then we can say that we are committed to the existence of these entities. What precisely is required for such a commitment to occur is subject to debate, a debate we will look at momentarily. To find out what one is committed to with a particular set of beliefs, or acceptance of a particular theory of the world, is part of the larger discipline of ontology.
Besides it not being so clear what it is to commit yourself to an answer to an ontological question, it also isn’t so clear what an ontological question really is, and thus what it is that ontology is supposed to accomplish. To figure this out is the task of meta-ontology, which strictly speaking is not part of ontology construed narrowly, but the study of what ontology is. However, like most philosophical disciplines, ontology more broadly construed contains its own meta-study, and thus meta-ontology is part of ontology, more broadly construed. Nonetheless it is helpful to separate it out as a special part of ontology. Many of the philosophically most fundamental questions about ontology really are meta-ontological questions. Meta-ontology has not been too popular in the last couple of decades, partly because one meta-ontological view, the one often associated with Quine, has been accepted as the correct one, but this acceptance has been challenged in recent years in a variety of ways. One motivation for the study of meta-ontology is simply the question of what question ontology aims to answer. Take the case of numbers, for example. What is the question that we should aim to answer in ontology if we want to find out if there are numbers, that is, if reality contains numbers besides whatever else it is made up from? This way of putting it suggest an easy answer: ‘Are there numbers?’ But this question seems like an easy one to answer. An answer to it is implied, it seems, by trivial mathematics, say that the number 7 is less than the number 8. If the latter, then there is a number which is less than 8, namely 7, and thus there is at least one number. Can ontology be that easy? The study of meta-ontology will have to determine, amongst others, if ‘Are there numbers?’ really is the question that the discipline of ontology is supposed to answer, and more generally, what ontology is supposed to do. We will pursue these questions below. As we will see, several philosophers think that ontology is supposed to answer a different question than what there is, but they often disagree on what that question is.
The larger discipline of ontology can thus be seen as having four parts:
- (O1) the study of ontological commitment, i.e. what we or others are committed to,
- (O2) the study of what there is,
- (O3) the study of the most general features of what there is, and how the things there are relate to each other in the metaphysically most general ways,
- (O4) the study of meta-ontology, i.e. saying what task it is that the discipline of ontology should aim to accomplish, if any, how the questions it aims to answer should be understood, and with what methodology they can be answered.
The relationship between these four seems rather straightforward. (O4) will have to say how the other three are supposed to be understood. In particular, it will have to tell us if the question to be answered in (O2) indeed is the question what there is, which was taken above to be only a first approximation for how to state what ontology is supposed to do. Maybe it is supposed to answer the question what is real instead, or what is fundamental, some other question. Whatever one says here will also affect how one should understand (O1). We will at first work with what is the most common way to understand (O2) and (O1), and discuss alternatives in turn. If (O1) has the result that the beliefs we share commit us to a certain kind of entity then this requires us either to accept an answer to a question about what there is in the sense of (O2) or to revise our beliefs. If we accept that there is such an entity in (O2) then this invites questions in (O3) about its nature and the general relations it has to other things we also accept. On the other hand, investigations in (O3) into the nature of entities that we are not committed to and that we have no reason to believe exist would seem like a rather speculative project, though, of course, it could still be fun and interesting.
The debates about logic and ontology overlap at various places. Given the division of ontology into (O1)–(O4), and the division of logic into (L1)–(L4) we can look at several areas of overlap. In the following we will discuss some paradigmatic debates on the relationship between logic and ontology, divided up by areas of overlap.
Suppose we have a set of beliefs, and we wonder what the answer to the ontological question ‘Are there numbers?’ is, assuming (O4) tells us this is the ontological question about numbers. One strategy to see whether our beliefs already commit us to an answer of this question is as follows: first, write out all those beliefs in a public language, like English. This by itself might not seem to help much, since if it wasn’t clear what my beliefs commit me to, why would it help to look at what acceptance of what these sentences say commits me to? But now, secondly, write these sentences in what is often called ‘canonical notation’. Canonical notation can be understood as a formal or semi-formal language that brings out the true underlying structure, or ‘logical form’ of a natural language sentence. In particular, such a canonical notation will make explicit which quantifiers do occur in these sentences, what their scope is, and the like. This is where formal languages come into the picture. After that, and thirdly, look at the variables that are bound by these quantifiers. What values do they have to have in order for these sentences all to be true? If the answer is that the variables have to have numbers as their values, then you are committed to numbers. If not then you aren’t committed to numbers. The latter doesn’t mean that there are no numbers, of course, just as you being committed to them doesn’t mean that there are numbers. But if your beliefs are all true then there have to be numbers, if you are committed to numbers. Or so this strategy goes.
All this might seem a lot of extra work for little. What do we really gain from these ‘canonical notations’ in determining ontological commitment? One attempt to answer this, which partly motivates the above way of doing things, is based on the following consideration: We might wonder why we should think that quantifiers are of great importance for making ontological commitments explicit. After all, if I accept the apparently trivial mathematical fact that there is a number between 6 and 8, does this already commit me to an answer to the ontological question whether there are numbers out there, as part of reality? The above strategy tries to make explicit that and why it in fact does commit me to such an answer. This is so since natural language quantifiers are fully captured by their formal analogues in canonical notation, and the latter make ontological commitments obvious because of their semantics. Such formal quantifiers are given what is called an ‘objectual semantics’. This is to say that a particular quantified statement ‘\(\exists x\,Fx\)’ is true just in case there is an object in the domain of quantification that, when assigned as the value of the variable ‘x’, satisfies the open formula ‘\(Fx\)’. This makes obvious that the truth of a quantified statement is ontologically relevant, and in fact ideally suited to make ontological commitment explicit, since we need entities to assign as the values of the variables. Thus (L1) is tied to (O1). The philosopher most closely associated with this way of determining ontological commitment, and with the meta-ontological view on which it is based, is Quine, in particular his (Quine 1948). See also van (Inwagen 1998) for a presentation sympathetic to Quine.
The above account of ontological commitment has been criticized from a variety of different angles. One criticism focuses on the semantics that is given for quantifiers in the formal language that is used as the canonical notation of the natural language representations of the contents of beliefs. The above, objectual semantics is not the only one that can be given to quantifiers. One widely discussed alternative is the so-called ‘substitutional semantics’. According to it we do not assign entities as values of variables. Rather, a particular quantified statement ‘\(\exists x\,Fx\)’ is true just in case there is a term in the language that when substituted for ‘\(x\)’ in \(‘Fx\rquo\) has a true sentence as its result. Thus, ‘\(\exists x\,Fx\)’ is true just in case there is an instance ‘\(Ft\)’ which is true, for ‘\(t\)’ a term in the language in question, substituted for all (free) occurrences of ‘\(x\)’ in ‘\(Fx\)’. The substitutional semantics for the quantifiers has often been used to argue that there are ontologically innocent uses of quantifiers, and that what quantified statements we accept does not directly reveal ontological commitment. (Gottlieb 1980) provides more details on substitutional quantification, and an attempt to use it in the philosophy of mathematics. Earlier work was done by Ruth Marcus, and is reprinted in (Marcus 1993).
Another objection to the above account of determining ontological commitment goes further and questions the use of a canonical notation, and of formal tools in general. It states that if the ontological question about numbers simply is the question ‘Are there numbers?’ then all that matters for ontological commitment is whether or not what we accept implies ‘There are numbers’. In particular, it is irrelevant what the semantics for quantifiers in a formal language is, in particular, whether it is objectual or substitutional. What ontological commitment comes down to can be determined at the level of ordinary English. Formal tools are of no, or at best limited, importance. Ontological commitment can thus according to this line of thought be formulated simply as follows: you are committed to numbers if what you believe implies that there are numbers. Notwithstanding the debate between the substitutional and objectual semantics, we do not need any formal tools to spell out the semantics of quantifiers. All that matters is that a certain quantified statement ‘There are \(F\)s’ is implied by what we believe for us to be committed to \(F\)s. What does not matter is whether the semantics of the quantifier in “There are \(F\)s” (assuming it contains a quantifier) is objectual or substitutional.
However, even if one agrees that what matters for ontological commitment is whether or not what one believes implies that there are \(F\)s, for a certain kind of thing \(F\), there might still be room for formal tools. First of all, it isn’t clear what implies what. Whether or not a set of statements that express my beliefs imply that there are entities of a certain kind might not be obvious, and might even be controversial. Formal methods can be useful in determining what implies what. On the other hand, even though formal methods can be useful in determining what implies what, it is not clear which formal tools are the right ones for modeling a natural system of representations. It might seem that to determine which are the right formal tools we already need to know what the implicational relations are between the natural representations that we attempt to model, at least in basic cases. This could mean that formal tools are only of limited use for deciding controversial cases of implication.
But then, again, it has been argued that often it is not at all clear which statements really involve quantifiers at a more fundamental level of analysis, or logical form. Russell famously argued, in (Russell 1905), that “the King of France” is a quantified expression, even though it appears to be a referring expression on the face of it, a claim now widely accepted. And Davidson argued, in (Davidson 1967), that ‘action sentences’ like “Fred buttered the toast” involve quantification over events in the logical form, though not on the surface, a claim that is more controversial. One might argue in light of these debates that which sentences involve quantification over what can’t be finally settled until we have a formal semantics of all of our natural language, and that this formal semantics will give us the ultimate answer to what we are quantifying over. But then again, how are we to tell that the formal semantics proposed is correct, if we don’t know the inferential relations in our own language?
One further use that formal tools could have besides all the above is to make ambiguities and different ‘readings’ explicit, and to model their respective inferential behavior. For example, formal tools are especially useful to make scope ambiguities explicit, since different scope readings of one and the same natural language sentence can be represented with different formal sentences which themselves have no scope ambiguities. This use of formal tools is not restricted to ontology, but applies to any debates where ambiguities can be a hindrance. It does help in ontology, though, if some of the relevant expressions in ontological debates, like the quantifiers themselves, exhibit such different readings. Then formal tools will be most useful to make this explicit. Whether or not quantifiers indeed do have different readings is a question that will not be solved with formal tools, but if they do then these tools will be most useful in specifying what these readings are. For a proposal of this latter kind, see (Hofweber 2000), (Hofweber 2005), and, in particular, chapter 3 of (Hofweber 2016). One consequence of this is a meta-ontology different from Quine’s, as we will discuss below.
Logically valid inferences are those that are guaranteed to be valid by their form. And above we spelled this out as follows: an inference is valid by its form if as long as we fix the meaning of certain special expressions, the logical constants, we can ignore the meaning of the other expressions in the statements involved in the inference, and we are always guaranteed that the inference is valid, no matter what the meaning of the other expressions is, as long as the whole is meaningful. A logical truth can be understood as a statement whose truth is guaranteed as long as the meanings of the logical constants are fixed, no matter what the meaning of the other expressions is. Alternatively, a logical truth is one that is a logical consequence from no assumptions, i.e. an empty set of premises.
Do logical truths entail the existence of any entities, or is their truth independent of what exists? There are some well known considerations that seem to support the view that logic should be neutral with respect to what there is. On the other hand, there are also some well known arguments to the contrary. In this section we will survey some of this debate.
If logical truth are ones whose truth is guaranteed as long as the meaning of the logical constants is kept fixed then logical truths are good candidates for being analytic truths. Can analytic truths imply the existence of any entities? This is an old debate, often conducted using “conceptual truths” instead of “analytic truths”. The most prominent debate of this kind is the debate about the ontological argument for the existence of God. Many philosophers have maintained that there can be no conceptual contradiction in denying the existence of particular entities, and thus there can be no proof of their existence with conceptual truths alone. In particular, an ontological argument for the existence of God is impossible. A famous discussion to this effect is Kant’s discussion of the ontological argument in (Kant 1781/7), namely (KrV A592/B620 ff.) On the other hand, many other philosophers have maintained that such an ontological argument is possible, and they have made a variety of different proposals how it can go. We will not discuss the ontological argument here, however, it is discussed in detail in different formulations in the entry on ontological arguments in this encyclopedia.
Whatever one says about the possibility of proving the existence of an object purely with conceptual truths, many philosophers have maintained that at least logic has to be neutral about what there is. One of the reasons for this insistence is the idea that logic is topic neutral, or purely general. The logical truths are the ones that hold no matter what the representations are about, and thus they hold in any domain. In particular, they hold in an empty domain, one where there is nothing at all. And if that is true then logical truths can’t imply that anything exists. But that argument might be turned around by a believer in logical objects, objects whose existence is implied by logic alone. If it is granted that logical truths have to hold in any domain, then any domain has to contain the logical objects. Thus for a believer in logical objects there can be no empty domain.
There is a close relationship between this debate and a common criticism that standard formal logics (in the sense of (L1)) won’t be able to capture the logical truths (in the sense of (L2)). It is the debate about the status of the empty domain in the semantics of first and second order logical systems.
It is a logical truth in (standard) first order logic that something exists, i.e., ‘\(\exists x\,x=x\)’. Similarly, it is a logical truth in (standard versions of) second order logic that ‘\(\exists F\forall x\,(Fx \vee \neg Fx)\)’. These are existentially quantified statements. Thus, one might argue, logic is not neutral with respect to what there is. There are logical truths that state that something exists. However, it would be premature to conclude that logic is not neutral about what there is, simply because there are logical truths in (standard) first or second order logic which are existential statements. If we look more closely how it comes about that these existential statements are logical truths in these logical systems we see that it is only so because, by definition, a model for (standard) first order logic has to have a non-empty domain. It is possible to allow for models with an empty domain as well (where nothing exists), but models with an empty domain are excluded, again, by definition from the (standard) semantics in first order logic. Thus (standard) first order logic is sometimes called the logic of first order models with a non-empty domain. If we allow an empty domain as well we will need different axioms or rules of inference to have a sound proof system, but this can be done. Thus even though there are formal logical systems, in the sense of (L1) in which there are logical truths that are existential statements, this does not answer the question whether or not there are logical truths, in the sense of (L2), that are existential statements. The question rather is which formal system, in the sense of (L1), best captures the logical truths, in the sense of (L2). So, even if we agree that a first order logical system is a good formal system to represent logical inferences, should we adopt the axioms and rules for models with or without an empty domain?
A related debate is the debate about free logic. Free logics are formal systems that drop the assumption made in standard first and higher order logic that every closed term denotes an object in the domain of the model. Free logic allows for terms that denote nothing, and in free logic certain rules about the inferential interaction between quantifiers and terms have to be modified. Whether free or un-free (standard) logic is the better formal model for natural language logical inference is a further question. For more discussion of logic with an empty domain see (Quine 1954) and (Williamson 1999). For a sound and complete proof system for logic with an empty domain, see (Tennant 1990). For a survey article on free logic, see (Lambert 2001).
How innocent logic is with respect to ontology is also at the heart of the debate about the status of second order logic as logic. (Quine 1970) argued that second order logic was “set theory in sheep’s clothing”, and thus not properly logic at all. Quine was concerned with the questions of whether second order quantifiers should be understood as ranging over properties or over sets of individuals. The former were considered dubious in various ways, the latter turn second order logic into set theory. This approach to second order logic has been extensively criticized by various authors, most notably George Boolos, who in a series of papers, collected in part I of (Boolos 1998), attempted to vindicate second order logic, and to propose a plural interpretation, which is discussed in the article on plural quantification.
A particularly important and pressing case of the ontological implications of logic are logicist programs in the philosophy of mathematics, in particular Frege’s conception of logical objects and his philosophy of arithmetic. Frege and neo-Fregeans following him believe that arithmetic is logic (plus definitions) and that numbers are objects whose existence is implied by arithmetic. Thus in particular, logic implies the existence of certain objects, and numbers are among them. Frege’s position has been criticized as being untenable since logic has to be neutral about what there is. Thus mathematics, or even a part thereof, can’t be both logic and about objects. The inconsistency of Frege’s original formulation of his position sometimes has been taken to show this, but since consistent formulations of Frege’s philosophy of arithmetic have surfaced this last point is moot. Frege’s argument for numbers as objects and arithmetic as logic is probably the best known argument for logic implying the existence of entities. It has been very carefully investigated in recent years, but whether or not it succeeds is controversial. Followers of Frege defend it as the solution to major problems in the philosophy of mathematics; their critics find the argument flawed or even just a cheap trick that is obviously going nowhere. We will not discuss the details here, but a detailed presentation of the argument can be found in the entry on Frege’s theorem and foundations of arithmetic as well as (Rosen 1993), which gives a clear and readable presentation of the main argument of (Wright 1983), which in turn is partially responsible for a revival of Fregean ideas along these lines. Frege’s own version is in his classic (Frege 1884). A discussion of recent attempts to revive Frege can be found in (Hale and Wright 2001), (Boolos 1998) and (Fine 2002). A discussion of Frege’s and Kant’s conceptions of logic is in (MacFarlane 2002) which also contains many historical references.
Formal ontologies are theories that attempt to give precise mathematical formulations of the properties and relations of certain entities. Such theories usually propose axioms about these entities in question, spelled out in some formal language based on some system of formal logic. Formal ontology can been seen as coming in three kinds, depending on their philosophical ambition. Let’s call them representational, descriptive, and systematic. We will in this section briefly discuss what philosophers, and others, have hoped to do with such formal ontologies.
A formal ontology is a mathematical theory of certain entities, formulated in a formal, artificial language, which in turn is based on some logical system like first order logic, or some form of the lambda calculus, or the like. Such a formal ontology will specify axioms about what entities of this kind there are, what their relations among each other are, and so on. Formal ontologies could also only have axioms that state how the things the theory is about, whatever they may be, relate to each other, but no axioms that state that certain things exist. For example, a formal ontology of events won’t say which events there are. That is an empirical question. But it might say under what operations events are closed under, and what structure all the events there are exhibit. Similarly for formal ontologies of the part-whole relation, and others. See (Simons 1987) for a well known book on various formal versions of mereology, the study of parts and wholes.
Formal ontologies can be useful in a variety of different ways. One contemporary use is as a framework to represent information in an especially useful way. Information represented in a particular formal ontology can be more easily accessible to automated information processing, and how best to do this is an active area of research in computer science. The use of the formal ontology here is representational. It is a framework to represent information, and as such it can be representationally successful whether or not the formal theory used in fact truly describes a domain of entities. So, a formal ontology of states of affairs, lets say, can be most useful to represent information that might otherwise be represented in plain English, and this can be so whether or not there indeed are any states of affairs in the world. Such uses of formal ontologies are thus representational.
A different philosophical use of a formal ontology is one that aims to be descriptive. A descriptive formal ontology aims to correctly describe a certain domain of entities, say sets, or numbers, as opposed to all things there are. Take common conceptions of set theory as one example. Many people take set theory to aim at correctly describing a domain of entities, the pure sets. This is, of course, a controversial claim in the philosophy of set theory, but if it is correct then set theory could be seen as a descriptive formal ontology of pure sets. It would imply that among incompatible formal theories of sets only one could be correct. If set theory were merely representational then both of the incompatible theories could be equally useful as representational tools, though probably for different representational tasks.
Finally, formal ontologies have been proposed as systematic theories of what there is, with some restrictions. Such systematic theories hope to give one formal theory for all there is, or at least a good part of it. Hardly anyone would claim that there can be a simple formal theory that correctly states what concrete physical objects there are. There does not seem to be a simple principle that determines whether there are an even or odd number of mice at a particular time. But maybe this apparent randomness only holds for concrete physical objects. It might not hold for abstract objects, which according to many exist not contingently, but necessarily if at all. Maybe a systematic, simple formal theory is possible of all abstract objects. Such a systematic formal ontology will most commonly have one kind of entities which are the primary subject of the theory, and a variety of different notions of reduction that specify how other (abstract) objects really are entities of this special kind. A simple view of this kind would be one according to which all abstract objects are sets, and numbers, properties, etc. are really special kinds of sets. However, more sophisticated versions of systematic formal ontologies have been developed. An ambitious systematic formal ontology can be found in (Zalta 1983) and (Zalta 1999, in the Other Internet Resources).
Representational formal ontologies, somewhat paradoxically, are independent of any strictly ontological issues. Their success or failure is independent of what there is. Descriptive formal ontologies are just like representational ones, except with the ambition of describing a domain of entities. Systematic formal ontologies go further in not only describing one domain, but in relating all entities (of a certain kind) to each other, often with particular notions of reduction. These theories seem to be the most ambitious. Their motivation comes from an attempt to find a simple and systematic theory of all, say, abstract entities, and they can rely on the paradigm of aiming for simplicity in the physical sciences as a guide. They, just like descriptive theories, will have to have as their starting point a reasonable degree of certainty that we indeed are ontologically committed to the entities they aim to capture. Without that these enterprises seem to have little attraction. But even if the latter philosophical ambitions fail, a formal ontology can still be a most useful representational tool.
One interesting view about the relationship between formal languages, ontology, and meta-ontology is the one developed by Carnap in the first half of the 20th century, and which is one of the starting points of the contemporary debate in ontology, leading to the well-known exchange between Carnap and Quine, to be discussed below. According to Carnap one crucial project in philosophy is to develop frameworks that can be used by scientists to formulate theories of the world. Such frameworks are formal languages that have a clearly defined relationship to experience or empirical evidence as part of their semantics. For Carnap it was a matter of usefulness and practicality which one of these frameworks will be selected by the scientists to formulate their theories in, and there is no one correct framework that truly mirrors the world as it is in itself. The adoption of one framework rather than another is thus a practical question.
Carnap distinguished two kinds of questions that can be asked about what there is. One are the so-called ‘internal questions’, questions like ‘Are there infinitely many prime numbers?’ These questions make sense once a framework that contains talk about numbers has been adopted. Such questions vary in degree of difficulty. Some are very hard, like ‘Are there infinitely many twin prime numbers?’, some are of medium difficulty, like ‘Are there infinitely many prime numbers?’, some are easy like ‘Are there prime numbers?’, and some are completely trivial, like ‘Are there numbers?’. Internal questions are thus questions that can be asked once a framework that allows talk about certain things has been adopted, and general internal questions, like ‘Are there numbers?’ are completely trivial since once the framework of talk about numbers has been adopted the question if there are any is settled within that framework.
But since the internal general questions are completely trivial they can’t be what the philosophers and metaphysicians are after when they ask the ontological question ‘Are there numbers?’ The philosophers aim to ask a difficult and deep question, not a trivial one. What the philosophers aim to ask, according to Carnap, is not a question internal to the framework, but external to it. They aim to ask whether the framework correctly corresponds to reality, whether or not there really are numbers. However, the words used in the question ‘Are there numbers?’ only have meaning within the framework of talk about numbers, and thus if they are meaningful at all they form an internal question, with a trivial answer. The external questions that the metaphysician tries to ask are meaningless. Ontology, the philosophical discipline that tries to answer hard questions about what there really is is based on a mistake. The question it tries to answer are meaningless questions, and this enterprise should be abandoned. The words ‘Are there numbers?’ thus can be used in two ways: as an internal question, in which case the answer is trivially ‘yes’, but this has nothing to do with metaphysics or ontology, or as an external question, which is the one the philosophers are trying to ask, but which is meaningless. Philosophers should thus not be concerned with (O2), which is a discipline that tries to answer meaningless questions, but with (L1), which is a discipline that, in part, develops frameworks for science to use to formulate and answer real questions. Or so Carnap’s project. Carnap’s ideas about ontology and meta-ontology are developed in his classic essay (Carnap 1956b). A nice summary of Carnap’s views can be found in his intellectual autobiography (Carnap 1963).
Carnap’s rejection of ontology, and metaphysics more generally, has been widely criticized from a number of different angles. One common criticism is that it relies on a too simplistic conception of natural language that ties it too closely to science or to evidence and verification. In particular, Carnap’s more general rejection of metaphysics used a verificationist conception of meaning, which is widely seen as too simplistic. Carnap’s rejection of ontology has been criticized most prominently by Quine, and the debate between Carnap and Quine on ontology is a classic in this field. Quine rejected Carnap’s conception that when scientists are faced with data that don’t fit their theory they have two choices. First they could change the theory, but stay in the same framework. Secondly, they could move to a different framework, and formulate a new theory within that framework. These two moves for Carnap are substantially different. Quine would want to see them as fundamentally similar. In particular, Quine rejects the idea that there could be truths which are the trivial internal statements, like “There are numbers”, whose truth is a given once the framework of numbers has been adopted. Thus some such internal statements would be analytic truths, and Quine is well known for thinking that the distinction between analytic and synthetic truths is untenable. Thus Carnap’s distinction between internal and external questions is to be rejected alongside with the rejection of the distinction between analytic and synthetic truths. On the other hand, Quine and Carnap agree that ontology in the traditional philosophical sense is to be rejected. Traditionally ontology has often, but not always, been an armchair, a priori, investigation into the fundamental building blocks of reality. As such it is completely separated from science. Quine rejects this approach to ontology since he holds that there can’t be such an investigation into reality that is completely separate and prior to the rest of inquiry. See his (Quine 1951). See (Yablo 1998) for more on the debate between Quine and Carnap, which contains many references to the relevant passages. The view on ontological commitment discussed in section 4.1., which is usually attributed to Quine, was developed as a reaction to Carnap’s position discussed in this section. Simply put, Quine’s view is that to see what we are committed to we have to see what our best overall theory of the world quantifies over. In particular, we look at our best overall scientific theory of the world, which contains physics and the rest.
Carnap’s arguments for the rejection of ontology are presently widely rejected. However, several philosophers have recently attempted to revive some parts or others of Carnap’s ideas. For example, Stephen Yablo has argued that an internal-external distinction could be understood along the lines of the fictional-literal distinction. And, he argues in (Yablo 1998), since there is no fact about this distinction, ontology, in the sense of (O2), rests on a mistake and is to be rejected, as Carnap did. On the other hand, Thomas Hofweber has argued that an internal-external distinction with many of the features that Carnap wanted can be defended on the basis of facts about natural language, but that such a distinction will not lead to a rejection of ontology, in the sense of (O2). See (Hofweber 2005) and (Hofweber 2016). Hilary Putnam, for example in (Putnam 1987), has developed a view that revives some of the pragmatic aspects of Carnap’s position. See (Sosa 1993) for a critical discussion of Putnam’s view, and (Sosa 1999) for a related, positive proposal. Robert Kraut in (Kraut 2016) has defended an expressivist reading of the internal-external distinction, and with it some Carnapian consequences for ontology. And most of all, Eli Hirsch and Amie Thomasson have defended different versions of approaches to ontology that capture a good part of the spirit of Carnap’s view. See in particular (Hirsch 2011) and (Thomasson 2015). For various views about the effects of Carnap on the contemporary debate in ontology, see (Blatti and Lapointe 2016).
Although ontology is often understood as the discipline that tries to find out what there is, or what exists, this is rejected by many in the contemporary debate. These philosophers think that the job of ontology is something different, and there is disagreement among them what it is more precisely. Among the proposed options are the projects of finding out what is real, or what is fundamental, or what the primary substances are, or what reality is like in itself, or something like this. Proponents of these approaches often find the questions about what there is too inconsequential and trivial to take them to be the questions for ontology. Whether there are numbers, say, is trivially answered in the affirmative, but whether numbers are real, or whether they are fundamental, or primary substances, etc., is the hard and ontological question. See (Fine 2009) and (Schaffer 2009) for two approaches along these lines. But such approaches have their own problems. For example, it is not clear whether the question whether numbers are real is any different than the question whether numbers exist. If one were to ask whether the Loch Ness monster is real, it would naturally be understood as just the same question as whether the Loch Ness monster exists. If it is supposed to be a different question, is this due to simple stipulation, or can we make the difference intelligible? Similarly, it is not clear whether the notion of what is fundamental can carry the intended metaphysical weight. After all, there is a perfectly clear sense in which prime numbers are more fundamental in arithmetic than even numbers, but this isn’t to hold the metaphysical priority of prime numbers over other numbers, but simply to hold that they are mathematically special among the numbers. Thus to ask whether numbers are fundamental is not easily seen as a metaphysical alternative to the approach to ontology that asks whether numbers exist. See (Hofweber 2009) and chapter 13 of (Hofweber 2016) for a critical discussion of some approaches to ontology that rely on notions of reality or fundamentality. Whether such approaches to ontology are correct is a controversial topic in the debate about ontology which we will not focus on here. However, this approach gives rise to a special connection between logic and ontology which we will discuss in the following.
The relation between the different approaches to ontology mentioned just above is unclear. Is something that is part of reality as it is in itself something which is fundamental, or which is real in the relevant sense? Although it is unclear how these different approaches relate to each other, all of them have the potential for allowing for that our ordinary description of the world in terms of mid-size objects, mathematics, morality, and so on, is literally true, while at the same time these truths leave it open what the world, so to speak, deep down, really, and ultimately is like. To use one way of articulating this, even though there are tables, numbers, and values, reality in itself might contain none of them. Reality in itself might contain no objects at all, and nothing normative. Or it might. The ordinary description of the world, on this conception, leaves it largely open what reality in itself is like. To find that out is the job of metaphysics, in particular ontology. We might, given our cognitive setup, be forced to think of the world as one of objects, say. But that might merely reflect how reality is for us. How it is in itself is left open.
Whether the distinction between reality as it is for us and as it is in itself can be made sense of is an open question, in particular if it is not simply the distinction between reality as it appears to us, and as it really is. This distinction would not allow for the option that our ordinary description of reality is true, while the question how reality is in itself is left open by this. If our ordinary description were true then this would mean that how reality appears to us is how it in fact is. But if this distinction can be made sense of as intended then it gives rise to a problem about how to characterize reality as it is in itself, and this gives rise to a role for logic in the sense of (L1).
If we are forced to think of the world in terms of objects because of our cognitive makeup then it would be no surprise that our natural language forces us to describe the world in terms of objects. And arguably some of the central features of natural languages do exactly that. It represents information in terms of subject and predicate, where the subject paradigmatically picks out an object and the predicate paradigmatically attributes a property to it. If this is correct about natural language then it seems that natural language is utterly unsuitable to describe reality as it is in itself if the latter does not contain any objects at all. But then, how are we to describe reality as it is in itself?
Some philosophers have proposed that natural language might be unsuitable for the purposes of ontology. It might be unsuitable since it carries with it too much baggage from our particular conceptual scheme. See (Burgess 2005) for a discussion. Or it might be unsuitable since various expressions in it are not precise enough, too context sensitive, or in other ways not ideally suited for the philosophical project. These philosophers propose instead to find a new, better suited language. Such a language likely will be a major departure from natural language and instead will be a formal, artificial language. This to be found language is often called ‘ontologese’ (Dorr 2005), (Sider 2009), (Sider 2011), or ‘the fundamental language’. The task thus is to find the fundamental language, a language in the sense of (L1), to properly carry out ontology, in the new and revised sense of (O2): the project of finding out what reality fundamentally, or in itself, etc., is like. For a critical discussion of the proposal that we should be asking the questions of ontology in ontologese, see chapter 10 of (Thomasson 2015).
But this idea of a connection between (L1) and (O2) is not unproblematic. First there is a problem about making this approach to (O2) more precise. How to understand the notion of ‘reality in itself’ is not at all clear, as is well known. It can’t just mean: reality as it would be if we weren’t in it. On this understanding it would simply be the world as it is except with no humans in it, which would in many of its grander features be just as it in fact is. But then what does it mean? Similar, but different, worries apply to those who rely on notions like ‘fundamental’, ‘substance’, and the like. We won’t pursue this issue here, though. Second, there is a serious worry about how the formal language which is supposed to be the fundamental language is to be understood. In particular, is it supposed to be merely an auxiliary tool, or an essential one? This question is tied to the motivation for a formal fundamental language in the first place. If it is merely to overcome ambiguities, imperfections, and context sensitivities, then it most likely will merely be an auxiliary, but not essential tool. After all, within natural language we have many means available to get rid of ambiguities, imperfections and context sensitivities. Scope ambiguities can be often quite easily be overcome with scope markers. For example, the ambiguities in ‘\(A\) and \(B\) or \(C\)’ can be overcome as: ‘either \(A\) and \(B\) or \(C\)’ on the one hand, and ‘\(A\) and either \(B\) or \(C\)’, on the other. Other imprecisions can often, and maybe always, be overcome in some form or other. Formal languages are useful and often convenient for precisification, but they don’t seem to be essential for it.
On other hand, the formal fundamental language might be taken to be essential for overcoming shortcomings or inherent features of our natural language as the one alluded to above. If the subject-predicate structure of our natural languages brings with it a object-property way of representing the world, and if that way of representing the world is unsuitable for representing how reality is in itself, then a completely different language might be required, and not simply be useful, to describe fundamental reality. Alternatively, if the formal language is needed to articulate real existence, as we might be tempted to put it, something which we can’t express in English or other natural languages, then, too, it would be essential for the project of ontology. But if the formal language is needed to do something that our natural language can’t do, then what do the sentences in the formal language mean? Since they do something our natural language can’t do, we won’t be able to translate their meanings into our natural language. If we could then our natural language would be able to say what these sentences say, which by assumption it can’t do. But then what do sentences in the fundamental language mean? If we can’t say or think what these sentences say, what is the point for us to use it to try to describe reality as it is in itself with them? Can we even make sense of the project of finding out which sentences in such a language are correct? And why should we care, given that we can’t understand what these sentences mean?
A sample debate related to the issues discussed in this section is the debate about whether it might be that reality in itself does not contain any objects. See, for example, (Hawthorne and Cortens 1995), (Burgess 2005), and (Turner 2011). Here the use of a variable and quantifier free language like predicate functor logic as the fundamental language is a recurring theme.
One way to understand logic is as the study of the most general forms of thought or judgment, what we called (L4). One way to understand ontology is as the study of the most general features of what there is, our (O3). Now, there is a striking similarity between the most general forms of thought and the most general features of what there is. Take one example. Many thoughts have a subject of which they predicate something. What there is contains individuals that have properties. It seems that there is a kind of a correspondence between thought and reality: the form of the thought corresponds to the structure of a fact in the world. And similarly for other forms and structures. Does this matching between thought and the world ask for a substantial philosophical explanation? Is it a deep philosophical puzzle?
To take the simplest example, the form of our subject-predicate thoughts corresponds perfectly to the structure of object-property facts. If there is an explanation of this correspondence to be given it seems it could go in one of three ways: either the form of thought explains the structure of reality (a form of idealism), or the other way round (a form of realism), or maybe there is a common explanation of why there is a correspondence between them, for example on a form of theism where God guarantees a match.
At first it might seem clear that we should try to give an explanation of the second kind: the structure of the facts explains the forms of our thoughts that represent these facts. And an idea for such an explanation suggests itself. Our minds developed in a world full of objects having properties. If we had a separate simple representation for these different facts then this would be highly inefficient. After all, it is often the same object that has different properties and figures in different facts, and it is often the same property that is had by different objects. So, it makes sense to split up our representations of the objects and of the properties into different parts, and to put them back together in different combinations in the representation of a fact. And thus it makes sense that our minds developed to represent object-property facts with subject-predicate representations. Therefore we have a mind whose thoughts have a form which mirrors the structure of the facts that make up the world.
This kind of an explanation is a nice try, and plausible, but it is rather speculative. That our minds really developed this way in light of those pressures is a question that is not easy to answer from the armchair. Maybe the facts do have a different structure, but our forms are close enough for practical purposes, i.e. for survival and flourishing. And maybe the correspondence does obtain, but not for this largely evolutionary reason, but for a different, more direct and more philosophical or metaphysical reason.
To explain the connection differently one could endorse the opposite order of explanatory priority, and argue that the form of thought explains the structure of the world. This would most likely lead to an idealist position of sorts. It would hold that the general features of our minds explain some of the most general features of reality. The most famous way to do something like this is Kant’s in the Critique of Pure Reason (Kant 1781/7). We won’t be able to discuss it here in any detail. This strategy for explaining the similarity has the problem of explaining how there can be a world that exists independently of us, and will continue to exist after we have died, but nonetheless the structure of this world is explained by the forms of our thoughts. Maybe this route could only be taken if one denies that the world exists independently of us, or maybe one could make this tension go away. In addition one would have to say how the form of thought explains the structure of reality. For one attempt to do this, see (Hofweber 2018).
But maybe there is not much to explain here. Maybe reality does not have anything like a structure that mirrors the form of our thoughts, at least not understood a certain way. One might hold that the truth of the thought “John smokes” does not require a world split up into objects and properties, it only requires a smoking John. And all that is required for that is a world that contains John, but not also another thing, the property of smoking. Thus a structural match would be less demanding, only requiring a match between objects and object directed thought, but no further match. Such a view would be broadly nominalistic about properties, and it is rather controversial.
Another way in which there might be nothing to explain is connected to philosophical debates about truth. If a correspondence theory of truth is correct, and if thus for a sentence to be true it has to correspond to the world in a way that mirrors the structure and matches parts of the sentence properly with parts of the world, then the form of a true sentence would have to be mirrored in the world. But if, on the other extreme, a coherence theory of truth is correct then the truth of a sentence does not require a structural correspondence to the world, but merely a coherence with other sentences. For more on all aspects of truth see (Künne 2003).
Whether or not there is a substantial metaphysical puzzle about the correspondence of the form of thoughts and the structure of reality will itself depend on certain controversial philosophical topics. And if there is a puzzle here, it might be a trivial one, or it might be quite deep. And as usual in these parts of philosophy, how substantial a question is is itself a hard question.
With the many conceptions of logic and the many different philosophical projects under the heading of ontology, there are many problems that are in the intersection of these areas. We have touched on several above, but there are also others. Although there is no single problem about the relationship between logic and ontology, there are many interesting connections between them, some closely connected to central philosophical questions. The references and links below are intended to provide a more in depth discussions of these topics.
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
- The Theory of Abstract Objects, outline of Edward N. Zalta’s systematic formal ontology.
- Buffalo Ontology Site.
- Empiricism, semantics and ontology. Online version of Carnap’s famous essay, formatted in HTML by Andrew Chrucky
- Rudolf Carnap, Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy article on Carnap.
- Frege, Gottlob, Grundlagen der Arithmetik (in German) (PDF), the original of what is translated as the Foundations of Arithmetic.
Thanks to various anonymous referees for their helpful suggestions on earlier versions of this article. Thanks also to Jamin Asay, Rafael Laboissiere, Ricardo Pereira, Adam Golding, Gary Davis, programadoor, Barnaby Dromgool, Chris Meister, and especially James Cole for reporting several errors, typos, or omissions.