Notes to Logical Truth

1. A common view is that logic is fundamentally concerned with characterizing (and giving us practical means to tell apart) a peculiar set of truth-preserving arguments, the arguments in which the conclusion is a logical consequence of the premises. On most views, in cases of logical consequence the conclusion follows with a special modal force from the premises (in some sense of “could”, the conclusion could not be false if the premises are true); and the conclusion follows “formally” from the premises, at least in the sense that all arguments which are replacement instances of the argument's form are cases of logical consequence too (where the notion of the form of an argument is understood in the obvious way in terms of the notion of the form of a sentence). The following English arguments are standardly taken as paradigmatic examples of logical consequence:

  • (1+) Death is bad only if life is good. Death is bad. So life is good.
  • (2+) No desire is voluntary. Some beliefs are desires. So some beliefs are not voluntary.
  • (3+) Drasha is a cat. All cats are mysterious. So Drasha is mysterious.

However, many or even most recent philosophical discussions of logical consequence end up being discussions of logical truth. This is in part because it is easier to think about sentences than about arguments, and most issues about logical consequence can be translated into analogous issues about logical truth. Thus, for example, on almost any view, if an argument (with a finite number of premises) is a case of logical consequence, then a material conditional whose antecedent is a conjunction of the premises and whose consequent is the conclusion will be a logical truth, and this truth will have the same modal force and the same formal character as the inferential connection in its corresponding argument. (Compare (1), (2) and (3) with (1+), (2+) and (3+) respectively.) Although logical consequence is probably more fundamental than logical truth in various important ways, this entry follows the mentioned custom and discusses many issues relevant to logical consequence in the guise of issues about logical truth. (See the entry on logical consequence for a more direct discussion of this concept. See also Dummett 1981, pp. 432 ff., and Wagner 1987, pp. 14 ff. for contrasting views on the reasons why logical consequence is supposed to be more fundamental than logical truth.)

2. A terminological warning. Sometimes the forms of logical truths, schemata such as (1′)–(3′) or formalized correlates of them (see 2.1 below), are called “logical truths”. In what is perhaps the most relaxed technical usage, the theoretical truths that are asserted peculiarly by logic as a science, e.g. “(1) is a logical truth”, are called “logical truths”. In what is perhaps the most relaxed non-technical usage, all truths that are more or less obvious are sometimes called “logical truths”. Here we will use “logical truth” in the strict technical sense paradigmatically illustrated by (1), (2) and (3). In this strict sense only fully interpreted sentences are logical truths (or just truths), and theoretical truths that are asserted peculiarly by logic as a science need not be logical truths. This strict usage is also the most frequent philosophical usage.

3. This view should not be confused with the view that the set of logical truths must be empty (the view, that is, that there is no such thing as a non-empty set of logical truths, not even in context). This view has been given the name “logical nihilism” in the recent literature. Russell (2017, 2018) has explored this view and specifically the question whether it could be defended via arguments that any sentence can be claimed to be false in some “case” or other. (See also Mortensen 1989 and Estrada-González 2012 for arguments of this kind.) Franks (2014) adopts logical nihilism (though not on the basis of such arguments) and proposes that logic ought to be concerned with studying all kinds of relations between propositions.

4. Strictly speaking, for Kant logic (general or pure logic) does not give us logical truths in the customary sense we have been using, which includes sentences involving empirical concepts. And in the case of syllogisms, he deals with them as inferences, not as sentences. But commentators have often considered the question of whether, say, customary syllogisms, considered as sentences, would be analytic in Kant's view. We will follow this common practice of abstracting from some historical inaccuracies, when considering what Kant's view would have been on the question of the epistemic ground of logical truth.

5. Such an interpretation would receive some support from the fact that for Kant, the logical expressions do not express meanings in the way that non-logical expressions express meanings or concepts (see Critique of Pure Reason, B 186; several of the Kantian categories correspond approximately to the “significations” of some paradigmatic logical expressions; see also MacFarlane 2002). Logical expressions might thus seem not to express meanings susceptible of analysis, and if so analysis could not provide the grounds for thinking of a logical truth as true. Leibniz's explicit view, on the other hand, had been that the meanings of all expressions, including particles of all kinds, were susceptible of analysis, and that all such analyses constitute grounds for a priori demonstrations; see e.g. his “Analysis Linguarum”, pp. 351–2. Bolzano would later say that if all expressions have meanings susceptible of analysis, many of these analyses would be synthetic in Kant's sense; see Bolzano 1837, §305.

6. We completely skip here a discussion of the question whether the adequate representation of logical form can be given by means of schemata at the level of surface syntax (what we have been more or less assuming in our examples), or at some other level of logical or linguistic representation postulated by philosophers or linguists, or indeed of the question whether it can be given at all via the process of formalization (in the sense of 2.1 below). Presumably the points we are about to make would apply mutatis mutandis under any particular view on which there are adequate representations of logical form in some appropriate sense. See the entry logical constants, Glanzberg (2015) and Iacona (2018) for discussion bearing on these issues.

7. There are other approaches to the characterization of logical truth for formalized languages that do not only use (or do not clearly only use) concepts from standard mathematics. One classical approach, which can be seen as a non-model-theoretic notion of validity (in the sense of model-theoretic validity below), characterizes a logical truth simply as a sentence such that all the sentences that are appropriate replacement instances of the schematic letters in its logical form are true. (If the class of replacement instances is not mathematically well delimited, the notion of a replacement instance will not clearly be characterizable in terms of standard mathematics.) While this characterization may give the right results for some languages (see section 2.3 below), it is widely thought that it is subject to severe limitations (again mentioned in section 2.3 below). (See Dogramaci 2017 for a recent defense of this kind of characterization.)

One recent approach to characterization that doesn't use only concepts from standard mathematics is that of Field (2015). Field proposes to leave “logical truth” as a primitive in the characterizing theory, and to axiomatize it in terms of notions that include the notion of belief and certain normative notions. The basic idea reflected in the axioms is that a person is not permitted to accept a sentence as logically true without fully believing it (or the proposition it expresses) and the sentences that are appropriate replacement instances of the schematic letters in its logical form.

8. The variables that appear in Fregean sentences (and in their logical forms) are best seen as non-logical expressions, together with the schematic letters. The meaning of the variables (their range) varies from interpretation to interpretation of a Fregean language, as noted below in the text.

9. Tarski's abstract method can be used, and is used, to give similar characterizations of logical truth even for formalized languages which extend Fregean languages. The mathematical notions of validity (and derivability) that have been defined for these languages cannot be discussed here. For discussion see, among others, the entries on the logic of conditionals, modal logic, and temporal logic. Zalta (1988), Hanson (2006), Nelson and Zalta (2012) and Hanson (2014) contain discussion relevant to what we will later call the problem of adequacy for some of these languages. Etchemendy (2008) argues against his construal of the Tarskian method noting that a model-theoretic definition of validity based on the notion of a (classical) structure is obviously extensionally inadequate for these languages; Gómez-Torrente (2008) claims that Tarski's use of classical structures was intended only for the characterization of logical truth for extensional languages (though it may fail here for non-obvious reasons).

Tarski's abstract method is also used by Beall and Restall (2000, 2006) to give the various characterizations of validity and thus of logical truth that on their view (see section 1.1 in the main text) are compatible with the pretheoretic concept of logical truth even for a given fixed Fregean language.

10. Perhaps a qualification is necessary in view of the fact that sentences like “\(\exists x(x=x)\)” are usually interpreted as making categorical existence claims, but they are model-theoretically valid. This is due to the usual convention of not contemplating empty universe structures when defining model-theoretic validity. But the method for defining validity can be used and the corresponding (6)-type theorem proved for more inclusive conventions (see the entry on free logic). See Chihara 1998, §5, for other possible qualifications.

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