Georg [György] Lukács
Georg (György) Lukács (1885–1971) was a literary theorist and philosopher who is widely viewed as one of the founders of “Western Marxism”. Lukács is best known for his pre-World War II writings in literary theory, aesthetic theory and Marxist philosophy. Today, his most widely read works are the Theory of the Novel of 1916 and History and Class Consciousness of 1923. In History and Class Consciousness, Lukács laid out a wide-ranging critique of the phenomenon of “reification” in capitalism and formulated a vision of Marxism as a self-conscious transformation of society. This text became an important reference point both for critical social theory and for many currents of countercultural thought. Even though his later work could not capture the imagination of the intellectual public as much as his earlier writings, Lukács remained a prolific writer and an influential theorist in his later career and published hundreds of articles on literary theory and aesthetics, not to mention numerous books, including two massive works on aesthetics and ontology. He was also active as a politician in Hungary in both the revolution of 1919 and during the events of 1956. Today, his work remains of philosophical interest not only because it contains the promise of a reformulation of an undogmatic, non-reductionist Marxism, but also because it connects a philosophical approach drawing on Neo-Kantianism, Hegel and Marx with an acute cultural sensitivity and a powerful critique of modern life inspired by Weber’s and Simmel’s sociological analyses of modern rationalization.
- 1. Biographical Notes
- 2. Early Aesthetic Writings
- 3. History and Class Consciousness
- 4. The later Lukács: Praxis, Totality, and Freedom
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Georg Lukács was born on April 13, 1885 in Budapest as Bernát György Löwinger. His father, the influential banker József Löwinger, changed the Jewish family name to the Hungarian surname Lukács in 1890. In 1899, the family was admitted into the nobility. Already as a high school student, Lukács developed a keen interest in literature and especially drama, publishing numerous reviews of theater plays in the Hungarian press.
Lukács received a Ph.D. in Political Science from the University of Kolozsvár in 1906 and a doctorate from the University of Budapest in 1909, after submitting parts of his manuscript on the “History of the Modern Drama”. In the following nine years, Lukács made a name for himself as a literary and aesthetic theorist with a number of well-received articles. He worked and participated in intellectual circles in Budapest, Berlin (where he was influenced by Georg Simmel), Florence and Heidelberg. In 1910 and 1911, Lukács published his essay collection Soul and Form and, together with Lajos Fülep, founded a short-lived avant-garde journal, A Szellem (The Spirit). Lukács’ life was shaken up during that time by the death of his close friend Leo Popper and by the suicide of Irma Seidler who had been his lover. Lukács felt responsible for Seidler’s death and it proved to have an enormous impact on him, which is reflected in his 1911 essay “On Poverty of Spirit”.
During the same period, Lukács developed a close connection to Max and Marianne Weber in Heidelberg, to Ernst Bloch and to the Neo-Kantian philosophers Heinrich Rickert and Emil Lask. Between 1912 and 1914 he worked on a first attempt to formulate a systematic approach to art, which remained unpublished during his lifetime (GW 16). After the beginning of the First World War, Lukács was exempted from the frontline of military service. In 1914, he married the Russian political activist (and convicted terrorist) Jelena Grabenko.
In 1913, Lukács began participating in the influential “Sunday circle” of Budapest intellectuals, which included Karl Mannheim. After returning from wartime service in the Hungarian censor’s office, he published The Theory of the Novel (1916), which is perhaps the best-known work of his early period. In 1917, he left Grabenko and, despite Weber’s support, failed to receive the Habilitation (teaching qualification) at the University of Heidelberg. Between 1916 and 1918 he also resumed his work on aesthetics, resulting in the unpublished manuscript of the so-called “Heidelberg Aesthetics” (GW 17). To the surprise of many of his friends, Lukács joined the Hungarian Communist Party in 1918; although, as his essay on “Bolshevism as a Moral Problem” attests, not without reservations.
After a rapid ascent as one of the leading thinkers of the party, Lukács became more involved in day-to-day politics: after the revolution in 1919, he first served as a deputy commissar and then as commissar of public education in Béla Kun’s government. Later, when war broke out, he served as a political commissar in the Hungarian Red Army (in this position, he also ordered the execution of several soldiers, see Kadarkay 1991: 223). After the communist government was defeated, Lukács fled to Vienna at the end of 1919 where he married his second wife, Gertrud Bortstieber. Being in charge of coordinating the clandestine activities of the exiled communist party, he remained under constant threat of expulsion to Hungary. For this reason, after Lukács was arrested, in November 1919 an appeal (“Save Georg Lukács”) appeared in a Berlin newspaper signed by many intellectuals—among them Heinrich and Thomas Mann.
In 1923, Lukács published his most famous work, the essay collection History and Class Consciousness. In this text, Lukács argued forcefully for a philosophically refined version of Marxism as a solution to the problems that have vexed modern philosophy and developed the idea of society as a “totality”—an ontological commitment which is derived from Hegel, while at the same time incorporating sociological insights into the character of modern societies which he had acquired through Weber and Simmel. This reformulation of the philosophical premises of Marxism, however, entailed a rejection of the then contemporary forms of simplistic materialism and naive scientism endorsed by many Soviet party intellectuals. Unsurprisingly, the party orthodoxy condemned the book as an expression of ultra-leftism (in spite of Lukács’ pro-Leninist revisions to the articles in the volume which had already appeared previously, see Löwy 1979: 172–179). Nevertheless, his position as one of the leading intellectuals of Marxism was cemented, allowing Lukács to participate at the forefront of the debates of the time, as for example with a quickly written study on Lenin on the occasion of the Soviet leader’s death in 1924. However, in 1928, Lukács had to virtually give up his political activities after he presented the so-called “Blum theses” (see 1928). In this draft of a party platform, which was named after his party alias, he argued for a democratic dictatorship of workers and peasants in Hungary. These theses were condemned as a right-wing deviation by the party (earning him the status of being condemned both as a left-wing and a right-wing dissident within a timeframe of five years).
Following another arrest by the Austrian authorities, Lukács left Vienna in 1929 first for Berlin, then for Budapest where he lived underground for three months. Eventually, he was summoned by the Soviet party leadership to Moscow where he stayed from 1930 on, leaving only for Comintern missions in Berlin and for Tashkent during the war. In Moscow, Lukács held a position at the Marx-Engels Institute. During this time, he first came into contact with Marx’s early works which had previously remained unpublished. As Lukács became (at least outwardly) increasingly subservient to the Stalinist orthodoxy (while producing a first attempt of a new Marxist aesthetics in The Historical Novel), he publicly retracted his views espoused in History and Class Consciousness (see 1933b). The degree of Lukács’ agreement with Stalinism is disputed to this day (see Lichtheim 1970; Deutscher 1972; Kolakowski 1978; Pike 1988). However, it is clear from his writings that he publicly defended Stalinist dogmas both in aesthetics and politics during the 1930s, 1940s and 1950s (1933a, 1938, 1951) while criticizing Stalin and Stalinism repeatedly later on (see 1957, 1962).
In 1944, Lukács returned to Budapest and became a professor at the local university. In 1948, he published his two-volume study titled The Young Hegel (written partly during the 1930s in Moscow) and participated in debates about socialist realism in literature. In 1949, he also traveled to Paris to engage in a debate about existentialism and Marxism with Sartre. The works of this period reflect both his allegiance to orthodox Soviet Marxism and his uneasiness with the Stalinist post-war situation. A widely criticized example of his writing of this time is The Destruction of Reason, published in 1954. It denounced much of the German philosophical and literary tradition after Marx as an outgrowth of “irrationalism” and as bearing responsibility for the ascent of National Socialism. During this time, Lukács also continued to defend a rather conservative ideal of realism in aesthetics (see 1951).
After again being subjected to criticism from the party orthodoxy and being virtually excluded from public life in the mid-1950s, the Hungarian uprising against the Soviet rule in 1956 opened a new chapter for Lukács. After Stalin’s death, it became not only increasingly possible for him to publicly criticize Stalinism and to voice again, for the first time since 1928, his vision for the future of Marxism, arguing that the communist party should regain public trust by competing with other leftist forces within a multi-party democracy. He also served in the short-lived Nagy government as minister for public education. After the subsequent Soviet invasion, he was arrested and imprisoned in Romania. In contrast to other members of the government, he was not executed but merely expelled from the communist party, which he only rejoined in 1969. From the 1960s on, Lukács—having had to retire from all academic positions—worked on his two-volume Specificity of the Aesthetic and on a Marxist ethics, later partly transformed into the Ontology of Social Being, which he never finished during his lifetime. He also continued to publish extensively on literature and art. Lukács passed away on June 4, 1971 in Budapest.
Lukács’ “early” writings—before his turn to Marxism in 1918—are animated by concerns that are also present, albeit transformed, in his later political thought. In this period, Lukács formulates a sophisticated aesthetic theory and a critique of modern culture that he diagnoses to be characterized by an insurmountable abyss between objective cultural forms and the richness of “genuine life”.
He takes up the issue of the relationship between “form” and “life” in three different but closely interconnected discussions: First, there is the question of how the element of “form” distinguishes art as a separate sphere of value. This is most explicitly discussed in his two attempts at a systematic philosophy of art. Second, there is the sociological-historical question about the relation between (individual and collective) life and the (aesthetic and ethical) forms in modern bourgeois society. This topic is dominant both in the History of the Modern Drama of 1909 and in the Theory of the Novel of 1916. Finally, a third strand concerns existential and ethical questions, most explicitly discussed in Soul and Form and in the essay “On Poverty of Spirit”.
Next to “form”, two central concepts in Lukács’ thought are “totality” and “life”. With “totality” Lukács refers to a whole set of elements that are meaningfully interrelated in such a way that the essence of each element can only be understood in its relation to the others. “Life”, as Lukács understands it, is the intrinsic richness and potentiality of experiences and actions of individuals and societies, rather than only the temporal unfolding of empirical lives. Both individual and social life is in principle capable of forming an integrated totality. However, this is only the case if the essential properties of its elements are intelligible in terms of their relations to other particulars of life. Only in this case, life can have a meaningful form which is not a mere restriction. Lukács claims that this was the case in the times of Homeric Greece where a totality of meaning was immanent to life itself. This immanence of meaning and the totality it constituted was, however, lost in the subsequent historical development, transforming form into an external factor to life.
In regard to the relation between form and life, we can distinguish between forms that are forms of life itself, produced by that life, and abstract forms which are imposed onto life from the outside. When a form is imposed on life that is not a form of that specific mode of life (or if the form in question cannot be realized in empirical life), such an imposition always runs the risk of distorting the meanings of the particular actions or persons. But at the same time, form is necessary for life to become intelligible and unified (see Bernstein 1984: 77–80). Within the sphere of individual agency, persons face this dilemma in regard to the choice of either authentically expressing the particular meanings of their own life, risking the loss of form and, consequently, the loss of intelligible access to these meanings, or of imposing an external form as a normative demand on their life, risking distortion, inauthenticity and even the denial of life itself.
With the exception of the History of the Modern Drama (1909), Lukács’ earliest work is self-consciously essayistic in form. As Lukács explains in “On the Nature and Form of the Essay” (1911a), this is because the essay is the primary form of writing which addresses life through the medium of form (1911a: 8) and which takes form (in particular, the form of a work of art) seriously as a reality of its own. Essayistic writing, however, is not only writing about form; it also must always examine the conditions under which life can be given a form in the first place. This problem becomes virulent in modernity where the form of life is no longer something unproblematically present. Rather, the existing ways in which life could give itself a form have become problematic and are experienced as abstractions.
Following Weber, Lukács characterizes the bourgeois form of life in terms of the primacy of an ethics of work and inner strength. Corresponding to this form of life, Lukács claims, there has been a form of art which was capable of expressing an unproblematic relationship between life and form (for example, in Theodor Storm’s case, the insight that the bourgeois citizen must concentrate on his work and entrust the formation of his life to fate, see 1910a: 60). However, when that bourgeois life-form disappeared, the remaining bourgeois “way of life” transformed into a form of asceticism which became hostile against life itself. The same holds true for the corresponding movement within art of rejecting life in favor of “art for its own sake”, that is, of a form of artistic production that self-consciously (and with justification) refuses to express life because it has no foundation in a corresponding life form.
Lukács thus argues that modern art is caught up in the dilemma of having to achieve a harmony of life and form, either at the expense of life’s intensity and potentiality, or at a purely symbolic and imaginary level—by effectively withdrawing from life (an idea he discusses in reference to Novalis, see 1908: 50; see Butler 2010: 9). In both cases, art turns against life. In contrast, a genuine attempt to give “real” or “absolute life” (that is, genuinely meaningful life as opposed to the chaos of “empirical life”, see Márkus 1983: 11; Löwy 1979: 104) a distinct form necessarily involves a rejection of the meaningless necessities of empirical life. Instead, such an attempt must endorse a form of life that cannot be incorporated into ordinary life. In one of the essays published in Soul and Form, titled “The Metaphysics of Tragedy” (1910b), Lukács ascribes this task to the form of modern tragedy. When nature and fate have become “terrifyingly soulless” (1910b: 154) and any hope for a “friendly order” (ibid.) has disappeared, the tragic becomes a task—to reject ordinary life in favor of the opportunity to “live within the periphery of tragedy” (1910b: 173).
The ethical dimension of this relation between life and form becomes most explicit in Lukács’ essay on Kierkegaard and in “On Poverty of Spirit”. Kierkegaard’s rejection of Regine Olsen’s love is lauded for its expression of the need of giving one’s own empirical life a definite, unambiguous form and thereby transforming it into absolute life—in Kierkegaard’s case, by attempting to perform an authentic gesture (1910c: 28). But Kierkegaard’s ethical position suffers from a defect: Kierkegaard attempts to reconcile ordinary life with a form that is appropriate for genuine, “absolute” life (that is, he tries to live tragic life as ordinary life). But due to its inherent ambiguity and foreignness to form, ordinary life cannot ever be successfully lived in such a way (1910c: 40). Thus, Kierkegaard’s attempt to live a genuine life was doomed from the beginning.
The conclusion of this line of thought seems to point towards an insoluble dilemma. But already the 1911 essay “On Poverty of Spirit”—a fusion between an autobiographical reflection on Lukács’ role in the suicide of Irma Seidler and an examination of theoretical issues—points towards a different conclusion: an emphatic rejection of an “ethics of duty”. Lukács argues that a formal, rule-based ethics leads into alienation from life. Even though the submission to “form” that is implicit in adopting a formalist ethics is the basis from which social life becomes possible in the first place, it keeps persons from having “human relationships”. As Lukács writes, “Form […] is like a bridge that separates” (1911b: 44). Lukács contrasts such an ethics with the ideal of “goodness” which represents “real life” rather than the “impure and sterile” life of most people. “Goodness” involves a rejection of rules as well as duties towards others in favor of pure actions that might be sinful, chaotic and futile. The soul of the good person, Lukács claims, “is a pure white slate, upon which fate writes its absurd command” (1911b: 48). This anti-consequentialist and anti-deontological ethics of pure action is finally developed into a conception of “works”. Only by sacrificing themselves for the sake of works, persons (or, as Lukács’ narrator rather claims, men) can empty themselves of the psychological content of everyday life and prepare themselves for the grace of goodness. This final line of thought already points towards a social utopia: by overcoming the alienated world of “mechanical forces” (1911b: 45) through works that transform life, we may recover a genuine community with and a direct knowledge of others wherein “subject and object collapse into each other” (1911b: 46). This vision of a final overcoming of alienation seems to lead out of the theoretical impasse of Lukács’ earlier position, but only at the price of endorsing ethical decisionism and messianism.
While Lukács’ cultural criticism intends to capture distinctively modern phenomena, its claims are backed up by an aesthetic theory that aims to discover the transcendental conditions of the aesthetic that are removed from historic variability. Even though Lukács combines these elements in his writing with the theory of culture developed by Georg Simmel and with the Nietzschean idea of an intrinsic tension between life and form, his early work cannot be comprehended without considering the underlying Neo-Kantian framework (for a detailled discussion see Kavoulakos 2014). This framework is most clearly visible in his two systematic attempts to produce a philosophy of art in Heidelberg (GW 16 and 17). Here, Lukács attempts to provide a philosophical explanation of the conditions of possibility of art that takes the work of art as the fundamental phenomenon of aesthetic meaning, rather than deriving this meaning from either artistic creation or aesthetic experience.
In his early aesthetic thought, Lukács distinguishes—taking up Neo-Kantian terminology—different spheres of reality from each other. The most immediate sphere is the “reality of experience” in which everything appears as an object of qualitative experience, or (in the 1916 version) as having a given object character (Gegenständlichkeit) that is fundamentally heterogeneous. Lukács envisages two arguments concerning the role that art can play in relation to this sphere: in the 1912 Philosophy of Art, he argues that any adequate communication of meaning between persons must appear impossible from within this sphere, since the infinite qualitative differences of experience cannot ever be successfully communicated. However, the inevitable desire to communicate meaning drives people to adopt different means of communication that, even though inadequate for expressing the reality of experience, enable persons to overcome their separateness by relating to each other in terms of other spheres of reality (for example, the sphere of logical validity). While logic and ethics constitute “pure” spheres of communicable meaning, however, the categories of the aesthetic cannot be ever so fully separated from the possibility of experience.
In the 1916 Aesthetics, Lukács adopts a more radical version of this Neo-Kantian argument: whereas the reality of everyday life is characterized by a heterogeneity of forms of objects, the aesthetic sphere of validity is characterized by a distinct form of objectivity that is legislated as a norm by experience itself. Thus, the contrast between everyday life and art is not one between experience and validity but between the heterogeneity of everyday life and the homogeneous form appropriate to the autonomy of experience (GW 17: 36). Consequently, in comparison to the logical and ethical spheres of validity, aesthetics has a distinct status. While in these other spheres of validity, objective norms and subjective attitudes are fully separable, the autonomy of experience legislates a normative standard that involves a specific relationship between subjective experience and objective norm.
The value defining the aesthetic sphere, Lukács claims, can only be the work of art itself since this value is presupposed by any description of artistic production or aesthetic experience. Lukács proposes to explain the character of this distinctive value by undertaking a phenomenological analysis of artistic creation and aesthetic receptivity. Even though these activities are not constitutive for the value of works of art, they can still serve as a basis for reconstructing the independent normative status of the aesthetics. The result of this analysis is a conception of the work of art as an ideal of homogeneous unity of form and material. In the 1912 Philosophy of Art, this unity is characterized by the experiential content becoming completely communicable and containing all possible aspects of a possible experience, thus forming a “concrete totality” (GW 16: 83, 91, 112 and GW 17: 110) of its own world within itself. In contrast, in the 1916 Aesthetics, it is brought about through a process in which the constitutive function of experience becomes completely autonomous, determining both form and content. Such an ideal work of art is, in virtue of this harmony, a Utopian fulfillment of the attitudes that are already operative in the ordinary world of experience (GW 16: 82).
Works of art therefore present us with an “immanent utopia” of experience, that is, with the vision of a form of experience that is ordered and unified by a constitutive “standpoint” (GW 16: 82) such that form and content are completely appropriate for each other. Because of these features, such an experience embodies a maximum of objectivity in the subject’s relation to an object completely appropriate to its subjectivity (GW 17: 100). This finally answers the question regarding the a priori conditions of art: as an ideal of a particular kind of possible experience, the work of art is always historically specific. However, both the potentiality to become a totality in virtue of their form and the normative demand to do so are timeless, a priori conditions of the possibility of works of art in the Neo-Kantian sense (GW 16: 168).
Another aspect of Lukács’ early work is concerned with the historical changes in our relations to form. In his early analysis of the history and sociology of drama (History of the Modern Drama, 1909), Lukács develops an account of the connection between aesthetic genres and historical changes. He argues that drama is connected to specific historic circumstances: for drama to exist, there needs to be a prevailing Weltanschauung (GW 15: 44) that seeks drama as its preferred mode of expression. This tragic Weltanschauung only exists in periods of societal disintegration where individual emotions and objective facts are in a relation of mismatch so intense that they elicit heroic forms of the denial of social reality.
In opposition to mere disintegration without tragedy, Lukács claims that tragedy arises only in one particular kind of historical situation. In each society, the ruling class legitimizes its own dominance with reference to certain valuations (Wertungen). However, if that class then begins to experience these very same valuations as problematic or sterile, this signifies the beginning of its downfall (GW 15: 47). In such situations, the formal element of drama and tragedy, which involves the paradoxical relation between highly universalized form and highly individualized content, mirrors the paradoxical relation between form and life that individuals experience in their own relation to society.
In The Theory of the Novel of 1916, Lukács takes up some of these themes. At the same time, he turns towards a philosophy of history in order to clarify the relationship between historical changes of transcendental standpoints and the “pure forms” of aesthetic genres. The prime object of his discussion is the epic: Lukács claims that works of art that belong to this genre—for example Homeric epic poetry and the modern novel—must always express the objective reality of social and individual human life as it is (1916: 46). However, because of the distinctive “metaphysical conditions” of different epochs, they express this objective reality in radically different forms. Epic poetry in Homeric times takes its starting point from a world which constituted a closed totality (1916: 33), that is, a world in which life, culture, meaning, action and social institutions formed a harmonious whole. In particular, Lukács claims that in ancient Greece the “essence” of being was immanent to life rather than having to be sought out in a transcendent realm. Furthermore, there was no gap between individual consciousness and objectified meaning in the world that would have required the individual to project meaning onto the world. Individuals in ancient Greece only had to accept the totality of meaning within their world, even if they were, in some particular situation or another, unable to understand it. In contrast, modern society is constitutively alienated: merely conventional social institutions devoid of meaning exist disconnected from individuals and their highly individualized self-understanding. Therefore, in modern society meaning can only be found within the inner life of the individual and cannot become recognized in the world (1916: 61).
Starting from this description of a closed totality, Lukács claims that the intellectual history of the world is already prefigured in the cultural history of ancient Greece within the movement from epic poetry to tragedy and then to philosophy. In the course of this movement, the sources of meaning became increasingly more external to immediate life. As a consequence, Lukács argues that these three genres inhabit three different “transcendental loci” (1916: 36) concerning the question of totality. Tragedy and philosophy have already realized the loss of a meaningful totality, whereas the possibility of epic poetry depends on its immanence. As Lukács claims, this is the reason for why “art forms become subject to a historico-philosophical dialectic” (1916: 39).
The cause for this development is the loss of totality through historical changes where the objective institutions of social life became merely conventional, a purely external “second nature” (1916: 62f., 112). This alienation of the individual from her world leads to a situation of “transcendental homelessness” (1916: 40, 60) in which individuals must take up a purely normative stance of a “should be” (1916: 47) towards the world. The novel is always relating to the development of such individuals. This development can take the shape of a subjective-idealist illusion (e.g., as in “Don Quixote”) or of a disillusion, that is, of individuals understanding the impossibility of finding meaning within their world. Lukács thus argues that the novel is the form of epic writing that is appropriate for a specific moment in history. In modernity, epic writing has no longer any distinct form that could express any particular relation between life and essence within a totality. Rather, the form of the novel is an attempt to deal with the absence of this relation (1916: 59; see Jameson 1971: 172).
Lukács’ understanding of alienation as a historical loss of totality and the consequent problem of form allows him to also formulate the kernel of a Utopian vision: the very form of the novel points to the possibility of a renewed relation between individual and world where meaning can again be found. Lukács sees this utopian dimension of modern novels expressed most clearly in Goethe’s “Wilhelm Meister”, Tolstoy and Dostoyevski.
Lukács’ 1918 conversion to communism and his subsequent engagement with philosophical Marxism not only confounded his friends, even for today’s readers, it can be difficult to track the many shifts in Lukács theoretical commitments between 1918 and 1923.
In the December 1918 article on “Bolshevism as an Ethical Problem”, Lukács draws a connection between his newfound Marxist convictions and the ethical views he had previously held: whereas the historical necessity of class struggle is only a descriptive claim of Marxism, the normative, ethical demand to to establish a classless society must be separated from any issue of truth and be recognized as an Utopian form of ethical idealism, appropriate to the expression of a pure will. At this point in 1918, Lukács still thinks this insight leads to a paradox: In order for the proletarian “messianic class” (1918: 218) to overcome class society, it must first seize power by creating the most extreme form of class dominance, i.e., a dictatorship. Bolshevism thus presupposes the conviction that evil actions can produce good outcomes, or, as Lukács puts it in the essay on “Tactics and Ethics”, that tragedy cannot be avoided in revolutionary politics (1919a: 10). However, by the time History and Class Consciousness appeared, Lukács seems to have thought of himself as having found another conception of revolutionary action that paved the way for a new approach to political practice.
At the foundation of this new conception lies the theory of reification that Lukács introduces in the essay on “Reification and the consciousness of the proletariat”. This essay is not only credited to be one of the classics of Western Marxism, but also as spelling out the paradigmatic “central problem” (Brunkhorst and Krockenberger 1998) of Critical Theory.
Lukács frames his basic argument as an extension of Marx’s analysis of the “fetishism of the commodity form” in Capital I, whereby Marx refers to the phenomenon that social relations between producers of commodities appear in capitalism under the guise of objective, calculable, properties of things (“value”). The form which commodities acquire due to this fetishism (i.e. a form which furnishes them with features that make an instrumental, quantifying attitude towards the commodity appropriate) has gradually become, Lukács claims, the “universal category of society as a whole” (1923a: 86). In capitalist societies, the commodity form even becomes the dominant form of objectivity itself (Gegenständlichkeitsform, a Neo-Kantian term, see also Feenberg 2017: 113). This process has both an objective and a subjective dimension: objectively, the qualitative homogeneity and continuity of human work is destroyed when industrial work processes become rationalized in a way that is appropriate to understanding them as commodity exchanges. Their mechanization and specialization leads not only to a fragmentation of human life but also to the destruction of the “organic, irrational and qualitatively determined unity of the product” (1923a: 88). On the subjective side, reification entails a fragmentation of human experience, leading to an attitude of “contemplation” where one passively adapts to a law-like system of social “second nature” and to an objectifying stance towards one’s own mental states and capacities.
As Lukács writes about the commodity form,
[it] stamps its imprint upon the whole consciousness of man; his qualities and abilities are no longer an organic part of his personality, they are things which he can “own” or “dispose of” like the various objects of the external world. And there is no natural form in which human relations can be cast, no way in which man can bring his physical and psychic “qualities” into play without their being subjected increasingly to this reifying process. (1923a: 100)
Lukács calls this development “reification”. It is a process which affects four dimensions of social relations: the socially created features of objects (primarily their features as commodities), the relations between persons, their relations to themselves and, finally, the relations between individuals and society as a whole (Stahl 2011). The objective and subjective dimensions of the dominance of the commodity form constitute a complex of reification because the properties of objects, subjects and social relations become “thinglike” in a particular way. These properties become independent, quantifiable, non-relational features that must remain alien to any subjective meaning that one could attach to them. Additionally, by losing grip of the qualitative dimensions of their social relations, people become atomized and isolated.
With this description of capitalist society, Lukács combines Weber’s theory of rationalization, Simmel’s theory of modern culture and his own idea of a contradiction between form and life (see Dannemann 1987) with Marx’s theory of value. The resulting theory of reification as a socially induced pathology has not only had considerable influence on the Frankfurt School (for the influence of Lukács on Adorno, see Schiller 2011 and Braunstein/Duckheim 2015; for the engagement of the later generations of Frankfurt School criticism with Lukács see Habermas 1984: 355–365; Honneth 2008; cf. also Chari 2010, Kavoulakos 2017), but has also lead Lucien Goldmann to speculate that Heidegger’s Being and Time is to be read as an answer to Lukács (Goldmann 1977).
Drawing on reification theory, Lukács sketches a theory of social rationalization that goes beyond a mere description of economic relations and towards a theory of cultural change. The core of this argument is the claim that the dominance of the commodity form in the economic sphere must necessarily lead to the dominance of rational calculation and formal reason in society as a whole. Because a break with the organic unity and totality of human existence is a necessary precondition for this development, the commodity form must, over time, subject all social spheres to its rule. By forcing politics and law to adapt to the demands of capitalist exchange, the commodity form consequently transforms these spheres into a mode of rational calculability (a line of thought clearly stemming from Weber’s analyses)—which helps explain the rise of the bureaucratic state and the dominance of formal, positive law that continues to alienate individuals from society and encourages their passivity in the face of objectified, mechanical rules (1923a: 98).
This development leads into a contradictory situation both on the practical and the theoretical level: because the process of rationalization precludes the grasp of any kind of totality, it cannot ever succeed in making the whole of society subject to rational calculation for it necessarily must exclude all irrational, qualitative dimensions from such calculation. As Lukács argues, the inability of economic rationality to integrate qualitative features (e.g., of consumption) into a formal system not only explains the economic crises of capitalism but is also reflected in the inability of economic science to explain the movements of the economy (1923a: 105–107). The same holds true for a formalist model of law, which cannot theoretically acknowledge the interdependence of its principles with their social content and therefore must treat this content as an extra-legal, irrational foundation (1923a: 107–110).
This analysis of the social and cultural features of reification allows Lukács, in a third step, to present an analysis of the “antinomies of bourgeois thought” (1923a: 110). In attempting to achieve a rational system of principles, modern philosophy is always, Lukács claims, confronted with the issue of there being a “content” necessary for the application of its formal principles of knowledge, a content which cannot be integrated into a formal philosophical system—a prime example of which is Kant’s “thing in itself” (see Bernstein 1984: 15–22). Kantian dualism is nothing other than the most self-conscious expression of this “hiatus” between subject (the source of rational unity) and object (the source of non-rational content). This dualism between subject and object—and in ethics, between norms and facts—haunts modern philosophy. As Fichte and Hegel recognize, this problem arises only because modern thought takes the contemplative subject of reified self-world relations as its paradigm, ignoring the alternative of an active subject that is engaged in the production of the content. Fichte’s proposal to postulate an “identical subject-object” (that is, a subject that produces objectivity by positing objective reality as distinct from itself) is also the key to Lukács’ answer. But Fichte’s solution still suffers from an inadequacy in that he conceives of the constitutive activity still as the act of an individual subject confronted with an external, alien reality (1923a: 124).
An alternative is to be found in the idealist conception of art as an activity directed at the creation of a meaningful totality and in Schiller’s view of artistic activity, which is not an application of external, given laws but a form of play (1923a: 138). However, the conceptualization of practice from the standpoint of aesthetics obscures its historical dimension. Lukács acknowledges Hegel as the thinker who came nearest to finding a solution to this problem by recognizing that it is the totality of concrete history, understood as the expression of a subject, of a “we”, which is the only standpoint from which the antinomies between form and content can be overcome (1923a: 146f.). But Hegel adopts a mythologizing view of this subjectivity in terms of a “World Spirit” that lies beyond any concrete historical agency. The subject Hegel desperately tried to find could only be discovered by Marx—it is the proletariat to which Lukács assigns the role of the “subject-object” of history (1923a: 149).
The final step in Lukács’ argument is to show that it is only the proletariat that can understand itself as the producer of the totality of society and which is thereby able to overcome reification. Initially, both the proletariat and the bourgeoisie face the same immediate reality of an alienated world. Bourgeois thought, however, endorses this facticity and sees every possible normative stance only as a subjective projection onto a world of immediate facts. In contrast, the proletariat is unable to remain within bourgeois ideology. Lukács gives two reasons for this claim: in the 1920 essay, titled “Class Consciousness”, he distinguishes between “empirical” and rational, “imputed” class consciousness (1920a: 51 and 74) that only constitutes an “objective possibility” given the interests of the proletariat. In contrast, in the “Reification” essay, he argues that there is an intrinsic dialectics within the class consciousness of the proletariat (Arato and Breines 1979: 131–136; for an epistemological reading see Jameson 2009, 65ff.), arising from its objective position as mere object of the social process. In capitalism, the activity of workers is reduced to a completely quantifiable process. But, at the same time, workers cannot have any immediate self-consciousness of their work other than of a qualitatively determined activity. Lukács argues that this intrinsic tension in the consciousness of the worker constitutes the objective possibility of the proletariat’s grasping three important things: first, the proletariat’s own reified existence as a product of social mediation, second, the social totality and, third, the proletariat as the subject-object of that totality.
However, the process of the proletariat becoming self-conscious does not only describe a theoretical insight. By realizing that it is the subject-object of history, the proletariat discovers itself to be the subject of the process of social reproduction (see 1923a: 181; Jay 1984: 107f), not an object of contemplation. As Lukács writes, “The act of consciousness overthrows the objective form of its object” (1923a: 178). The proletariat can thus overcome reification through a practical engagement with totality—by consciously transforming it into the product of the proletariat’s collective action—which this totality in its essence has always already been. Of course, this process is, in Lukács’ mind, nothing other than the communist revolution. As many critics of Lukács have remarked (Adorno 1973: 190f., Bewes 2002), this seems to commit Lukács to the view that there can be a complete overcoming of reification resulting in a totally transparent society. However, this interpretation ignores Lukács’ insistence that the resistance against reification must be understood as a never-ending struggle (see 1923a: 199, 206; Feenberg 2011; Feenberg 2014: 116).
As Lukács’ essay on the “Problem of Organisation” (written shortly before the reification essay) shows, the distinction between “empirical” and “imputed” class consciousness had not entirely been resolved by the introduction of a dialectics of consciousness that is supposed to ground this spontaneous process (1923b). The proletarian situation does not necessarily entail an immediate consciousness of the totality. This consciousness remains only an objective possibility, always threatened by the seductions of the immediate consciousness. This makes the agency of the communist party a necessary condition for the revolution. Due to his criticism of bureaucracy, Lukács cannot endorse Lenin’s idea of the completely rationalized organization of the state (Arato and Breines 1979: 154). In his political writings immediately preceding History and Class Consciousness, he rather seems to (paradoxically) endorse both a qualified Luxemburgian view of proletarian spontaneity (for example in 1920b) and an elitist conception of party vanguardism (a “party myth”, Arato and Breines 1979: 145). The “unconditional absorption of the total personality in the praxis of the movement”, Lukács writes, is “the only possible way of bringing about an authentic freedom” (1923b: 320).
It is easy to see that the resulting conception of society that Lukács articulates owes as much to Hegel as to Marx. This inheritance commits Lukács to a number of methodological claims which put him into stark opposition not only to social democrats like Bernstein but also, somewhat unintentionally, to the orthodoxy of the Soviet party. In his essay “What is Orthodox Marxism?” (1919b), Lukács contrasts his method with social democratic economic determinism. He describes Marxism as a purely methodological commitment to Marx’s dialectics rather than as depending on any belief regarding the truth of Marx’s economic theory. Lukács even goes so far as to claim that “it is not the primacy of economic motives in historical explanation that constitutes the decisive difference between Marxism and bourgeois thought, but the point of view of totality” (1921: 27).
The primacy of the social totality not only affects the Marxist method, but also the conception of practice and the underlying social ontology: by insisting on a foundational role of practice in the social totality, Lukács makes political action rather than labor into the foundation for overcoming reification (Feenberg 1998). In his 1967 preface to the new edition of History and Class-Consciousness, Lukács acknowledges (next to a number of exercises in self-criticism, which appear both unjustified and externally motivated) that his insistence on this point meant a departure from Marx’s concept of practice (1967: xviii), at least as interpreted by orthodox Marxists: while Marx had understood practice primarily as the conscious engagement of humans with non-human nature, the self-sufficiency of the social for the very essence of reality had led Lukács to a different understanding of practice which privileges the theoretical and the political (see also Jay 1984; for a different view Feenberg 2014).
Within his social ontology, Lukács is finally committed to the claim that the totality of historical processes, rather than individual facts, are the foundation of objective reality (1923a: 184; for the resulting view of history see Merleau-Ponty 1973), leading him to a rejection of all “contemplative” epistemologies (such as Lenin’s) which rely on the idea of a simple correspondence between thoughts and facts (1923a: 199ff; see also Lichtheim 1970: 62–65; in addition, it follows from the premise that only the perspective of the social totality solves the epistemological problems of classical philosophy that Lukács must reject Engels’ claim that the experimental method is a model for the type of defetishizing praxis that can overcome the subject-object divide, see 1923a: 131–133). This ontology of pure processuality finally entails a normative conception of society that is critical towards all forms of institutional rationalization which are rejected as forms of alienation across the board. At the same time, in insisting that the emancipated society must be capable of presenting itself as a totality for its subjects, Lukács is unable to discover any resources for progress in the differentiation of social spheres (Arato and Breines 1979: 155).
By many of those who were looking for a sophisticated Marxist philosophy, History and Class Consciousness was judged to be a supremely important book (as for example by Karl Korsch and Ernst Bloch, see Bloch 1923). The party orthodoxy, however, was not quite so enamored. In Germany and Hungary, party intellectuals such as Hermann Duncker and Laszlo Rudas disapproved of the book because of its idealist tendencies, culminating in its condemnation by Grigory Zinoviev in his opening address to the June 1924 World Congress of the Third International (Arato and Breines 1979: 180). Lukács’ hastily composed 1924 study about Lenin (see 1924) finally resolved the tension between a Luxemburgian view of revolutionary politics as an expression of the spontaneity of the proletariat and a Leninist conception of the party as vanguard agent—a tension which characterizes History and Class Consciousness (see Feenberg 1988)—in favor of the latter. Thus, already at this point in time, Lukács revises his views in the face of orthodox criticism, anticipating a theoretical development towards a more traditional form of Marxism to which he subscribes for the remainder of his life (see also the unpublished defense of History and Class Consciousness in 1925a and Löwy 2011).
While the condemnation of Lukács’ work by party intellectuals (and Lukács’ compromising reaction) might have been motivated by political expediency, there were real shortcomings in the conception of society and in the conception of political practice contained in History and Class Consciousness: In particular, the idea of the proletariat as the “subject-object” of history seemed to entail a Fichtean conception of the self-constitutive capacities of the revolutionary agent, unlimited by historical circumstances and, correspondingly, of a self-constitutive form of practice, hostile to any objectivity. This conception imports moments that are alien to a Marxist view of history into his theory (even on a non-orthodox reading of Marx). In spite of these objections, in his later work, Lukács remains committed to the idea that understanding society as a totality must be the basis of the social ontology of a non-reductive Marxism. He admits, however, that the notion of totality as the product of a collective subject, as he developed it in 1923, needed to be modified in order to remedy these problems.
These problems motivate Lukács’ turn to another model of practice—a model of political and social practice which he attempts to work out up until the end of his life. While already the critique of Fichteanism in his writings between 1923 and 1928—for example in his review of an edition of Lasalle’s letters (1925b) and in a short piece on Moses Hess (1926)—constitutes a significant step towards such a new model, it was impossible for him to write anything controversial on contemporary Marxism after the failure of the “Blum Theses”. Instead, he tackled the philosophical foundations of these problems in the context of a new reading of the philosophical tradition, and especially of Hegel.
Already in the reification essay, Lukács describes Hegel’s philosophy as the only “bourgeois” theory of history and freedom that comes close to a solution of the problem of reification due to its insight that the abyss between subject and object can only be overcome by seeing both as elements within an process that actively produces the very distinction between them. Thus, Lukács remains committed to the claim that Marx social theory must be read as a critical completion—rather than as a rejection—of Hegel. This means, however, that he must show that the Hegelian idealist metaphysics that Marx rejects does not exhaust Hegel’s philosophy. His writings on Hegel, most prominently The Young Hegel (1948) and the relevant sections in the Ontology of Social Being, can be read as a defense of this commitment. In the former work, Lukács argues that Hegel’s development of dialectics was informed by his reading of the British economists Steuart and Smith. According to Lukács, this empirical grounding enabled Hegel’s dialectics to draw on an idea of objective, social-historical progress and understand modern society and economy as a processual totality that is structured by contradictions. Hegel’s view of an ontological dialectics must therefore be read as reflecting the structure of objective social reality. The resulting “objectivism” allows Hegel to avoid the subjectivist conception of dialectics that (as Lukács alleges) Kant and Fichte still subscribed to. Hegel, however, subordinates this objectivist ontology to logic in the course of the development of his system. It is this “logicism”, i.e., the primacy of categories over being, which leads Hegel to postulate the idealist conception of the “subject-object” which is needed to explain the identity of logical categories and ontological determinations. This split between a “genuine” dialectics which reflects the objective contradications of society (even if in an idealist manner) and a “logicist” system is the main argument in Lukács’ discussion of Hegel in the Ontology (see GW 13: 489f., 506, 520–523)
Hegel’s philosophy also helps Lukács to solve another problem with his own model of praxis developed in History and Class Consciousness: the problematic relation between objectivation (Vergegenständlichung), externalization (Entäußerung) and alienation (Entfremdung). For Hegel’s idealism, the objectivation of spirit is a necessary but deficient stage of its development that has to be succeeded by a reappropriation of the externalized content (see also 1967: xxiv; 1948: 539–543; GW 13: 468–558). This claim directly touches upon the theory of reification: On the one hand, Lukács claims that Hegel is correct in seeing the products of human labor—and therefore also, indirectly, history—as the result of the externalization of the intentions of individuals, but that he is mistaken in describing nature as an objectivation of a (transpersonal) “spirit”. On the other hand, Hegel’s theory of externalization as applied to labor also proves to be an advancement beyond Lukács’ earlier thought. Hegel sees externalization (that is, the fact that the objects of our labor and the institutions of society are independent of our consciousness) not as a deficiency, but rather as a necessary stage in the development of self-consciousness. On this view, the externalization of the social is not problematic in itself. Rather, it is alienation (the causes of which Marx uncovered) that should be the object of the critique of reification (see also Pitkin 1987). This distinction entails the possibility of a critique of reification that does not require a complete reappropriation of objective social forms by a collective subject. Rather, Hegel’s thought suggests a conception of political praxis that acknowledges the mutual dialectical dependence of subject and object on each other (and thus avoids a naive instrumentalism in regards to social institutions) and avoids the reduction of the political totality to the expression of a privileged subject-object (an insight that Feenberg 2014 diagnoses to be already present in History and Class Consciousness).
A second, much more problematic set of Lukács’ commitments becomes explicit in his writings between the 1930s and the 1950s. This concerns his conviction that, after Hegel, modern thought has become sharply divided into the two opposing tendencies of Marxist dialectics and of bourgeois “irrationalism”. Lukács’ view that virtually all non-Marxist theorists after Hegel—including Schelling, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche and Heidegger—can be subsumed under the label of irrationalism (a blanket term which, depending on the context, refers to everything from theories of “intellectual intuition”, ontological subjectivism, and “aristocratic” epistemological positions to the denial of progress in history) is perhaps motivated by an earnest desire to apply a method of “immanent critique” (see Aronowitz 2011) to the developments within philosophy that have facilitated the rise of National Socialism. Some of his arguments against Heidegger also resemble Adorno’s critique (see also Adorno 1997). But overall, the philosophical arguments for the simplistic distinction between progressive materialism and irrationalism—in particular those that he presents in The Destruction of Reason (according to George Lichtheim “the worst book he ever wrote”, Lichtheim 1970: 68)—are dogmatic and superficial. A number of particularly problematic claims are made in the postscript to the Destruction where Lukács not only defends the Soviet Union under Stalin, but also accuses Bertrand Russell of being secretly religious (1954: 808) and characterizes Wittgenstein and the pragmatists as proponents of a form of subjectivism that facilitates the rise of a new fascism (1954: 782ff.; for other examples, see the unpublished 1933a).
The most fundamental level on which Lukács develops his revised model of Hegelian Marxism is one of ontology, or, more specifically, of an “ontology of social being”. This ontology is intended, at least outwardly, to be a faithful interpretation of the ontological implications of Marxism. However, the way in which Lukács develops these ontological foundations—as well as his extended and sympathetic discussion of Nicolai Hartmann—betrays the way in which they function to support his own, Hegelian Marxism against dogmatic Historical Materialism (although, as Heller 1983 notes, not without a number of unsolved contradictions).
In terms of a general ontology, Lukács claims that we can distinguish three levels of being in the world: material or inorganic being, organic life and social reality (GW 13: 22). All three levels are distinguished by a division between the genuine essence of entities and their appearance. While on all three levels, entities appear as fixed objects, their real essence is always that of interrelated, irreversible processes (GW 13: 240). This entails that the basic form of all being is temporality and historicity (GW 13: 228). Lukács claims that his position on this point takes up insights from Hegel, while avoiding the “logicism” of his ontology and his teleological metaphysics, allowing only for causal, not teleological determinations of these processes in the inorganic and organic case.
While his general ontology remains rather underdeveloped and is not informed by much knowledge of concurrent philosophical developments (apart from the mentioned discussion of Hartmann), Lukács’ theory of social reality has more contemporary relevance. Social reality, Lukács claims, differs from the other levels of reality insofar as it is, in contrast to them, not only governed by causal, non-teleological laws. Social reality also contains an element of teleology as a result of “teleological positing” (GW 13: 20; 1971c: 12ff.). Due to their ability to perform labor, humans can “posit” functions or goals that are to govern the natural, causal processes that they manipulate. By choosing one of the potential results of the employment of their natural and technological capacities as the correct one, individuals can create a distinction between successful and unsuccessful execution of their intended actions in labor. This, Lukács’ argues, introduces normative distinctions or values into the world (see 1971b: 75f and 153–156; 1968: 140). This not only explains “use value” in the sense of economic utility, but—because the economic development of society over time necessarily produces forms of social reality which are independent from the economy—Historical Materialism can also allow for forms of socially instituted value that are irreducible to utility (1971b: 153). In particular, Lukács claims that the objectification of human intentions in institutions enables us to understand the existence of objective values as products of social-historical developments without sliding into historical relativism. However, as some of his own students notice, this explanation remains too unclear to solve the problem of normativity for Marxism (see Fehér et al., 1983). The same doubts remain in regard to Lukács’ further claim that there is one fundamental, immanent value of social history, namely the unfettered development of human capacities (GW 14: 153).
Because Lukács sees the process of labor as the foundation of all social and normative phenomena (see also 1971c: 65; Thompson 2011), the totality of society can be described as the totality of all relations between the teleological acts of “positing” conditions of success in labor. Even though Lukács acknowledges intentional consciousness as an irreducible factor in these acts (see Lukács 1968: 138), they are still determined by the objective, historical development of social relations both in terms of the human desires that drive them, in terms of the systemic interdependence of their unintended consequences and in terms of the technological feasibility of their results. Consequently, over time, the social becomes more and more determined by its own history, rather than by nature alone (1971b: 75). Nevertheless, the positing of teleology is never completely causally determined by society because it always involves an individual’s choice between alternative goals. Thus, the very structure of labor is, Lukács claims, the basis of individual freedom and the basis of individual personality (character being the continual process of choosing between alternatives and forming oneself thereby, see GW 13: 62ff).
From these ontological commitments, it follows that the existence of the social totality depends on the intentionality which guides individual acts of labor and vice versa (see Tertullian 1988). Lukács therefore describes social phenomena—as language and institutions—as modifications and “mediations” of the relations of the labor process. That is, they are media of “indirect” teleological positing because they enable forms of action which do not directly modify nature but which indirectly aspire to bring other persons to do so (GW 14: 172; 1968: 142). Even though he remains committed to the primacy of labor, Lukács allows for these linguistic and institutional mediations to acquire a dynamic of their own over time, becoming independent of the goal of dominating nature, in particular because they allow for a generalization of the cognitive grasp of particular phenomena (see GW 13: 47; GW 14: 165ff, 342–357) and an increase of distance between subject and objects (1971c: 100). This understanding of institutions entails that politics, as a form of action directed towards the social totality as a whole, must treat this totality, on the one hand, as being dependent on natural and biological facts that limit its potential transformations and, on the other hand, as increasingly being determined by laws of its own (GW 14: 432).
Lukács’ conception of individuality as a product of the choice between alternatives within a socially determined totality finally leads to a theory of alienation that partially replaces the theory of reification of the younger Lukács. Whereas the latter theory was closely connected to a theory of collective reappropriation of society, Lukács describes alienation in the Ontology as primarily the result of social conditions that make individuals into merely “particular” personalities (GW 14: 530), instead of allowing them to develop their capacities to the degree that the present development of productive forces could make possible. This means that alienation (for instance, the alienation brought about by excessive professional specialization) must be understood as the socially induced incapacity of individuals to participate in the “species being” or the social totality. The overcoming of alienation thus always demands—along with social changes—subjective transformation, i.e., individual change (GW 14: 551). This finally points towards the ethical dimension of the Ontology. Lukács claims that there is a normative ideal immanent in society as such, namely, the ideal of social relations that allow all persons to fully participate in the social totality with their whole personality and thereby realizing their universal nature.
Compared with History and Class Consciousness, the normative ideal of the Ontology points to a radically different conception of political action. In the Ontology, it is not the self-realization of the collective subject-object in history that is the defining moment of revolutionary politics, but rather the gradual realization of the universal nature of humans in their interaction with society and nature. This suggests a conception of political praxis which amounts to a form of humanist, democratic communism and which respects the insight that Lukács had derived from his re-interpretation of Hegel’s philosophy: politics must be understood as a collective coming to terms with a dialectics between subjective and objective elements within a social totality rather than as the becoming conscious of the identical subject-object of history.
While Lukács only makes his ontological commitments explicit towards the end of his life, they inform the development of his aesthetics from the 1930s on. From the general materialist premises of his ontology and from his rejection of the epistemology of History and Class Consciousness in favor of the Leninist alternative (see 1938), it follows that cultural and mental phenomena must always be seen as reflections (or “mirroring”, Widerspiegelungen) of an objective reality (GW 11: 22, 55).
Like science and ethics, art breaks with the immediacy of our everyday practical engagements that dominates the more common forms of reflection (GW 11: 207, 214). Aesthetic reflections of reality, however, differ from science (or, more generally, from conceptual and theoretical reflections) in three regards: First, while scientific knowledge presupposes a “deanthropomorphization” of the subject matter (meaning that reality is presented as independent from human desires or subjectivity), aesthetic subject matter remains anthropomorphized as far as art presents reality in the form of inner experience. Thus, aesthetic representation always remains connected to a possible “evocation” of reactions of a human subject (GW 11: 438). Second, while science is always conceptually mediated, art breaks with the immediacy of everyday life in favor of a new immediacy of experience (GW 11: 237, 509, 513). And third, while science reflects reality in the form of general laws, aesthetic representation is always bound to represent universal aspects of the essence of reality in the form of the individuality (or specificity) of the work of art (Lukács’ term for individuality is Besonderheit, a concept which he takes up from Hegel’s Science of Logic where it describes the dialectical sublation of both generality and particularity within the “notion”).
According to this conception of art as a mode of reflection, the function of a work of art is to present humans with the totality of the objective, historical reality within an “homogeneous medium” (such as pure visibility in painting or poetic language in poetry, see GW 11: 642). The employment of such a medium makes it possible for art to single out and represent the universal aspects of a given form of human reality as a “closed world-in-itself” or as an “intensive totality” (GW 11: 238, 461, 774; GW 12: 232). As Lukács argues (GW 11: 660), the medium of each specific form of art establishes strict laws that allow the work of art to adequately present the whole world of humanity from a specific standpoint. For this reason, such works of art allow us to comprehend the universal aspects of our existence and to consciously participate in the collective life of humanity (GW 11: 519–530). This effect of art Lukács describes as “defetishization” (GW 11: ch. 9), anticipating the ethical demand of overcoming alienation that he formulates in the Ontology. A successful work of art can thus have the effect of “catharsis” (GW 11: 811), transforming the “whole person” of everyday life (the person who is entangled in their diverse relationships) into a “person as a whole” (the person who realizes their humanity by acquiring a sense of self-consciousness regarding the richness of human relations that constitute the historical development of humankind).
Even though they represent objective reality, works of art are, in virtue of this mode of reflection, subject-dependent because their character is constituted by their capacity to evoke a subjective reaction: i.e., an understanding of how the world that is revealed in art is appropriate for the comprehending subject in its universal nature (GW 11: 305). This reaction is not only one of passive acknowledgment; it also actively transforms the subject by facilitating a consciousness of that very universal nature. Thus, in the work of art, subjectivity and objectivity are mutually constitutive for each other. In a transformed sense—as Lukács explicitly acknowledges (GW 11: 582; GW 12: 217)—the subject-object of idealism is an appropriate concept for works of art (which, as one might add, therefore fulfills Lukács’ aspirations for the socialist revolution that he had to renounce both politically and philosophically). Of course, in this new sense, the term “subject-object” no longer signifies a privileged agent becoming self-conscious, but only the interdependence of subjectivity and objectivity in a specific sphere of experience.
Lukács makes a similar conceptual move by endorsing the claim that all consciousness is a reflection of reality. On the one hand, this signals a revision of the epistemological position he had defended in History and Class Consciousness (where he had criticized the distinction between a seemingly objective reality and purely subjective forms of perception) in favor of Lenin’s theory of consciousness. On the other hand, Lukács is keen to preserve—at least within the boundaries of the aesthetic—room for the idea that some insights can be had only in relation to a totality that encompasses subjectivity and objectivity.
Lukács no longer derives his aesthetic commitments at this point from purely philosophical premises—as he did in his Heidelberg writings—but rather builds on anthropological premises (especially concerning the concept of everyday life, in regard to which he notes the similarity between his analysis and Heidegger’s notion of practical engagement, see GW 11: 68–71, for related points on the Ontology see Joós 1982), psychological theorizing (proposing an extension of Pavlov’s behaviorist classification of signal systems, see GW 12: 11–191) and a speculative notion of world history. The most important concept binding these premises together is the idea of mimesis. Mimetic behavior, Lukács argues, is a fundamental way of human coping with the world and the source of both magic and art. Through the mimetic imitation of natural processes, humans acquire the ability to represent the salient aspects of the world in a closed and totalizing manner, and they gradually learn to separate such imitations from the necessity of immediate reaction. In contrast to magic which does not separate reflection and objective causation, mimesis in art is consciously taken as a reflection and evokes the aesthetic effect in its audience specifically in virtue of this feature (GW 11: 382). In other words, while both art and science overcome the superstition of magic, only art can retain the mimetic dimension of representation.
Lukács’ commitment to a conception of the work of art as a closed totality, structured by the strict laws of its medium and objectively reflecting the development of humanity in the mode of mimetic evocation, has considerable implications for his own judgments as an aesthetic theorist. His writings on literary realism that he published from the 1930s to the 1950s—especially “Realism in the Balance” (1938), The Historical Novel (1955), and The Meaning of Contemporary Realism (1955)—display to various degrees a mixture of philosophical insight and Stalinist orthodoxy. In any case, they are animated by strong commitment to the superiority of realism, as exemplified by Balzac, Tolstoy, Gorky (see GW 5) and Thomas Mann (see 1949), that he contrasts to the “decadent” avant-garde literature of his times. This position of his drew sharp criticism, for example from Seghers, Brecht and Adorno (see Lukács 1981; Brecht 1977; Adorno 1972; for the Lukács-Brecht debate see Pike 1985).
However, as far as Lukács’ commitment to realism reflects the demand that works of art should present a totality of meaning that is not alien to the life of individuals, but rather overcomes the alienation they suffer from in everyday life, it expresses (even in its most distorted versions) an intuition that sustains Lukács’ work from the beginning: the desire for an overcoming of the tension between human life and the objective social forms that constitute modern society.
At various points in his life, Lukács had rejected the pessimism of his youth. First, he had endorsed an optimism concerning the capacity of the proletariat to constitute such a totality in society through a revolutionary overcoming of reification; later on, this optimism was modified to encompass the ever increasing human capacities to become self-conscious of their universal character through a reflection of the existing social totality in the totality of the work of art. Thus, even at his most conservative moments as a proponent of Socialist Realism, Lukács is motivated by a keen intuition concerning the tragic consequences of this aspect of modern culture and, as the constant revisions of his position show, by a sensitivity to the inappropriateness of all conceptions of the human condition which do not appropriately deal with this problem.
The only English-language biography of Lukács is Kadarkay, A., 1991, Georg Lukács. Life, Thought, and Politics, Cambridge, MA: Blackwell. In German, there is an extended autobiographical interview in Lukács, G., 1980, Gelebtes Denken, Frankfurt a.M.: Suhrkamp, and a collection of photographs and original sources in Raddatz, F., 1972, Georg Lukács in Selbstzeugnissen und Bilddokumenten, Reinbek: Rowohlt, 1972.
There is no complete edition of Lukács’ works in English. The most accessible collection is the (incomplete) German edition of his works:
Lukács, G., 1968–1981, Gesammelte Werke, Darmstadt: Luchterhand (cited as GW).
Cited Primary Sources
This list comprises the bibliographical entries for the works of Lukács that are cited in the main article. English translations are cited where available. If no translation is available, Gesammelte Werke are cited. In the remaining cases, the original publication is cited. Sources are listed by original publication date.
- 1908, “On the Romantic Philosophy of Life. Novalis,” in Soul and Form, A. Bostock (trans.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1971, pp. 42–54.
- 1909, The Sociology of Modern Drama, Oshkosh, WI: Green Mountain Editions, 1965 (A chapter from Lukács’ dissertation which is published in its entirety in GW 15).
- 1910a, “The Bourgeois Way of Life and Art for Art’s Sake. Theodor Storm,” in Soul and Form, A. Bostock (trans.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1971, pp. 55–78.
- 1910b, “The Metaphysics of Tragedy. Paul Ernst,” in Soul and Form, A. Bostock (trans.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1971, pp. 152–174.
- 1910c, “The Foundering of Form against Life. Sören Kierkegaard and Regine Olsen,” in Soul and Form, A. Bostock (trans.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1971, pp. 28–41.
- 1911a, “On the Nature and Form of the Essay,” in Soul and Form, A. Bostock (trans.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1971, pp. 1–18.
- 1911b, “On Poverty of Spirit,” in The Lukács Reader, A. Kadarkay (ed.), Cambridge, MA: Blackwell, 1995, pp. 42–56.
- 1916, The Theory of the Novel, A. Bostock (trans.), London: Merlin, 1971.
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