G.W.F. Hegel’s aesthetics, or philosophy of art, forms part of the extraordinarily rich German aesthetic tradition that stretches from J.J. Winckelmann’s Thoughts on the Imitation of the Painting and Sculpture of the Greeks (1755) and G.E. Lessing’s Laocoon (1766) through Immanuel Kant’s Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790) and Friedrich Schiller’s Letters on the Aesthetic Education of Man (1795) to Friedrich Nietzsche’s Birth of Tragedy (1872) and (in the twentieth century) Martin Heidegger’s The Origin of the Work of Art (1935–6) and T.W. Adorno’s Aesthetic Theory (1970). Hegel was influenced in particular by Winckelmann, Kant and Schiller, and his own thesis of the “end of art” (or what has been taken to be that thesis) has itself been the focus of close attention by Heidegger and Adorno. Hegel’s philosophy of art is a wide ranging account of beauty in art, the historical development of art, and the individual arts of architecture, sculpture, painting, music and poetry. It contains distinctive and influential analyses of Egyptian art, Greek sculpture, and ancient and modern tragedy, and is regarded by many as one of the greatest aesthetic theories to have been produced since Aristotle’s Poetics.
- 1. Hegel’s Knowledge of Art
- 2. Hegel’s Texts and Lectures on Aesthetics
- 3. Art, Religion and Philosophy in Hegel’s System
- 4. Kant, Schiller and Hegel on Beauty and Freedom
- 5. Art and Idealization
- 6. Hegel’s Systematic Aesthetics or Philosophy of Art
- 7. Conclusion
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Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit (1807) contains chapters on the ancient Greek “religion of art” (Kunstreligion) and on the world-view presented in Sophocles’ Antigone and Oedipus the King. His philosophy of art proper, however, forms part of his philosophy (rather than phenomenology) of spirit. The Phenomenology can be regarded as the introduction to Hegel’s philosophical system. The system itself comprises three parts: logic, philosophy of nature, and philosophy of spirit, and is set out (in numbered paragraphs) in Hegel’s Encyclopaedia of the philosophical Sciences (1817, 1827, 1830). The philosophy of spirit is in turn divided into three sections: on subjective, objective and absolute spirit. Hegel’s philosophy of art or “aesthetics” constitutes the first sub-section of his philosophy of absolute spirit, and is followed by his philosophy of religion and his account of the history of philosophy.
Hegel’s philosophy of art provides an a priori derivation—from the very concept of beauty itself—of various forms of beauty and various individual arts. In marked contrast to Kant, however, Hegel weaves into his philosophical study of beauty numerous references to and analyses of individual works of art—to such an extent, indeed, that his aesthetics constitutes, in Kai Hammermeister’s words, “a veritable world history of art” (Hammermeister, 24).
Hegel read both Greek and Latin (indeed, he wrote his diary partly in Latin from the age of fourteen); he also read English and French. He was thus able to study the works of Homer, Aeschylus, Sophocles, Euripides, Virgil, Shakespeare and Molière in the original languages. He never travelled to Greece or Italy, but he did undertake several long journeys from Berlin (where he was appointed Professor in 1818) to Dresden (1820, 1821, 1824), the Low Countries (1822, 1827), Vienna (1824) and Paris (1827). On these journeys he saw Raphael’s Sistine Madonna and several paintings by Correggio (in Dresden), Rembrandt’s Night Watch (in Amsterdam), the central section of the van Eyck brothers’ Adoration of the Lamb (in Ghent)—the wing panels were at that time in Berlin—and “famous items by the noblest masters one has seen a hundred times in copper engravings: Raphael, Correggio, Leonardo da Vinci, Titian” (in Paris) (Hegel: The Letters, 654). He liked to visit the theatre and opera, both on his travels and in Berlin, and he was acquainted with leading singers, such as Anna Milder-Hauptmann (who sang in the first production of Beethoven’s Fidelio in 1814), as well as the composer Felix Mendelssohn-Bartholdy (whose revival of J.S. Bach’s St Matthew Passion Hegel attended in March 1829). Hegel was also on close personal terms with Goethe and knew his drama and poetry especially well (as he did those of Friedrich Schiller).
Adorno complains that “Hegel and Kant [ … ] were able to write major aesthetics without understanding anything about art” (Adorno, 334). This may or may not be true of Kant, but it is clearly quite untrue of Hegel: he had an extensive knowledge and a good understanding of many of the great works of art in the Western tradition. Nor was Hegel’s knowledge and interest restricted to Western art: he read (in translation) works of Indian and Persian poetry, and he saw at first hand works of Egyptian art in Berlin (Pöggeler 1981, 206–8). Hegel’s philosophy of art is thus an a priori derivation of the various forms of beauty that, pace Adorno, is informed and mediated by a thorough knowledge and understanding of individual works of art from around the world.
Hegel’s published thoughts on aesthetics are to be found in pars. 556–63 of the 1830 Encyclopaedia. Hegel also held lectures on aesthetics in Heidelberg in 1818 and in Berlin in 1820/21 (winter semester), 1823 and 1826 (summer semesters), and 1828/29 (winter semester). Transcripts of Hegel’s lectures made by his students in 1820/21, 1823, 1826 and 1828/29 have now been published (though so far only the 1823 lectures have been translated into English) (see Bibliography). In 1835 (and then again in 1842) one of Hegel’s students, Heinrich Gustav Hotho, published an edition of Hegel’s lectures on aesthetics based on a manuscript of Hegel’s (now lost) and a series of lecture transcripts. This is available in English as: G.W.F. Hegel, Aesthetics. Lectures on Fine Art, trans. T.M. Knox, 2 vols. (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975). Most of the secondary literature on Hegel’s aesthetics (in English and German) makes reference to Hotho’s edition. Yet according to one of the leading specialists on Hegel’s aesthetics, Annemarie Gethmann-Siefert, Hotho distorted Hegel’s thought in various ways: he gave Hegel’s account of art a much stricter systematic structure than Hegel himself had given it, and he supplemented Hegel’s account with material of his own (PKÄ, xiii–xv). Gethmann-Siefert argues, therefore, that we should not rely on Hotho’s edition for our understanding of Hegel’s aesthetics, but should instead base our interpretation on the available lecture transcripts.
Since Hegel’s manuscript, on which Hotho based much of his edition, has been lost, it is no longer possible to determine with certainty to what extent (if at all) Hotho did in fact distort Hegel’s account of art. It should also be noted that Gethmann-Siefert’s own interpretation of Hegel’s aesthetics has been called into question (see Houlgate 1986a). Nevertheless Gethmann-Siefert is right to encourage readers with a knowledge of German to consult the published transcripts, since they contain a wealth of important material, and in some cases material that is missing from the Hotho edition (such as the brief reference to Caspar David Friedrich in the 1820/21 lectures [VÄ, 192]).
Hegel’s philosophy of art has provoked considerable debate since his death in 1831. Does he believe that only Greek art is beautiful? Does he hold that art comes to an end in the modern age? The answers one gives to such questions should, however, be offered with a degree of caution, for, sadly, there is no fully worked out philosophy of art by Hegel that was officially endorsed by Hegel himself. The paragraphs in the Encyclopaedia are written by Hegel, but they are very brief and condensed and were intended to be supplemented by his lectures; the transcripts of the lectures are written by students of Hegel (some taken down in class, some compiled afterwards from notes taken in class); and the “standard” edition of Hegel’s lectures is a work put together by his student, Hotho (albeit using a manuscript by Hegel himself). There is, therefore, no definitive edition of Hegel’s fully developed aesthetic theory that would trump all others and settle all debate.
Hegel’s philosophy of art forms part of his overall philosophical system. In order to understand his philosophy of art, therefore, one must understand the main claims of his philosophy as a whole. Hegel argues in his speculative logic that being is to be understood as self-determining reason or “Idea” (Idee). In the philosophy of nature, however, he goes on to show that logic tells only half the story: for such reason is not something abstract—is not a disembodied logos—but takes the form of rationally organized matter. What there is, according to Hegel, is thus not just pure reason but physical, chemical and living matter that obeys rational principles.
Life is more explicitly rational than mere physical matter because it is more explicitly self-determining. Life itself becomes more explicitly rational and self-determining when it becomes conscious and self-conscious—that is, life that can imagine, use language, think and exercise freedom. Such self-conscious life Hegel calls “spirit” (Geist). Reason, or the Idea, comes to be fully self-determining and rational, therefore, when it takes the form of self-conscious spirit. This occurs, in Hegel’s view, with the emergence of human existence. Human beings, for Hegel, are thus not just accidents of nature; they are reason itself—the reason inherent in nature—that has come to life and come to consciousness of itself. Beyond human beings (or other finite rational beings that might exist on other planets), there is no self-conscious reason in Hegel’s universe.
In his philosophy of objective spirit Hegel analyses the institutional structures that are required if spirit—that is, humanity—is to be properly free and self-determining. These include the institutions of right, the family, civil society and the state. In the philosophy of absolute spirit Hegel then analyses the different ways in which spirit articulates its ultimate, “absolute” understanding of itself. The highest, most developed and most adequate understanding of spirit is attained by philosophy (the bare bones of whose understanding of the world have just been sketched). Philosophy provides an explicitly rational, conceptual understanding of the nature of reason or the Idea. It explains precisely why reason must take the form of space, time, matter, life and self-conscious spirit.
In religion—above all in Christianity—spirit gives expression to the same understanding of reason and of itself as philosophy. In religion, however, the process whereby the Idea becomes self-conscious spirit is represented—in images and metaphors—as the process whereby “God” becomes the “Holy Spirit” dwelling in humanity. Furthermore, this process is one in which we put our faith and trust: it is the object of feeling and belief, rather than conceptual understanding.
In Hegel’s view, philosophy and religion—which is to say, Hegel’s own speculative philosophy and Christianity—both understand the same truth. Religion, however, believes in a representation of the truth, whereas philosophy understands that truth with complete conceptual clarity. It may seem strange that we would need religion, if we have philosophy: surely the latter makes the former redundant. For Hegel, however, humanity cannot live by concepts alone, but also needs to picture, imagine, and have faith in the truth. Indeed, Hegel claims that it is in religion above all that “a nation defines what it considers to be true” (Lectures on the Philosophy of World History, 105).
Art, for Hegel, also gives expression to spirit’s understanding of itself. It differs from philosophy and religion, however, by expressing spirit’s self-understanding not in pure concepts, or in the images of faith, but in and through objects that have been specifically made for this purpose by human beings. Such objects—conjured out of stone, wood, color, sound or words—render the freedom of spirit visible or audible to an audience. In Hegel’s view, this sensuous expression of free spirit constitutes beauty. The purpose of art, for Hegel, is thus the creation of beautiful objects in which the true character of freedom is given sensuous expression.
The principal aim of art is not, therefore, to imitate nature, to decorate our surroundings, to prompt us to engage in moral or political action, or to shock us out of our complacency. It is to allow us to contemplate and enjoy created images of our own spiritual freedom—images that are beautiful precisely because they give expression to our freedom. Art’s purpose, in other words, is to enable us to bring to mind the truth about ourselves, and so to become aware of who we truly are. Art is there not just for art’s sake, but for beauty’s sake, that is, for the sake of a distinctively sensuous form of human self-expression and self-understanding.
Hegel’s close association of art with beauty and freedom shows his clear indebtedness to Kant and Schiller. Kant also maintained that our experience of beauty is an experience of freedom. He argued, however, that beauty is not itself an objective property of things. When we judge that a natural object or a work of art is beautiful, on Kant’s view, we are indeed making a judgment about an object, but we are asserting that the object has a certain effect on us (and that it should have the same effect on all who view it). The effect produced by the “beautiful” object is to set our understanding and imagination in “free play” with one another, and it is the pleasure generated by this free play that leads us to judge the object to be beautiful (Kant, 98, 102–3).
In contrast to Kant, Schiller understands beauty to be a property of the object itself. It is the property, possessed by both living beings and works of art, of appearing to be free when in fact they are not. As Schiller puts it in the “Kallias” letters, beauty is “freedom in appearance, autonomy in appearance” (Schiller, 151). Schiller insists that freedom itself is something “noumenal” (to use Kant’s terminology) and so can never actually manifest itself in the realm of the senses. We can never see freedom at work in, or embodied in, the world of space and time. In the case of beautiful objects, therefore—whether they are the products of nature or human imagination—“it is all that matters [ … ] that the object appears as free, not that it really is so” (Schiller, 151).
Hegel agrees with Schiller (against Kant) that beauty is an objective property of things. In his view, however, beauty is the direct sensuous manifestation of freedom, not merely the appearance or imitation of freedom. It shows us what freedom actually looks like and sounds like when it gives itself sensuous expression (albeit with varying degrees of idealization). Since true beauty is the direct sensuous expression of the freedom of spirit, it must be produced by free spirit for free spirit, and so cannot be a mere product of nature. Nature is capable of a formal beauty, and life is capable of what Hegel calls “sensuous” beauty (PK, 197), but true beauty is found only in works of art that are freely created by human beings to bring before our minds what it is to be free spirit.
Beauty, for Hegel, has certain formal qualities: it is the unity or harmony of different elements in which these elements are not just arranged in a regular, symmetrical pattern but are unified organically. Hegel gives an example of genuinely beautiful form in his discussion of Greek sculpture: the famous Greek profile is beautiful, we are told, because the forehead and the nose flow seamlessly into one another, in contrast to the Roman profile in which there is a much sharper angle between the forehead and nose (Aesthetics, 2: 727–30).
Beauty, however, is not just a matter of form; it is also a matter of content. This is one of Hegel’s most controversial ideas, and is one that sets him at odds with those modern artists and art-theorists who insist that art can embrace any content we like and, indeed, can dispense with content altogether. As we have seen, the content that Hegel claims is central and indispensable to genuine beauty (and therefore genuine art) is the freedom and richness of spirit. To put it another way, that content is the Idea, or absolute reason, as self-knowing spirit. Since the Idea is pictured in religion as “God,” the content of truly beautiful art is in one respect the divine. Yet, as we have seen above, Hegel argues that the Idea (or “God”) comes to consciousness of itself only in and through finite human beings. The content of beautiful art must thus be the divine in human form or the divine within humanity itself (as well as purely human freedom).
Hegel recognizes that art can portray animals, plants and inorganic nature, but he sees it as art’s principal task to present divine and human freedom. In both cases, the focus of attention is on the human figure in particular. This is because, in Hegel’s view, the most appropriate sensuous incarnation of reason and the clearest visible expression of spirit is the human form. Colors and sounds by themselves can certainly communicate a mood, but only the human form actually embodies spirit and reason. Truly beautiful art thus shows us sculpted, painted or poetic images of Greek gods or of Jesus Christ—that is, the divine in human form—or it shows us images of free human life itself.
Art, for Hegel, is essentially figurative. This is not because it seeks to imitate nature, but because its purpose is to express and embody free spirit and this is achieved most adequately through images of human beings. (We will consider the exceptions to this—architecture and music—below.) More specifically, art’s role is to bring to mind truths about ourselves and our freedom that we often lose sight of in our everyday activity. Its role is to show us (or remind us of) the true character of freedom. Art fulfills this role by showing us the freedom of spirit in its purest form without the contingencies of everyday life. That is to say, art at its best presents us not with the all too familiar dependencies and drudgery of daily existence, but with the ideal of freedom (see Aesthetics, 1: 155–6). This ideal of human (and divine) freedom constitutes true beauty and is found above all, Hegel claims, in ancient Greek sculptures of gods and heroes.
Note that the work of idealization is undertaken not (like modern fashion photography) to provide an escape from life into a world of fantasy, but to enable us to see our freedom more clearly. Idealization is undertaken, therefore, in the interests of a clearer revelation of the true character of humanity (and of the divine). The paradox is that art communicates truth through idealized images of human beings (and indeed—in painting—through the illusion of external reality).
It is worth noting at this stage that Hegel’s account of art is meant to be both descriptive and normative. Hegel thinks that the account he gives describes the principal features of the greatest works of art in the Western tradition, such as the sculptures of Phidias or Praxiteles or the dramas of Aeschylus or Sophocles. At the same time, his account is normative in so far as it tells us what true art is. There are many things that we call “art”: cave paintings, a child’s drawing, Greek sculpture, Shakespeare’s plays, adolescent love poetry, and (in the twentieth century) Carl André’s bricks. Not everything called “art” deserves the name, however, because not everything so called does what true art is meant to do: namely, give sensuous expression to free spirit and thereby create works of beauty. Hegel does not prescribe strict rules for the production of beauty; but he does set out broad criteria that truly beautiful art must meet, and he is critical of work that claims to be “art” but that fails to meet these criteria. Hegel’s critique of certain developments in post-Reformation art—such as the aspiration to do no more than imitate nature—is thus based, not on contingent personal preferences, but on his philosophical understanding of the true nature and purpose of art.
Hegel’s philosophical account of art and beauty has three parts: 1) ideal beauty as such, or beauty proper, 2) the different forms that beauty takes in history, and 3) the different arts in which beauty is encountered. We will look first at Hegel’s account of ideal beauty as such.
Hegel is well aware that art can perform various functions: it can teach, edify, provoke, adorn, and so on. His concern, however, is to identify art’s proper and most distinctive function. This, he claims, is to give intuitive, sensuous expression to the freedom of spirit. The point of art, therefore, is not to be “realistic”—to imitate or mirror the contingencies of everyday life—but to show us what divine and human freedom look like. Such sensuous expression of spiritual freedom is what Hegel calls the “Ideal,” or true beauty.
The realm of the sensuous is the realm of individual things in space and time. Freedom is given sensuous expression, therefore, when it is embodied in an individual who stands alone in his or her “self-enjoyment, repose, and bliss [Seligkeit]” (Aesthetics, 1: 179). Such an individual must not be abstract and formal (as, for example, in the early Greek Geometric style), nor should he be static and rigid (as in much ancient Egyptian sculpture), but his body and posture should be visibly animated by freedom and life, without, however, sacrificing the stillness and serenity that belongs to ideal self-containment. Such ideal beauty, Hegel claims, is found above all in fifth- and fourth-century Greek sculptures of the gods, such as the Dresden Zeus (a cast of which Hegel saw in the early 1820s) or Praxiteles’ Cnidian Aphrodite (see PKÄ, 143 and Houlgate 2007, 58).
Ancient Greek sculpture, which Hegel would have known almost exclusively from Roman copies or from plaster casts, presents what he calls pure or “absolute” beauty (PKÄ, 124). It does not, however, exhaust the idea of beauty, for it does not give us beauty in its most concrete and developed form. This we find in ancient Greek drama—especially tragedy—in which free individuals proceed to action that leads to conflict and, finally, to resolution (sometimes violently, as in Sophocles’ Antigone, sometimes peacefully, as in Aeschylus’ Oresteian trilogy). The gods represented in Greek sculpture are beautiful because their physical shape perfectly embodies their spiritual freedom and is not marred by marks of physical frailty or dependence. The principal heroes and heroines of Greek tragedy are beautiful because their free activity is informed and animated by an ethical interest or “pathos” (such as care for the family, as in the case of Antigone, or concern for the welfare of the state, as in the case of Creon), rather than by petty human foibles or passions. These heroes are not allegorical representations of abstract virtues, but are living human beings with imagination, character and free will; but what moves them is a passion for an aspect of our ethical life, an aspect that is supported and promoted by a god.
This distinction between pure beauty, found in Greek sculpture, and the more concrete beauty found in Greek drama means that ideal beauty actually takes two subtly different forms. Beauty takes these different forms because pure sculptural beauty—though it is the pinnacle of art’s achievement—has a certain abstractness about it. Beauty is the sensuous expression of freedom and so must exhibit the concreteness, animation and humanity that are missing, for example, in Egyptian sculpture. Yet since pure beauty, as exemplified by Greek sculpture, is spiritual freedom immersed in spatial, bodily shape, it lacks the more concrete dynamism of action in time, action that is animated by imagination and language. This is what lends a certain “abstractness” (and, indeed, coldness) to pure beauty (PKÄ, 57, 125). If art’s role is to give sensuous expression to true freedom, however, it must move beyond abstraction towards concreteness. This means that it must move beyond pure beauty to the more concrete and genuinely human beauty of drama. These two kinds of ideal beauty thus constitute the most appropriate objects of art and, taken together, form what Hegel calls the “centre” (Mittelpunkt) of art itself (PKÄ, 126).
Hegel also acknowledges that art can, indeed must, both fall short of and go beyond such ideal beauty. It falls short of ideal beauty when it takes the form of symbolic art, and it goes beyond such beauty when it takes the form of romantic art. The form of art that is characterized by works of ideal beauty itself is classical art. These are the three forms of art (Kunstformen), or “forms of the beautiful” (PKÄ, 68), that Hegel believes are made necessary by the very idea of art itself. The development of art from one form to another generates what Hegel regards as the distinctive history of art.
What produces these three art-forms is the changing relation between the content of art—the Idea as spirit—and its mode of presentation. The changes in this relation are in turn determined by the way in which the content of art is itself conceived. In symbolic art the content is conceived abstractly, such that it is not able to manifest itself adequately in a sensuous, visible form. In classical art, by contrast, the content is conceived in such a way that it is able to find perfect expression in sensuous, visible form. In romantic art, the content is conceived in such a way that it is able to find adequate expression in sensuous, visible form and yet also ultimately transcends the realm of the sensuous and visible.
Classical art is the home of ideal beauty proper, whereas romantic art is the home of what Hegel calls the “beauty of inwardness” (Schönheit der Innigkeit) or, as Knox translates it, “beauty of deep feeling” (Aesthetics, 1: 531). Symbolic art, by contrast, falls short of genuine beauty altogether. This does not mean that it is simply bad art: Hegel recognizes that symbolic art is often the product of the highest level of artistry. Symbolic art falls short of beauty because it does not yet have a rich enough understanding of the nature of divine and human spirit. The artistic shapes it produces are deficient, therefore, because the conceptions of spirit that underlie it—conceptions that are contained above all in religion—are deficient (PKÄ, 68).
6.2.1 Symbolic Art
Hegel’s account of symbolic art encompasses the art of many different civilizations and shows his considerable understanding of, and appreciation for, non-Western art. Not all of the types of symbolic art Hegel discusses, however, are fully and properly symbolic. So what connects them all? The fact that they all belong to the sphere of what Hegel calls “pre-art” (Vorkunst) (PKÄ, 73). Art proper, for Hegel, is the sensuous expression or manifestation of free spirit in a medium (such as metal, stone or color) that has been deliberately shaped or worked by human beings into the expression of freedom. The sphere of “pre-art” comprises art that falls short of art proper in some way. This is either because it is the product of a spirit that does not yet understand itself to be truly free, or because it is the product of a spirit that does have a sense of its own freedom but does not yet understand such freedom to involve the manifestation of itself in a sensuous medium that has been specifically shaped to that end. In either case, compared to genuine art, “pre-art” rests on a relatively abstract conception of spirit.
Hegel’s intention in his account of symbolic art is not to comment exhaustively on every kind of “pre-art” there is. He says nothing, for example, about prehistoric art (such as cave painting), nor does he discuss Chinese art or Buddhist art (even though he discusses both Chinese religion and Buddhism in his lectures on the philosophy of religion). Hegel’s aim in his account of symbolic art is to examine the various kinds of art that are made necessary by the very concept of art itself, the stages through which art has to pass on its journey from pre-art to art proper.
The first stage is that in which spirit is conceived as being in an immediate unity with nature. This stage is encountered in the ancient Persian religion of Zoroastrianism. The Zoroastrians, Hegel claims, believe in a divine power—the Good—but they identify this divinity with an aspect of nature itself, namely with light. Light does not symbolize or point to a separate God or Good; rather, in Zoroastrianism (as Hegel understands it) light is the Good, is God (Aesthetics, 1: 325). Light is thus the substance in all things and that which gives life to all plants and animals. This light, Hegel tells us, is personified as Ormuzd (or Ahura Mazda). Unlike the God of the Jews, however, Ormuzd is not a free, self-conscious subject. He (or it) is the Good in the form of light itself, and so is present in all sources of light, such as the sun, stars and fire.
The question we have to ask, Hegel remarks, is whether seeing the Good as light (or giving utterance to such an intuition) counts as art (PKÄ, 76). In Hegel’s view, it does not do so for two reasons: on the one hand, the Good is not understood to be free spirit that is distinct from, but manifests itself in, the light; on the other hand, the sensuous element in which the Good is present—the light itself—is understood not to be something shaped or produced by free spirit for the purpose of its self-expression, but simply to be a given feature of nature with which the Good is immediately identical.
In the Zoroastrian vision of the Good as light, we encounter the “sensuous presentation [Darstellung] of the divine” (PKÄ, 76). This vision, however, does not constitute a work of art, even though it finds expression in well-crafted prayers and utterances.
The second stage in the development of pre-art is that in which there is an immediate difference between spirit and nature. This is found, in Hegel’s view, in Hindu art. The difference between the spiritual and the natural means that the spiritual—i.e., the divine—cannot be understood (as in Persia) to be simply identical with some immediately given aspect of nature. On the other hand, Hegel claims, the divine in Hinduism is conceived in such an abstract and indeterminate way that it acquires determinate form only in and through something immediately sensuous, external and natural. The divine is thus understood to be present in the very form of something sensuous and natural. As Hegel puts it in his 1826 lectures on aesthetics: “natural objects—the human being, animals—are revered as divine” (PKÄ, 79).
Hindu art marks the difference between the spiritual (or divine) and the merely natural by extending, exaggerating and distorting the natural forms in which the divine is imagined to be present. The divine is portrayed not in the purely natural form of an animal or human being, therefore, but in the unnaturally distorted form of an animal or human being. (Shiva is portrayed with many arms, for example, and Brahma with four faces.)
Hegel notes that such portrayal involves the work of “shaping” or “forming” the medium of expression (PKÄ, 78). In that sense, one can speak of Hindu “art.” He claims, however, that Hindu art does not fulfill the true purpose of art because it does not give appropriate and adequate shape to free spirit and thereby create images of beauty. Rather, it simply distorts the natural shape of animals and human beings—to the point at which they become “ugly” (unschön), “monstrous,” “grotesque” or “bizarre” (PKÄ, 78, 84)—in order to show that the divine or spiritual, which cannot be understood except in terms of the natural and sensuous, is at the same time different from, and finds no adequate expression in, the realm of the natural and sensuous. Hindu divinity is inseparable from natural forms, but it indicates its distinctive presence by the unnaturalness of the natural forms it adopts.
Hegel’s judgment on Hindu art does not mean, by the way, that he finds no merit at all in such art. He remarks on the splendor of Hindu art and on the “most tender feeling” and the “wealth of the finest sensuous naturalness” that such art can display. He insists, however, that Hindu art fails to reach the height of art, in which spirit is shown to be free in itself and is given appropriate natural, visible shape (PKÄ, 84).
The third stage in the development of “pre-art” is that of genuinely symbolic art in which shapes and images are deliberately designed and created to point to a determinate and quite separate sphere of “interiority” (Innerlichkeit) (PKÄ, 86). This is the province of ancient Egyptian art. The Egyptians, Hegel tells us, were the first people to “fix” (fixieren) the idea of spirit as something inward that is separate and independent in itself (PKÄ, 85). (In this context he refers to Herodotus, who maintained that the Egyptians were “the first people to put forward the doctrine of the immortality of the soul” [Herodotus, 145 [2: 123]].) Spirit, as Hegel understands it (in his philosophy of subjective and objective spirit), is the activity of externalizing and expressing itself in images, words, actions and institutions. With the idea of spirit as “interiority,” therefore, there necessarily comes the drive to give an external shape to this inner spirit, that is, to produce a shape for spirit from out of spirit itself. The drive to create shapes and images—works of art—through which the inner realm can make itself known is thus an “instinct” in the Egyptians that is deeply rooted in the way they understand spirit. In this sense, in Hegel’s view, Egyptian civilization is a more profoundly artistic civilization than that of the Hindus (Aesthetics, 1: 354; PKÄ, 86).
Egyptian art, however, is only symbolic art, not art in its full sense. This is because the created shapes and images of Egyptian art do not give direct, adequate expression to spirit, but merely point to, or symbolize, an interiority that remains hidden from view. Furthermore, the inner spirit, though fixed in the Egyptian understanding as a “separate, independent inwardness” (PKÄ, 86), is not itself understood as fully free spirit. Indeed, the realm of spirit is understood by the Egyptians to a large degree as the simple negation of the realm of nature and life. That is to say, it is understood above all as the realm of the dead.
The fact that death is the principal realm in which the independence of the soul is preserved explains why the doctrine of the immortality of the soul is so important to the Egyptians. It also explains why Hegel sees the pyramid as the image that epitomizes Egyptian symbolic art. The pyramid is a created shape that hides within it something separate from it, namely a dead body. It thus serves as the perfect image of Egyptian symbols which point to, but do not themselves reveal and express, a realm of interiority that is independent but still lacks the freedom and life of genuine spirit (Aesthetics, 1: 356).
For Hegel, Greek art contains symbolic elements (such as the eagle to symbolize the power of Zeus), but the core of Greek art is not the symbol. Egyptian art, by contrast, is symbolic through and through. Indeed, Egyptian consciousness as a whole, in Hegel’s view, is essentially symbolic. Animals, for example, are regarded as symbols or masks of something deeper, and so animal faces are often used as masks (by amongst others, embalmers). Symbolism can also be multi-layered: the image of the phoenix, Hegel claims, symbolizes natural (especially, celestial) processes of disappearance and reemergence, but those processes are themselves viewed as symbols of spiritual rebirth (PKÄ, 87).
As noted above, the pyramid epitomizes the symbolic art of the Egyptians. Such art, however, does not just point symbolically to the realm of the dead; it also bears witness to an incipient but still undeveloped awareness that true inwardness is found in the living human spirit. It does so, Hegel maintains, by showing the human spirit struggling to emerge from the animal. The image that best depicts this emergence is, of course, that of the sphinx (which has the body of a lion and the head of a human being). The human form is also mixed with that of animals in images of gods, such as Horus (who has a human body and a falcon’s head). Such images, however, do not constitute art in the full sense because they fail to give adequate expression to free spirit in the form of the fully human being. They are mere symbols that partially disclose an interiority whose true character remains hidden from view (and mysterious even to the Egyptians themselves).
Even when the human form is depicted in Egyptian art without adulteration, it is still not animated by a genuinely free and living spirit and so does not become the shape of freedom itself. Figures, such as the Memnon Colossi of Amenhotep III in Western Thebes, display no “freedom of movement” (PKÄ, 89), in Hegel’s view, and other smaller figures, which stand with their arms pressed to their sides and their feet firmly planted on the ground, lack “grace [Grazie] of movement.” Egyptian sculpture is praised by Hegel as “worthy of admiration”; indeed, he claims that under the Ptolemies (305–30 B.C.) Egyptian sculpture exhibited great “delicacy” (or “elegance”) (Zierlichkeit). Nonetheless, for all its merits, Egyptian art does not give shape to real freedom and life and so fails to fulfill the true purpose of art.
The fourth stage of pre-art is that in which spirit gains such a degree of freedom and independence that spirit and nature “fall apart” (PKÄ, 89). This stage is in turn sub-divided into three. The first sub-division comprises sublime art: the poetic art of the Jewish people.
In Judaism, Hegel maintains, spirit is understood to be fully free and independent. This freedom and independence is, however, attributed to the divine rather than the human spirit. God is thus conceived as a “free spiritual subject” (PKÄ, 75), who is the creator of the world and the power over everything natural and finite. That which is natural and finite is, by contrast, regarded as something “negative” in relation to God, that is, as something that does not exist for its own sake but that has been created to serve God (PKÄ, 90).
Judaic spirituality, in Hegel’s view, is not capable of producing works of true beauty because the Jewish God transcends the world of nature and finitude and cannot manifest itself in that world and be given visible shape in it. Jewish poetry (the Psalms) gives expression, rather, to the sublimity of God by praising and exalting Him as the source of all things. At the same time, such poetry gives “brilliant” (glänzend) expression to the pain and fear felt by the sinful in relation to their Lord (PKÄ, 91).
The second sub-division of this fourth stage of pre-art comprises what Hegel calls “oriental pantheism” and is found in the poetry of Islamic “Arabs, Persians, and Turks” (PKÄ, 93), such as the Persian lyric poet Hafez (German: Hafis) (c. 1310–1389). In such pantheism, God is also understood to stand sublimely above and apart from the realm of the finite and natural, but his relation to that realm is held to be affirmative, rather than negative. The divine raises things to their own magnificence, fills them with spirit, gives them life and in this sense is actually immanent in things (Aesthetics, 1: 368; PKÄ, 93).
This in turn determines the relation that the poet has to objects. For the poet, too, is free and independent of things, but also has an affirmative relation to them. That is to say, he feels an identity with things and sees his own untroubled freedom reflected in them. Such pantheism thus comes close to genuine art, for it uses natural objects, such as a rose, as poetic “images” (Bilder) of its own feeling of “cheerful, blessed inwardness” (PKÄ, 94–5). The pantheistic spirit remains, however, free within itself in distinction from and in relation to natural objects; it does not create shapes of its own—such as the idealized figures of the Greek gods—in which its freedom comes directly into view. (Note, by the way, that in the Hotho edition of Hegel’s lectures on aesthetics pantheistic Islamic poetry is placed before, rather than after, the poetry of Judaism; see Aesthetics, 1: 364–77.)
The third sub-division of the fourth stage of pre-art is that in which there is the clearest break between spirit and the realm of the natural or sensuous. At this stage, the spiritual aspect—that which is inner and, as it were, invisible—takes the form of something quite separate and distinct. It is also something finite and limited: an idea or meaning entertained by human beings. The sensuous element is in turn something separate and distinct from the meaning. It has no intrinsic connection to the meaning, but is, as Hegel puts it, “external” to that meaning. The sensuous element—the pictorial or poetic image—is thus connected with the meaning by nothing but the subjective “wit” or imagination of the poet (PKÄ, 95). This occurs, Hegel maintains, in fables, parables, allegories, metaphors and similes.
This third sub-division is not associated with any particular civilization, but is a form of expression that is found in many different ones. Hegel contends, however, that allegory, metaphor and simile do not constitute the core of truly beautiful art, because they do not present us with the very freedom of spirit itself, but point to (and so symbolize) a meaning that is separate and independent. A metaphor, such as “Achilles is a lion,” does not embody the spirit of the individual hero in the way that a Greek sculpture does, but is a metaphor for something that is distinct from the metaphor itself (see Aesthetics, 1: 402–8; PKÄ, 104).
Hegel’s account of symbolic art (or “pre-art”) draws widely on the work of other writers, such as his former colleague at Heidelberg, Georg Friedrich Creuzer, the author of Symbolism and Mythology of Ancient Peoples, especially the Greeks (1810–12). Hegel’s account is not meant to be strictly historical, but rather to place the various forms of pre-art discussed in a logical relation to one another. This relation is determined by the degree to which, in each form of pre-art, spirit and nature (or the sensuous) are differentiated from one another.
To recapitulate: in Zoroastrianism, spirit and nature are in immediate identity with one another (as the Light). In Hindu art, there is an immediate difference between the spiritual (the divine) and nature, but the spiritual remains abstract and indeterminate in itself and so can be brought to mind only through images of natural things (unnaturally distorted). In Egyptian art, the spiritual is again different from the realm of the merely natural and sensuous. In contrast to the indeterminate divinity of the Hindus, however, Egyptian spirituality (in the form of the gods and of the human soul) is fixed, separate and determinate in itself. The images of Egyptian art thus point symbolically to a realm of spirit that remains hidden from direct view. The spirit to which such symbolic images point, however, lacks genuine freedom and life and is often identified with the realm of the dead.
In the sublime poetry of the Jews, God is represented as transcendent and as a “free spiritual subject.” Finite human beings, however, are portrayed in a negative relation to God in that they are created to serve and praise God and are pained by their own sinfulness. In the sublime poetry of “oriental pantheism” God is once again portrayed as transcendent, but, in contrast to Judaism, God and finite things are shown to stand in an affirmative relation to one another: things are infused with spirit and life by God. The poet’s relation to things is, accordingly, one in which his own free spirit finds itself reflected in the natural things around him.
In the last stage of pre-art, the difference between the spiritual and the natural (or sensuous) is taken to its limit: the spiritual element (the “meaning”) and the sensuous element (the “shape” or “image”) are now completely independent of, and external to, one another. Furthermore, each is finite and limited. This is the realm of allegory and metaphor.
6.2.2 Classical Art
Hegel does not deny the magnificence or elegance of pre-art, but he maintains that it falls short of art proper. The latter is found in classical art, or the art of the ancient Greeks.
Classical art, Hegel contends, fulfills the concept of art in that it is the perfect sensuous expression of the freedom of spirit. It is in classical art, therefore—above all in ancient Greek sculpture (and drama)—that true beauty is to be found. Indeed, Hegel maintains, the gods of ancient Greece exhibit “absolute beauty as such”: “there can be nothing more beautiful than the classical; there is the ideal” (PKÄ, 124, 135; see also Aesthetics, 1: 427).
Such beauty consists in the perfect fusion of the spiritual and the sensuous (or natural). In true beauty the visible shape before us does not merely intimate the presence of the divine through the unnatural distortion of its form, nor does it point beyond itself to a hidden spirituality or to divine transcendence. Rather, the shape manifests and embodies free spirituality in its very contours. In true beauty, therefore, the visible shape is not a symbol of, or metaphor for, a meaning that lies beyond the shape, but is the expression of spirit’s freedom that brings that freedom directly into view. Beauty is sensuous, visible shape so transformed that it stands as the visible embodiment of freedom itself.
Hegel does not deny that Greek art and mythology contain many symbolic elements: the story, for example, that Cronus, the father of Zeus, consumed his own children symbolizes the destructive power of time (Aesthetics, 1: 492; PKÄ, 120). In Hegel’s view, however, the distinctive core of Greek art consists in works of ideal beauty in which the freedom of spirit is made visible for the first time in history. Three conditions had to be met for such beautiful art to be produced.
First, the divine had to be understood to be freely self-determining spirit, to be divine subjectivity (not just an abstract power such as the Light). Second, the divine had to be understood to take the form of individuals who could be portrayed in sculpture and drama. The divine had to be conceived, in other words, not as sublimely transcendent, but as spirituality that is embodied in many different ways. The beauty of Greek art thus presupposed Greek polytheism. Third, the proper shape of free spirit had to be recognized to be the human body, not that of an animal. Hindu and Egyptian gods were often portrayed as a fusion of human and animal forms; by contrast, the principal Greek gods were depicted in ideal human form. Hegel notes that Zeus would sometimes take on animal form, for example when he was engaged in seduction; but he sees Zeus’ transformation of himself into a bull for the purpose of seduction as a lingering echo of Egyptian mythology in the Greek world (see PKÄ, 119–20, in which Hegel confuses Io, who in another story was herself changed into a white cow by Zeus to protect her from the jealous Hera, with Europa, who was the object of Zeus’ love in the story Hegel has in mind).
Not only do Greek art and beauty presuppose Greek religion and mythology, but Greek religion itself requires art in order to give a determinate identity to the gods. As Hegel notes (following Herodotus), it was the poets Homer and Hesiod who gave the Greeks their gods, and Greek understanding of the gods was developed and expressed above all in their sculpture and drama (rather than in distinctively theological writings) (PKÄ, 123–4). Greek religion thus took the form of what Hegel in the Phenomenology called a “religion of art.” Moreover, Greek art achieved the highest degree of beauty, in Hegel’s view, precisely because it was the highest expression of the freedom of spirit enshrined in Greek religion.
Although Greek sculpture and drama achieved unsurpassed heights of beauty, such art did not give expression to the deepest freedom of the spirit. This is because of a deficiency in the Greek conception of divine and human freedom. Greek religion was so well suited to aesthetic expression because the gods were conceived as free individuals who were wholly at one with their bodies and their sensuous life. In other words, they were free spirits still immersed in nature (PKÄ, 132–3). In Hegel’s view, however, a deeper freedom is attained when the spirit withdraws into itself out of nature and becomes pure self-knowing interiority. Such an understanding of spirit is expressed, according to Hegel, in Christianity. The Christian God is thus pure self-knowing spirit and love who created human beings so that they, too, may become such pure spirit and love. With the emergence of Christianity comes a new form of art: romantic art. Hegel uses the term “romantic” to refer not to the art of the late 18th- and early 19th-century German Romantics (many of whom he knew personally), but to the whole tradition of art that emerged in Western Christendom.
6.2.3 Romantic Art
Romantic art, like classical art, is the sensuous expression or manifestation of the freedom of spirit. It is thus capable of genuine beauty. The freedom it manifests, however, is a profoundly inward freedom that finds its highest expression and articulation not in art itself but in religious faith and philosophy. Unlike classical art, therefore, romantic art gives expression to a freedom of the spirit whose true home lies beyond art. If classical art can be compared to the human body which is thoroughly suffused with spirit and life, romantic art can be compared to the human face which discloses the spirit and personality within. Since romantic art actually discloses the inner spirit, however, rather than merely pointing to it, it differs from symbolic art which it otherwise resembles.
Romantic art, for Hegel, takes three basic forms. The first is that of explicitly religious art. It is in Christianity, Hegel contends, that the true nature of spirit is revealed. What is represented in the story of Christ’s life, death and resurrection is the idea that a truly divine life of freedom and love is at the same time a fully human life in which we are willing to “die” to ourselves and let go of what is most precious to us. Much religious romantic art, therefore, focuses on the suffering and death of Christ.
Hegel notes that it is not appropriate in romantic art to depict Christ with the idealized body of a Greek god or hero, because what is central to Christ is his irreducible humanity and mortality. Romantic art, therefore, breaks with the classical ideal of beauty and incorporates real human frailty, pain and suffering into its images of Christ (and also of religious martyrs). Indeed, such art can even go to the point of being “ugly” (unschön) in its depiction of suffering (PKÄ, 136).
If, however, romantic art is to fulfill the purpose of art and present true freedom of spirit in the form of beauty, it must show the suffering Christ or suffering martyrs to be imbued with a profound inwardness (Innigkeit) of feeling and a genuine sense of reconciliation (Versöhnung) (PKÄ, 136–7): for such an inward sense of reconciliation, in Hegel’s view, is the deepest spiritual freedom. The sensuous expression (in color or words) of this inner sense of reconciliation constitutes what Hegel calls the “beauty of inwardness” or “spiritual beauty” (geistige Schönheit) (PKÄ, 137). Strictly speaking, such spiritual beauty is not as consummately beautiful as classical beauty, in which the spirit and the body are perfectly fused with one another. Spiritual beauty, however, is the product of, and reveals, a much more profound inner freedom of spirit than classical beauty and so moves and engages us much more readily than do the relatively cold statues of Greek gods.
The most profound spiritual beauty in the visual arts is found, in Hegel’s view, in painted images of the Madonna and Child, for in these what is expressed is the feeling of boundless love. Hegel had a special affection for the paintings of the Flemish Primitives, Jan van Eyck and Hans Memling, whose work he saw on his visits to Ghent and Bruges in 1827 (Hegel: The Letters, 661–2), but he also held Raphael in high regard and was particularly moved by the expression of “pious, modest mother-love” in Raphael’s Sistine Madonna which he saw in Dresden in 1820 (PKÄ, 39; Pöggeler et al 1981, 142). Greek sculptors portrayed Niobe as simply “petrified in her pain” at the loss of her children. By contrast, the painted images of the Virgin Mary are imbued by van Eyck and Raphael with an “eternal love” and a “soulfulness” that Greek statues can never match (PKÄ, 142, 184).
The second fundamental form of romantic art identified by Hegel depicts what he calls the secular “virtues” of the free spirit (Aesthetics, 1: 553; PKÄ, 135). These are not the ethical virtues displayed by the heroes and heroines of Greek tragedy: they do not involve a commitment to the necessary institutions of freedom, such as the family or the state. Rather, they are the formal virtues of the romantic hero: that is to say, they involve a commitment by the free individual, often grounded in contingent choice or passion, to an object or another person.
Such virtues include that of romantic love (which concentrates on a particular, contingent person), loyalty towards an individual (that can change if it is to one’s advantage), and courage (which is often displayed in the pursuit of personal ends, such as rescuing a damsel in distress, but can also be displayed in the pursuit of quasi-religious ends, such as the hunt for the Holy Grail) (PKÄ, 143–4).
Such virtues are found primarily in the world of mediaeval chivalry (and are subjected to ridicule, Hegel points out, in Cervantes’ Don Quixote) (Aesthetics, 1: 591–2; PKÄ, 150). They can, however, also crop up in more modern works and, indeed, are precisely the virtues displayed in an art-form of which Hegel could know nothing, namely the American Western.
The third fundamental form of romantic art depicts the formal freedom and independence of character. Such freedom is not associated with any ethical principles or (at least not principally) with the formal virtues just mentioned, but consists simply in the “firmness” (Festigkeit) of character (Aesthetics, 1: 577; PKÄ, 145–6). This is freedom in its modern, secular form. It is displayed most magnificently, Hegel believes, by characters, such as Richard III, Othello and Macbeth, in the plays of Shakespeare. Note that what interests us about such individuals is not any moral purpose (which they invariably lack anyway), but simply the energy and self-determination (and often ruthlessness) that they exhibit. Such characters must have an internal richness (revealed through imagination and language) and not just be one-dimensional, but their main appeal is their formal freedom to commit themselves to a course of action, even at the cost of their own lives. These characters do not constitute moral or political ideals, but they are the appropriate objects of modern, romantic art whose task is to depict freedom even in its most secular and amoral forms.
Hegel also sees romantic beauty in more inwardly sensitive characters, such as Shakespeare’s Juliet. After meeting Romeo, Hegel remarks, Juliet suddenly opens up with love like a rosebud, full of childlike naivety. Her beauty thus lies in being the embodiment of love. Hamlet is a somewhat similar character: far from being simply weak (as Goethe thought), Hamlet, in Hegel’s view, displays the inner beauty of a profoundly noble soul (Aesthetics, 1: 583; PKÄ, 147–8).
6.2.4 The “End” of Art
One should note that the development of romantic art, as Hegel describes it, involves the increasing secularization and humanization of art. In the Middle Ages and the Renaissance (as in ancient Greece) art was closely tied to religion: art’s function was to a large degree to make the divine visible. With the Reformation, however, religion turned inward and found God to be present in faith alone, not in the icons and images of art. As a result, Hegel points out, we who live after the Reformation “no longer venerate works of art” (VPK, 6). Furthermore, art itself was released from its close ties to religion and allowed to become fully secular. “To Protestantism alone,” Hegel states, “the important thing is to get a sure footing in the prose of life, to make it absolutely valid in itself independently of religious associations, and to let it develop in unrestricted freedom” (Aesthetics, 1: 598).
It is for this reason, in Hegel’s view, that art in the modern age no longer meets our highest needs and no longer affords us the satisfaction that it gave to earlier cultures and civilizations. Art satisfied our highest needs when it formed an integral part of our religious life and revealed to us the nature of the divine (and, as in Greece, the true character of our fundamental ethical obligations). In the modern, post-Reformation world, however, art has been released (or has emancipated itself) from subservience to religion. As a result, “art, considered in its highest vocation, is and remains for us a thing of the past” (Aesthetics, 1: 11).
This does not mean that art now has no role to play and that it provides no satisfaction at all. Art is no longer the highest and most adequate way of expressing the truth (as it was, according to Hegel, in fifth-century Athens); we moderns now seek ultimate or “absolute” truth in religious faith or in philosophy, rather than in art. (Indeed, the considerable importance we assign to philosophy is evident, in Hegel’s view, in the prominence of the philosophical study of art itself in modernity [Aesthetics, 1: 11; VPK, 6].) Yet art in modernity continues to perform the significant function of giving visible and audible expression to our distinctively human freedom and to our understanding of ourselves in all our finite humanity.
Hegel does not claim, therefore, that art as a whole simply comes to an end or “dies” in the modern age. His view is, rather, that art plays (or at least should play) a more limited role now than it did in ancient Greece or in the Middle Ages. Yet Hegel does think that art in modernity comes to an end in a certain respect. To understand why he thinks this, we need to consider his claim that art in modernity “falls apart” (zerfällt) into the exploration of everyday contingencies, on the one hand, and the celebration of witty, “humorous” subjectivity, on the other (PKÄ, 151).
In Hegel’s view, much painting and poetry after the Reformation focuses its attention on the prosaic details of ordinary daily life, rather than on the intimacy of religious love or the magnificent resolve and energy of tragic heroes. To the extent that such works of art no longer aim to give expression to divine or human freedom but seek (apparently at least) to do no more than “imitate nature,” they prompt Hegel to consider whether they still count as “art works” in the strictly philosophical (as opposed to the more generally accepted) sense of the term. In the twentieth century it is the abstract creations of, for example, Jackson Pollock or Carl André that usually provoke the question: “is this art?”. In Hegel’s mind, however, it is works that appear to be purely naturalistic and “representational” that raise this question. His view is that such works count as genuine works of art only when they do more than merely imitate nature. The naturalistic and prosaic works that best meet this criterion, he maintains, are the paintings of the sixteenth- and seventeenth-century Dutch masters.
In such works, Hegel claims, the painter does not aim simply to show us what grapes, flowers or trees look like: we know that already from nature. The painter aims, rather, to capture the—often fleeting—“life” (Lebendigkeit) of things: “the lustre of metal, the shimmer of a bunch of grapes by candlelight, a vanishing glimpse of the moon or the sun, a smile, the expression of a swiftly passing emotion” (Aesthetics, 1: 599). Often, indeed, the painter seeks to delight us specifically with the animated play of the colors of gold, silver, velvet or fur. In such works, Hegel notes, we encounter not just the depiction of things, but “as it were, an objective music, a peal in colour [ein Tönen in Farben]” (Aesthetics, 1: 598–600).
A genuine work of art is the sensuous expression of divine or human freedom and life. Paintings that are no more than prosaic, naturalistic depictions of everyday objects or human activity would thus appear to fall short of genuine art. Dutch artists, however, turn such depictions into true works of art precisely by imbuing objects with “the fullness of life.” In so doing, Hegel claims, they give expression to their own sense of freedom, “comfort” and “contentment” and their own exuberant subjective skill (Aesthetics, 1: 599; PKÄ, 152). The paintings of such artists may lack the classical beauty of Greek art, but they exhibit magnificently the subtle beauties and delights of everyday modern life.
A much more overt expression of subjectivity is found by Hegel in works of modern humor. Such witty, ironic, humorous subjectivity—one we might now describe as “anarchic”—manifests itself in playing or “sporting” with objects, “deranging” and “perverting” material and “rambling to and fro,” and in the “criss-cross movement of subjective expressions, views, and attitudes whereby the author sacrifices himself and his topics alike” (Aesthetics, 1: 601). Hegel claims that works of “true humour,” such as Laurence Sterne’s Tristram Shandy (1759), succeed in making “what is substantial emerge out of contingency.” Their “triviality [thus] affords precisely the supreme idea of depth” (Aesthetics, 1: 602). In other works, by contrast—such as those of Hegel’s contemporary, Jean Paul Richter—all we encounter is the “baroque mustering of things objectively furthest removed from one another” and “the most confused disorderly jumbling of topics related only in his own subjective imagination” (Aesthetics, 1: 601). In such works, we do not see human freedom giving itself objective expression, but rather witness subjectivity “destroying and dissolving everything that proposes to make itself objective and win a firm shape for itself in reality” (Aesthetics, 1: 601).
To the extent that works of humor do not give body to true self-determining freedom and life—or afford “the supreme idea of depth”—but merely manifest the power of arbitrary, subjective wit to subvert the settled order, such works, in Hegel’s view, no longer count as genuine works of art. Consequently, “when the subject lets itself go in this way, art thereby comes to an end [so hört damit die Kunst auf]” (PKÄ, 153). In this respect, Hegel does after all proclaim that art comes to an end in modernity. This is not because art no longer performs a religious function and so no longer fulfills the highest vocation of art; it is because there emerge in modernity certain “art works” that are no longer the expressions of true human freedom and life and so no longer genuine art works at all.
As was noted above, however, this does not mean that art as a whole comes to an end in the early nineteenth century. Art, in Hegel’s view, still has a future: “we may well hope,” he says, “that art will always rise higher and come to perfection” (Aesthetics, 1: 103). For Hegel, the distinctive character of genuine art in contemporary (and future) modernity—and thus of genuinely modern art—is twofold. On the one hand, it remains bound to give expression to concrete human life and freedom; on the other hand, it is no longer restricted to any of the three art-forms. That is to say, it does not have to observe the proprieties of classical art or explore the intense emotional inwardness or heroic freedom or comfortable ordinariness that we find in romantic art. Modern art, for Hegel, can draw on features of any of the art-forms (including symbolic art) in its presentation of human life. Indeed, it can also present human life and freedom indirectly through the depiction of nature.
The focus of modern art, therefore, does not have to be on one particular conception of human freedom rather than another. The new “holy of holies” in art is humanity itself— “Humanus”—that is, “the depths and heights of the human heart as such, mankind in its joys and sorrows, its strivings, deeds, and fates” (Aesthetics, 1: 607). Modern art, in Hegel’s view, thus enjoys an unprecedented freedom to explore “the infinity of the human heart” in manifold ways (VÄ, 181). For this reason, there is little that Hegel can say about the path that art should take in the future; that is for artists to decide.
Hegel’s judgment that modern artists are—and are quite rightly—free to adopt whatever style they please has surely been confirmed by the history of art since Hegel’s death in 1831. There is reason to suspect, however, that Hegel might not have welcomed many of the developments in post-Hegelian art. This is due to the fact that, although he does not lay down any rules that are to govern modern art, he does identify certain conditions that should be met if modern art is to be genuine art. Hegel notes, for example, that such art should “not contradict the formal law of being simply beautiful and capable of artistic treatment” (Aesthetics, 1: 605; VPK, 204). He insists that modern artists should draw their content from their own human spirit and that “nothing that can be living [lebendig] in the human breast is alien to that spirit.” He also remarks that modern art may represent “everything in which the human being as such is capable of being at home [heimisch]” (Aesthetics, 1: 607). These may appear to be fairly innocuous conditions, but they suggest that certain post-Hegelian art works would not count in Hegel’s eyes as genuine works of art. These might include works that by no stretch of the imagination can be called “beautiful” (such as some of the paintings of Willem De Kooning or Francis Bacon), or works in which it is evidently hard to feel very much “at home” (such as the writings of Franz Kafka). Hegel’s account of the different arts (such as sculpture and painting) also suggests that he would not have regarded the move from figurative to abstract visual art as appropriate: Netherlandish and Dutch painters excelled in the creating of “objective music” through the play of colors, yet they did so not in the abstract but in the very depiction of concrete, identifiable objects. (Robert Pippin takes a different view on this last point; see Pippin 2007.)
From a twentieth- or twenty-first-century point of view, Hegel’s stance may well look conservative. From his point of view, however, he was trying to understand what conditions would have to be met for works of art to be genuine works of art and genuinely modern. The conditions that Hegel identified—namely that art should present the richness of human freedom and life and should allow us to feel at home in its depictions—are ones that many modern artists (for example, Impressionists such as Monet, Sisley and Pissarro) have felt no trouble in meeting. For others, these conditions are simply too restrictive. They have thus taken modern art in a direction in which, from a Hegelian perspective, it has ceased to be art in the true sense any longer.
Art, in Hegel’s account, not only undergoes a historical development (from symbolic art through classical art to romantic and then modern art), but also differentiates itself into different arts. Each art has a distinctive character and exhibits a certain affinity with one or more of the art-forms. Hegel does not provide an exhaustive account of all recognized arts (he says little, for example, about dance and nothing, obviously, about cinema), but he examines the five arts that he thinks are made necessary by the very concept of art itself.
Art, we recall, is the sensuous expression of divine and human freedom. If it is to demonstrate that spirit is indeed free, it must show that spirit is free in relation to that which is itself unfree, spiritless and lifeless—that is, three-dimensional, inorganic matter, weighed down by gravity. Art must, therefore, be the transformation of such brute, heavy matter into the expression of spiritual freedom, or what Hegel calls “the forming of the inorganic” (VPK, 209). The art that gives heavy matter the explicit form of spiritual freedom—and so works stone and metal into the shape of a human being or a god—is sculpture. Architecture, by contrast, gives matter an abstract, inorganic form created by human understanding. It does not animate matter in the manner of sculpture but invests matter with strict regularity, symmetry and harmony (PKÄ, 155, 166). In so doing architecture turns matter not into the direct sensuous expression of spiritual freedom, but into an artificially and artfully shaped surrounding for the direct expression of spiritual freedom in sculpture. The art of architecture fulfills its purpose, therefore, when it creates classical temples to house statues of the gods (VPK, 221).
Hegel points out, however, that prior to the emergence of classical architecture in ancient Greece, architecture took the more primitive form of “independent” (selbständig) or “symbolic” architecture (Aesthetics, 2: 635; PKÄ, 159). The constructions that fall into this category do not house or surround individual sculptures, like classical Greek temples, but are themselves partly sculptural and partly architectural. They are works of architectural sculpture or sculptural architecture. Such constructions are sculptural in so far as they are built for their own sake and do not serve to shelter or enclose something else. They are works of architecture, however, in so far as they are overtly heavy and massive and lack the animation of sculpture. They are also sometimes arranged in rows, like columns, with no distinctive individuality.
Some of these works of independent architecture have regular inorganic, geometrical shapes (such as the temple of Bel described by Herodotus) (see Herodotus, 79–80 [1: 181]); some are clearly embodiments of the organic “force of life in nature” (such as the phallus and the lingam) (Aesthetics, 2: 641); and some even have a human form, albeit one that is abstract and colossal (such as the Egyptian Memnons of Amenhotep III). In Hegel’s view, however, all such constructions have a symbolic significance for those who built them. They were not built simply to provide shelter or security for people (like a house or a castle), but are works of symbolic art.
These “independent” constructions are meaningful in themselves: their meaning lies, for example, in their shape or in the number of their parts. By contrast, the Egyptian pyramids contain a “meaning” that is separate from the construction itself. That “meaning,” of course, is the body of the dead pharaoh. Since they house within themselves something other than themselves, pyramids, in Hegel’s view, are, as it were, on the way to being properly architectural. They fall short of proper classical architecture, however, because what they shelter within themselves is death, not the embodiment of the living god: they are, as Hegel puts it, “crystals that shelter within them a departed spirit” (VPK, 218). Furthermore, the “meaning” that they contain is completely hidden within them, invisible to all. Pyramids thus remain works of symbolic art that point to a hidden meaning buried within them. Indeed, as was noted above, Hegel claims that the pyramid is the image or symbol of symbolic art itself (Aesthetics, 1: 356).
The epitome of symbolic art is symbolic architecture (specifically, the pyramids). Architecture itself, however, comes into its own only with the emergence of classical art: for it is only in the classical period that architecture provides the surrounding for, and so becomes the servant of, a sculpture that is itself the embodiment of free spirit.
Hegel has much to say about the proper form of such a surrounding. The main point is this: spiritual freedom is embodied in the sculpture of the god; the house of the god—the temple—is something quite distinct from, and subordinate to, the sculpture it surrounds; the form of that temple should thus also be quite distinct from that of the sculpture. The temple, therefore, should not mimic the flowing contours of the human body, but should be governed by the abstract principles of regularity, symmetry and harmony.
Hegel also insists that the form of the temple should be determined by the purpose it serves: namely to provide an enclosure and protection for the god (VPK, 221). This means that the basic shape of the temple should contain only those features that are needed to fulfill its purpose. Furthermore, it means (in Hegel’s view) that each part of the temple should perform a specific function within the economy of the whole building and that different functions should not be confused with one another. It is this latter requirement that makes columns necessary. There is a difference, for Hegel, between the task of bearing the roof and that of enclosing the statue within a given space. The second task—that of enclosure—is performed by a wall. If the first task is to be clearly distinguished from the second, therefore, it must be performed not by a wall but by a separate feature of the temple. Columns are necessary in a classical temple, according to Hegel, because they perform the distinct task of bearing the roof without forming a wall. The classical temple is thus the most intelligible of buildings because different functions are carried out in this way by different architectural features and yet are harmonized with one another. Herein, indeed, lies the beauty of such a temple (VPK, 221, 224).
In contrast to classical architecture, romantic or “Gothic” architecture is based on the idea of a closed house in which Christian inwardness can find refuge from the outside world. In the Gothic cathedral columns are located within, rather than around the outside of, the enclosed space, and their overt function is no longer merely to bear weight but to draw the soul up into the heavens. Consequently, the columns or pillars do not come to a definite end (in a capital on which rests the architrave of the classical temple), but continue up until they meet to form a pointed arch or a vaulted roof. In this way, the Gothic cathedral not only shelters the spirit of the religious community, but also symbolizes the upward movement of that spirit in its very structure (PKÄ, 170–1).
Hegel considers a relatively small range of buildings: he says almost nothing, for example, about secular buildings. One should bear in mind, however, that he is interested in architecture only in so far as it is an art, not in so far as it provides us with protection and security in our everyday lives. Yet it should also be noted that architecture, as Hegel describes it, falls short of genuine art, as he defines it, since it is never the direct sensuous expression of spiritual freedom itself (in the manner of sculpture) (see Aesthetics, 2: 888). This is a fundamental limitation of architecture: the structures of “independent architecture” symbolize meanings that are more or less indeterminate; the pyramids indicate the presence of a hidden meaning, namely death; and even in its classical and romantic forms architecture remains a “symbolic” art, in so far as the structures it creates remain separate from the spirit they house (Aesthetics, 2: 888). In no case is architecture the explicit manifestation or embodiment of free spirituality itself. This does not, however, make architecture any less necessary as a part of our aesthetic and religious life. Nor does it prevent Hegel from seeking to understand what distinguishes the “art” of architecture (as opposed to the more everyday practice or business of architecture) in both the classical and romantic eras.
In contrast to architecture, sculpture works heavy matter into the concrete expression of spiritual freedom by giving it the shape of the human being. The high point of sculpture, for Hegel, was achieved in classical Greece. In Egyptian sculpture the figures often stand firm with one foot placed before the other and the arms held tightly by the side of the body, giving the figures a rather rigid, lifeless appearance. By contrast, the idealized statues of the gods created by Greek sculptors, such as Phidias and Praxiteles, are clearly alive and animated, even when the gods are depicted at rest. This animation is apparent in the posture of the figure, in the nuanced contours of the body and also in the free fall of the figure’s garments. Hegel greatly admired the sculpture of Michelangelo—a cast of whose Pietà he saw in Berlin (Aesthetics, 2: 790)—but it was the Greeks, in his view, who set the standard for “ideal” sculptural beauty. Indeed, Greek sculpture, according to Hegel, embodies the purest beauty of which art itself is capable. (For a more detailed study of Hegel’s account of sculpture, see Houlgate 2007, 56–89).
Hegel was well aware that Greek statues were often painted in quite a gaudy manner. He claims, however, that sculpture expresses spiritual freedom and vitality in the three-dimensional shape of the figure, rather than in the color that has been applied to it. In painting, by contrast, it is color above all that is the medium of expression. The point of painting, for Hegel, is not to show us what it is for free spirit to be fully embodied. It is to show us only what free spirit looks like, how it manifests itself to the eye. The images of painting thus lack the three-dimensionality of sculpture, but they add the detail and specificity provided by color.
Hegel acknowledges that painting reached a degree of perfection in the classical world, but he maintains that it is best suited to the expression of romantic, Christian spirituality (and the secular freedom of post-Reformation modernity) (PKÄ, 181). This is because the absence of bodily solidity and the presence of color allow the more inward spirituality of the Christian world to manifest itself as such. If sculpture is the material embodiment of spirit, painting gives us, as it were, the face of spirit in which the soul within manifests itself as the soul within (PKÄ, 183).
Painting, however, is also able—unlike sculpture—to set divine and human spirit in relation to its external environment: it is able to include within the painted image itself the natural landscape and the architecture by which Christ, the Virgin Mary, the saints or secular figures are surrounded (Aesthetics, 2: 854). Indeed, Hegel argues that painting—in contrast to sculpture, which excels in presenting independent, free-standing individuals—is altogether more suited to showing human beings in their relations both to their environment and to one another: hence the prominence in painting of, for example, depictions of the love between the Virgin Mary and the Christ child.
Hegel’s account of painting is extraordinarily rich and wide-ranging. He has particular praise for Raphael, Titian and the Dutch masters and, as noted earlier, is especially interested in the ways in which painters can combine colors to create what he calls “objective music” (Aesthetics, 1: 599–600). It should be noted, however, that Hegel sees the abstract play of colors as an integral part of the depiction of free human beings and does not suggest that painting should ever become purely abstract and “musical” (as it did in the twentieth century).
The next art in Hegel’s “system of the individual arts” is music itself. It, too, comes into its own in the period of romantic art. Like sculpture and painting, but unlike architecture, music gives direct expression to free subjectivity. Yet music goes even further in the direction of expressing the inwardness of subjectivity by dropping the dimensions of space altogether. It thus gives no enduring visual expression to such subjectivity, but expresses the latter in the organized succession of vanishing sounds. Music, for Hegel, originates in the immediate uttering of feeling or what he calls “interjection”—“the Ah and Oh of the heart” (Aesthetics, 2: 903). Yet music is more than just a cry of pain or a sigh; it is an organized, developed, “cadenced” interjection. Music is thus not just a sequence of sounds for its own sake, but is the structured expression in sounds of inner subjectivity. Through rhythm, harmony and melody music allows the soul to hear its own inner movement and to be moved in turn by what it hears. It is “spirit, soul which resounds immediately for itself and feels satisfied in hearing itself [in ihrem Sichvernehmen]” (Aesthetics, 2: 939, translation altered).
Music expresses, and allows us to hear and enjoy, the movement of the soul in time through difference and dissonance back into its unity with itself. It also expresses, and moves us to, various different feelings, such as love, longing and joy (Aesthetics, 2: 940). In Hegel’s view, however, the purpose of music is not only to arouse feelings in us, but—as in all genuine art —to enable us to enjoy a sense of reconciliation and satisfaction in what we encounter. This, Hegel contends, is the secret of truly “ideal” music, the music of Palestrina, Gluck, Haydn and Mozart: even in the deepest grief “tranquillity of soul is never missing [ … ]; grief is expressed there, too, but it is assuaged at once; [ …] everything is kept firmly together in a restrained form so that jubilation does not degenerate into a repulsive uproar, and even a lament gives us the most blissful tranquillity” (Aesthetics, 2: 939).
Hegel notes that music is able to express feelings with especial clarity when it is accompanied by a poetic text, and he had a particular love of both church music and opera. Interestingly, however, he argues that in such cases it is really the text that serves the music, rather than the other way around, for it is the music above all that expresses the profound movements of the soul (Aesthetics, 2: 934). Yet music does not have to be accompanied by a text; it can also be “independent” instrumental music. Such music also fulfills the aim of art by expressing the movements of the soul and moving the soul in turn to “emotions in sympathy with it” (Aesthetics, 2: 894). Over and above this expression, however, independent music pursues the purely formal development of themes and harmonies for its own sake. This, in Hegel’s view, is a perfectly appropriate, indeed necessary, thing for music to do. The danger he sees, however, is that such formal development can become completely detached from the musical expression of inward feeling and subjectivity, and that, as a result, music can cease being a genuine art and become mere artistry. Music, as it were, loses its soul and becomes nothing but “skill and virtuosity in compilation” (Aesthetics, 2: 906). At this point, music no longer moves us to feel anything, but simply engages our abstract understanding. It thereby becomes the province of the “connoisseur” and leaves the layman—who “likes most in music [ … ] the intelligible expression of feelings and ideas” (Aesthetics, 2: 953)—behind.
Hegel admits that he is not as well versed in music as he is in the other arts he discusses. He has a deep appreciation, however, for the music of J.S. Bach, Handel and Mozart and his analyses of musical rhythm, harmony and melody are highly illuminating. He was familiar with, though critical of, the music of his contemporary Carl Maria von Weber, and he had a particular affection for Rossini (Aesthetics, 1: 159, 2: 949). Surprisingly, he never makes any mention of Beethoven.
The last art that Hegel considers is also an art of sound, but sound understood as the sign of ideas and inner representations—sound as speech. This is the art of poetry (Poesie) in the broad sense of the term. Hegel regards poetry as the “most perfect art” (PKÄ, 197), because it provides the richest and most concrete expression of spiritual freedom (in contrast to sculpture which, in its classical form, gives us the purest ideal beauty). Poetry is capable of showing spiritual freedom both as concentrated inwardness and as action in space and time. It is equally at home in symbolic, classical and romantic art and, in this sense, is the “most unrestricted of the arts” (Aesthetics, 2: 626).
Poetry, for Hegel, is not simply the structured presentation of ideas, but the articulation of ideas in language, indeed in spoken (rather than just written) language. An important aspect of the art of poetry—and what clearly marks it off from prose—is thus the musical ordering of words themselves or “versification.” In this respect, Hegel claims, there are important differences between classical and romantic art: the ancients place more emphasis on rhythmic structure in their verse, whereas in Christendom (especially in France and Italy) greater use is made of rhyme (PKÄ, 201–4).
The three basic forms of poetry identified by Hegel are epic, lyric and dramatic poetry.
184.108.40.206 Epic and Lyric poetry
Epic poetry presents spiritual freedom—that is, free human beings—in the context of a world of circumstances and events. “In the epic,” Hegel states, “individuals act and feel; but their actions are not independent, events [also] have their right.” What is described in such poetry, therefore, is “a play between actions and events” (PKÄ, 208). Epic individuals are situated individuals, caught up in a larger enterprise (such as the Trojan War in Homer’s Iliad). What they do is thus determined as much by the situation in which they find themselves as by their own will, and the consequences of their actions are to a large degree at the mercy of circumstances. Epic poetry thus shows us the worldly character—and attendant limitations—of human freedom. (In this respect, Hegel notes, Alexander the Great would not have made a good subject for epic poetry, because “his world was his army”— his creation under his control—and so was not truly independent of his will [PKÄ, 213].)
Among the great epic poems Hegel discusses are Homer’s Odyssey, Dante’s Divine Comedy and the mediaeval Spanish poem El Cid. Much of what he has to say about the epic, however, is based on his reading of Homer’s Iliad. In the modern period, Hegel maintains, the epic gives way to the novel (PKÄ, 207, 217).
In contrast to the epic hero, the subject of lyric poetry does not undertake tasks, journeys or adventures in the world but simply gives expression—in hymns, odes or songs—to the self’s ideas and inner feelings. This can be done directly or via the poetic description of something else, such as a rose, wine, or another person. As always, Hegel’s remarks about lyric poetry bear witness to his extraordinary erudition and to his critical acumen. He lavishes particular praise on Goethe’s West-Eastern Divan (1819) but criticizes the eighteenth-century poet Friedrich Gottlieb Klopstock for wanting to create a new “poetic mythology” (Aesthetics, 2: 1154–7; PKÄ, 218).
220.127.116.11 Dramatic Poetry
Dramatic poetry combines the principles of epic and lyric poetry. It shows characters acting in the world—in a given situation —but their actions issue directly from their own inner will (rather than being co-determined by events beyond the agent’s control). Drama thus presents the—all too often self-destructive—consequences of free human action itself.
Drama, for Hegel, is the “highest” and most concrete art (PKÄ, 205)—the art in which human beings themselves are the medium of aesthetic expression. (Seeing a play performed by actors, as opposed to hearing it read aloud or reading it for oneself, is thus central, in Hegel’s view, to the experience of drama [Aesthetics, 2: 1182–5; PKÄ, 223–4].) Drama, indeed, is the art in which all the other arts are contained (virtually or actually): “the human being is the living statue, architecture is represented by painting or there is real architecture,” and—in particular in Greek drama—there is “music, dance and pantomime” (PKÄ, 223). At this point, it is tempting to say that, for Hegel, drama—to use Richard Wagner’s expression—is the “total work of art” (Gesamtkunstwerk). It is doubtful, however, whether Hegel would have been sympathetic to Wagner’s project. Hegel remarks that drama takes the explicit form of a “totality” in opera, which belongs more to the sphere of music than to drama proper (PKÄ, 223). (He has in mind in particular the operas of Gluck and Mozart.) In drama as such, by contrast, language is what predominates and music plays a subordinate role and may even be present only in the virtual form of versification. The Wagnerian idea of a “music drama” that is neither a straightforward opera nor a simple drama would thus appear, from Hegel’s point of view, to confuse two distinct arts.
Drama, for Hegel, does not depict the richness of the epic world or explore the inner world of lyric feeling. It shows characters acting in pursuit of their own will and interest and thereby coming into conflict with other individuals (even if, as in the case of Hamlet, after some initial hesitation). Hegel distinguishes between tragic and comic drama and between classical and romantic versions of each. (He also notes that in some plays, such as Goethe’s Iphigenie auf Tauris, tragedy threatens but is averted by acts of trust or forgiveness [Aesthetics, 2: 1204].)
In classical Greek tragedy individuals are moved to act by an ethical interest or “pathos,” such as concern for the family or for the state. The conflict between Antigone and Creon in Sophocles’ Antigone is of this kind, as is the conflict acted out in Aeschylus’ Oresteia. In Sophocles’ Oedipus the King the conflict is not a straightforwardly ethical one, but it is nonetheless a conflict between two “rights”: the right of consciousness to accept responsibility only for what it knows it has done, and the right of the “unconscious”—of what we do not know—to be accorded respect. The tragedy of Oedipus is that he pursues his right to uncover the truth about the murder of Laius without ever considering that he himself might be responsible for the murder or, indeed, that there might be anything about him of which he is unaware (Aesthetics, 2: 1213–14).
Greek tragic heroes and heroines are moved to act by the ethical (or otherwise justified) interest with which they identify, but they act freely in pursuit of that interest. Tragedy shows how such free action leads to conflict and then to the violent (or sometimes peaceful) resolution of that conflict. At the close of the drama, Hegel maintains, we are shattered by the fate of the characters (at least when the resolution is violent). We are also satisfied by the outcome, because we see that justice has been done. Individuals, whose interests—such as the family and the state—should be in harmony with one another, set those interests in opposition to one another; in so doing, however, they destroy themselves and thereby undo the very opposition they set up. In the self-destruction of such “one-sidedly” ethical characters, Hegel believes, we, the audience, see the work of “eternal justice” (Aesthetics, 2: 1198, 1215). This reconciles us to the fate of the characters and so provides the sense of “reconciliation which art should never lack” (Aesthetics, 2: 1173).
In modern tragedy—by which Hegel means above all Shakespearean tragedy—characters are moved not by an ethical interest, but by a subjective passion, such as ambition or jealousy. These characters, however, still act freely and destroy themselves through the free pursuit of their passion. Tragic individuals, therefore—whether ancient or modern—are not brought down by fate but are ultimately responsible for their own demise. Indeed, Hegel maintains, “innocent suffering is not the object of high art” (PKÄ, 231–2). Drama that sees people primarily as victims of circumstance or oppression (such as Georg Büchner’s Woyzeck ) is thus, from a Hegelian point of view, drama without genuine tragedy.
In comedy individuals also undermine their own endeavors in some way, but the purposes that animate them are either inherently trivial ones or grand ones which they pursue in a laughably inappropriate way. In contrast to tragic characters, truly comic figures do not identify themselves seriously with their laughable ends or means. They can thus survive the frustration of their purposes, and often come to laugh at themselves, in a way that tragic figures cannot. In this respect, Hegel claims, characters in many modern comedies, such as those by Molière, are frequently ridiculous, but not genuinely comic, characters: we laugh at Molière’s miser or Shakespeare’s Malvolio, but they do not laugh with us at their own foibles. Truly comic figures are found by Hegel in the plays of the ancient Greek dramatist Aristophanes. What we encounter in such plays, Hegel maintains, is “an infinite light-heartedness and confidence felt by someone raised altogether above his own inner contradiction and not bitter or miserable in it at all: this is the bliss and ease of a man who, being sure of himself, can bear the frustration of his aims and achievements” (Aesthetics, 2: 1200). Modern equivalents of such Aristophanic light-heartedness may be found in Verdi’s Falstaff (1893) and in the unrivalled comic genius of Homer Simpson, both of which, of course, were unknown to Hegel.
Comedy, in Hegel’s view, marks the “dissolution of art” (Aesthetics, 2: 1236). Yet the way in which comedy “dissolves” art differs from the way in which modern ironic humor does so. Ironic humor—at least of the kind found in the work of Jean Paul Richter—is the expression of the “power of subjective notions, flashes of thought” to “destroy and dissolve everything that proposes to make itself objective” (Aesthetics, 1: 601). It is the expression of the unchallenged mastery of wit. Since Hegel does not regard such arbitrary mastery as genuine freedom, he argues that works of ironic humor in which this mastery is exhibited no longer count as genuine works of art. True comedy, by contrast, is the expression of a sense of wholeness, self-confidence and well-being—of subjective freedom and life —that survives the loss of mastery and control over one’s life. Plays that express such freedom count as genuine works of art. Yet they are works that show freedom to reside precisely not in the works we undertake but within subjectivity itself, within subjectivity that happily endures the frustration of its laughable aims.
According to Hegel, the idea that true freedom is to be found in inner spirituality that is prepared to let go of, or to “die to,” its own selfish purposes lies at the heart of religion, specifically of Christianity. True comedy, therefore, implicitly points beyond art to religion. It is in this way—and not by ceasing to be art—that comedy “dissolves” art.
Comedy thus takes art to its limit: beyond comedy there is no further aesthetic manifestation of freedom, there is only religion (and philosophy). Religion, in Hegel’s view, does not make the aesthetic expression of freedom redundant; indeed, it is often the source of the greatest art. Yet religion provides a more profound understanding of freedom than art, just as philosophy provides a clearer and more profound understanding of freedom than religion.
Hegel’s aesthetics has been the focus of—often highly critical—attention since his death from philosophers such as Heidegger, Adorno and Gadamer. Much of this attention has been devoted to his supposed theory of the “end” of art. Perhaps Hegel’s most important legacy, however, lies in the claims that art’s task is the presentation of beauty and that beauty is a matter of content as well as form. Beauty, for Hegel, is not just a matter of formal harmony or elegance; it is the sensuous manifestation in stone, color, sound or words of spiritual freedom and life. Such beauty takes a subtly different form in the classical and romantic periods and also in the different individual arts. In one form or another, however, it remains the purpose of art, even in modernity.
These claims by Hegel are normative, not just descriptive, and impose certain restrictions on what can count as genuine art in the modern age. They are not, however, claims made out of simple conservatism. Hegel is well aware that art can be decorative, can promote moral and political goals, can explore the depths of human alienation or simply record the prosaic details of everyday life, and that it can do so with considerable artistry. His concern, however, is that art that does these things without giving us beauty fails to afford us the aesthetic experience of freedom. In so doing, it deprives us of a central dimension of a truly human life.
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