First published Sat Nov 6, 2010; substantive revision Fri Aug 18, 2023

The Madhyamaka school of Buddhism, the followers of which are called Mādhyamikas, was one of the two principal schools of Mahāyāna Buddhism in India, the other school being the Yogācāra. The name of the school is a reference to the claim made of Buddhism in general that it is a middle path (madhyamā pratipad) that avoids the two extremes of eternalism—the doctrine that all things exist because of an eternal essence—and annihilationism—the doctrine that things have essences while they exist but that these essences are annihilated just when the things themselves go out of existence. The conviction of the Madhyamaka school, which can be called the Centrist school in English, is that this middle path is best achieved by a denial that things have any inherent natures at all. All things are, in other words, empty of inherent natures. This doctrine of universal emptiness of inherent natures (svabhāva-śūnyatā) is the hallmark of the school, which places the school solidly in the tradition associated with the Perfection of Wisdom (prajñāpāramitā) literature of Mahāyāna Buddhism.

The key texts of the school comprised commentaries to the writings of Nāgārjuna—the works of Nāgārjuna most often commented upon are the Mūla-madhyamaka-kārikā (MMK) and Vigraha-vyāvartanī (VV)—and a number of independent works that expanded on ideas found in Nāgārjuna’s writings. A few of the Sanskrit treatises of the early Madhyamaka school were translated into Chinese and became the basis of a short-lived school of Chinese Buddhism. A significant number of Sanskrit Madhyamaka texts were eventually translated into Tibetan and exerted considerable influence on the intellectual heritage of Tibetan Buddhism. This article will deal only with the Madhyamaka school in India from the fifth through the eighth centuries, during which time the school underwent most of its evolution.

1. Issues in the Madhyamaka school

There a number of points that all Mādhyamika thinkers have in common. In all of them one finds some version of the doctrine of two truths, according to which there is a level of understanding that consists of an accurate account of the world as it is experienced in everyday life and another level of understanding that is conducive to reaching the ultimate goal (paramārtha) of Buddhist practice, namely, nirvana, understood as the absence of attachment, aversion and delusion with no possibility of their return. There is also broad agreement that language is limited to the everyday level of understanding and that the truth of nirvana is beyond the reach of language and of the conceptualization that makes language possible.

Where differences arise among Mādhyamika thinkers is on the issue of how these two truths relate to one another. Does careful verbalization and thinking do any good in bringing one closer to nirvana, or is it invariably an obstacle? Is there any room within Madhyamaka for clear thinking and carefully wrought argumentation, or are all attempts to arrive at clear thought and rigorous argumentation ultimately delusional and therefore to be abandoned along with more obvious forms of delusion?

Another area in which Mādhyamakas differ from one another is in their attitude toward the other main school of Mahāyāna Buddhism, the Yogācāra school, which Mādhyamikas present as advocating a kind of subjective idealism. Early Mādhyamikas tended to refute the Yogācāra doctrine that all the contents within awareness arise out of awareness itself and are thus ontologically at one with consciousness. Later Mādhyamikas found room for that view, usually by portraying Yogācāra as a philosophy that prepares one intellectually and emotionally for the difficult truth that all things are lacking in inherent natures and all that we think of as knowledge is ultimately without grounding.

2. Āryadeva (fl. ca. 225–250 C.E.)

According to traditional accounts preserved in Tibetan and Chinese, Āryadeva was born into the royal family in what is now Sri Lanka, renounced his claim to the throne, took monastic vows, studied the Buddhist scriptures for several years, and travelled to south India. He reportedly became a direct disciple of Nāgārjuna. His principal writing, the Catuḥśatakaśāstra (Four Hundred Verse Treatise), was regarded as a Madhayamaka text and was commented on by Candrakīrti and by prominent Tibetan proponents of the Madhyamaka school.

The first hundred verses of the Four Hundred Verse Treatise deal with four illusions that must be dispelled by someone striving to achieve liberation from the root causes of dissatisfaction. The four illusions are the beliefs that there are permanent things in the world that escape destruction, that impermanent things can provide true satisfaction, that satisfaction can be derived from intrinsically impure things, and that satisfaction can be attained by being preoccupied with oneself. These are standard themes in Buddhist writings. The second set of one hundred verses also deal with standard Buddhist themes, namely, cultivating altruistic motivations, ridding the mind of the afflictions of desire, anger, and delusion, and developing habits of ethical conduct. While the first half of the treatise is essentially inspirational in nature, the second half provides arguments meant to prove that all things are conditioned and therefore impermanent, that nothing qualifies as an independent and enduring self, and that there are no uncaused causes. Most of the verses dealing with these topics are polemical in nature and are aimed at refuting the doctrines of Brahmanical schools, Jainism and some of the Buddhist scholastics. As is the case with other Mādhyamikas, Āryadeva focuses most of his attention on showing the incomprehensibility or absurdity of the doctrines under review. His motivation for doing this is suggested in 8.10 (the tenth verse in the eighth set of twenty-five), where he says attachment to one’s own views and disparaging the views of others is an obstacle to nirvana, and tranquillity is impossible for those who engage in doctrinal disputes. His exercise in showing the untenability of various positions, then, is presumably done not for the sake of refuting others in order to establish his own position, but to help his readers break the habit of firmly holding tenets.

An example of Āryadeva’s demonstrating an inconsistency in a particular position is his critique of the view that there is a permanent self. He observes that since a permanent self could not undergo change, it could not be harmed or destroyed, and therefore it is inconsistent for those who believe in such a self to promote ethical guidelines against killing or harming others. While Āryadeva endeavors in some chapters to show the inconsistencies in a number of particular doctrines of the Sāṃkhya and Vaiśeṣika schools, in the fourteenth chapter he provides a paradigm of an argument that can be applied to any number of doctrinal positions. That paradigm, which is familiar to readers of Nāgārjuna and other Mādhyamikas, consists in showing that there is a problem in attributing a given predicate to a subject, and in attributing the negation of that predicate, and in attributing both the predicate and its negation, and in attributing neither the predicate nor its negation. For example, he argues that one cannot say that a pot is single, for it has many characteristics, such as color, shape, hardness, odor and so forth. It also cannot be said that the pot is many pots, because none of the individual characteristics is a pot. It cannot be said that the pot is a single whole with many characteristics, because some of its components are material and therefore capable of contact and location, while others, such as color and odor, are immaterial and have no location; it makes no sense to say that characteristics that have contrary natures form a coherent whole. And yet to deny that a pot is either one or many is to deny that it exists at all, for an existent thing must have either a property or the absence of that property. Āryadeva’s statements of these arguments in verse is laconic and often difficult to follow; therefore, most readers who study his text do so with the help of one of the many commentaries written by later Sanskrit or Tibetan authors.

3. Buddhapālita

Aside from a commentary entitled Akutobhaya (Afraid of nothing), which is traditionally ascribed to Nāgārjuna but the authorship of which is questioned by modern scholars, the earliest extant commentary to Nāgārjuna’s MMK is the Madhyamakavṛtti by Buddhapālita (ca 470–ca 540). The original Sanskit of this text is not known to exist, but it is still extant in Tibetan translation. Buddhapālita’s commentary, like Akutobhaya stays close to the text upon which it is a commentary. The MMK is written in verse, and Buddhapālita’s commentary places the words of the verse text into standard prose word order and offers glosses to disambiguate potentially confusing words. Like the MMK itself, Buddhapālita’s commentary does not offer a positive position but rather shows the untenability of all the apparently possible solutions to the philosophical questions taken up for examination. The principal method of examining a position in MMK and in Buddhapālita’s commentary is to show that unwelcome consequences are entailed by the position under consideration.

An example of the approach used by Nāgārjuna and Buddhapālita is their discussion of the relation between a cause and its effect, the topic taken up in MMK 1.1. There are only four possible relationships: the cause is the same as the effect, the cause is different from the effect, the cause is both the same as and different from the effect, or the cause is neither the same as nor different from the effect. This fourth position would be tantamount to saying that there is no cause, and that an effect therefore arises out of nothing at all. Each of these four possibilities is rejected in turn, each for a different reason. Buddhapālita argues that if an effect were identical to its cause, then it would already exist as the cause and would have no need of coming into being a second time. Identity of cause and effect defeats the very idea of causality. If the effect were different from the cause, on the other hand, then there would be no constraints on what could arise out of what, so long as the cause and the effect were different. The third possibility is untenable, says Buddhapālita, since it is merely the conjunction of the two hypotheses that have just been shown to be untenable. A proposition consisting of the conjunction of two false propositions cannot be true. The fourth possibility, like the first, undermines the very idea of causality. Moreover, says Buddhapālita, it would render all practice ineffectual; what he probably had in mind here was specifically Buddhist religious practice, which is predicated on identifying the root causes of dissatisfaction and then eliminating those root causes so that dissatisfaction disappears.

Beyond showing the untenability of each of the relations that were discussed as possible relations between the relata in a particular situation, Nāgārjuna and Buddhapālita have little to say. Opponents to the Madhyamaka school were critical of this approach, saying in effect that there is little value in finding fault with a philosophical view unless one is prepared to offer a better view to replace the faulty one. As will become more clear in what follows, it was precisely this issue—that is, whether there is a value in simply finding faults in philosophical views—that became controversial among Mādhyamikas.

4. Bhāvaviveka

The strongest challenge to the commentarial tradition of Buddhapālita came from Bhāvaviveka, whose approach to Madhyamaka became the basis of what Tibetan Buddhists would many centuries after the fact consider a subschool of Madhyamaka that rivallled the subschool comprising those who followed Buddhapālita.

4.1 Life and works

Bhāvaviveka, who was also known as Bhavya and Bhāviveka, was probably active in the middle part of the sixth century. His commentary on MMK, entitled Prajñāpradīpa (Lamp of Wisdom), now extant only in Chinese and Tibetan translations, contains not only his interpretation of Nāgārjuna’s thoughts but also critiques of Buddhapālita’s approach to Madhyamaka, about which more will be said below, and critiques of the Buddhist abhidharma tradition. Prajñāpradīpa also incorporates critiques of such non-Buddhist schools as Sāṃkhya, Vaiśeṣika and the Jains.

In addition to his commentary to MMK, Bhāvaviveka wrote an important independent verse treatise on Madhyamaka entitled Madhyamakahṛdayakārikā (Verses on the Heart of Centrism) to which he provided a prose commentary called Tarkajvālā (Flame of Reasoning). This combination of works comprises eleven chapters.

  1. On cultivating and maintaining bodhicitta, that is, the aspiration to become enlightened in order to work for the benefit and ultimate liberation of all sentient beings
  2. Following the Buddhist vows
  3. Striving for a knowledge of reality
  4. Reality as understood by the conservative canonical Buddhists (Śrāvakas)
  5. Reality as understood by the Yogācāra school of Buddhism
  6. Reality as understood by the Sāṃkhya school
  7. Reality as understood by the Vaiśeṣika school
  8. Reality as understood by the Vedānta schools
  9. Reality as understood by the Mīmāṃsā school
  10. The realization of omniscience
  11. On the characteristics of praise

As the titles of the chapters of this work show, Bhāvaviveka was a student of most of the important movements in Indian philosophy of his era and sought to stake out the place of the Madhyamaka school within Buddhism as a whole. His understanding of Madhyamaka was importantly different from Buddhapālita’s. Their different approaches turned out to define two of the three important sub-schools of Madhyamaka.

4.2 Contributions

A distinguishing characteristic of Bhāvaviveka’s approach to Madhyamaka is his conviction that a Mādhyamika should put forward a positive argument for a position rather than merely showing the inadequacies of other positions. His criticism of Buddhapālita was focused primarily on that very point; Buddhapālita offered no statement of what the Mādhyamikas believe but confined himself to pointing out that what other people believe is untenable in one way or another. To criticize the positions of others but not to venture to state a position of one’s own was regarded by the Indian debate tradition as a substandard use of argumentation called vitaṇḍā, which literally means making an attack. Bhāvaviveka was at pains to show that Mādhyamikas could not legitimately be accused of this sort of philosophical sniping. He affirmed that Mādhyamikas do have a conviction that they are prepared to state and defend, namely, that all phenomena are devoid of an inherent nature, that is, a nature that they have independently. All phenomena are conditioned, and such natures as they have are natures that they acquire through their conditions rather than on their own. The concise Madhyamaka way of saying all this is to say that all phenomena (dharmas) are empty (śūnya). Since the Mādhyamikas believe that all phenomena are empty, they owe it to their readers to provide reasons for thinking that that is a reasonable thing to believe.

In providing arguments in favor of the conclusions accepted by Mādhyamikas, Bhāvaviveka followed the example set by Dignāga (fl. ca. 510), a Buddhist whose principal contributions were in the area of epistemology and logic. Dignāga, following with some modifications philosophers of the Brahmanical Nyāya school, had devised a canonical form of presenting arguments, which consisted in identifying a topic (pakṣa) and reasoning on the basis of an observed feature of the topic that it also had another feature not currently available for direct observation. The stock example given in Indian logic is that if a particular mountain is the topic, one can reason on the basis of observing smoke associated with that mountain that there is also a fire associated with that mountain. Attributing an unobserved feature to a topic on the basis of an observed feature is legitimate only if one has previously observed the feature used as evidence together with the feature being inferred, and if one has never seen the feature used as evidence in the absence of the feature being inferred. Dignāga’s method of presenting an argument consists, then, in stating a topic (pakṣa) and a property used as evidence (sādhaka-dharma) for a property to be established (sādhya-dharma). Bhāvaviveka followed this method in arguing for the conclusions of which he claimed Mādhyamikas are convinced; he also criticized Buddhapālita for failing to follow Dignāga’s method.

In his discussion of MMK 1.1, Bhāvaviveka makes the general observation that when Nāgārjuna negates a proposition, he is negating the entire proposition rather than negating just the predicate. If one negates just a predicate, that leaves open the possibility that some other predicate can suitably be applied to the subject in question. Negation of a predicate in a proposition presupposes the existence of the subject of the proposition, whereas negation of the entire proposition need not rest on such a presupposition. So when Nāgārjuna says that a phenomenon does not arise from itself, one should understand that to be a way of saying “It is not the case that a phenomenon arises from itself.” If one were to construe Nāgārjuna’s statement as equivalent to something like “The arising of a phenomenon is not from the phenomenon itself,” then one would naturally take that to be saying that the arising of a phenomenon is from something other than itself. Alternatively, one might take it to be saying that the arising of a phenomenon is not only from itself but rather from something that is partly itself and partly something other than itself. If one takes Nāgārjuna’s proposition to be a series of conjoined propositions of the form “It is not the case that a phenomenon arises from itself and it is not the case that a phenomenon arises from something other than itself, and it is not the case that a phenomenon arises from itself in cooperation with something other than itself, and it is not the case that a phenomenon arises from nothing at all,” then there is no paradox involved in negating both a simple proposition and its contradiction. It is therefore important to make it clear when Nāgārjuna’s negations are sentential negations and when they are term-negations, and this Buddhapālita failed to do.

Bhāvaviveka goes on to explain that Nāgārjuna employed sentential negations in MMK 1.1, because he was trying to establish a kind of “non-conceptual cognition,” that is, an insight that cannot be expressed in words. The scope of this non-conceptual insight is everything that is capable of being cognized. In other words, Nāgārjuna’s insight was that everything that one thinks one knows, every explanation one thinks one has to account for one’s experiences, is flawed and must ultimately be abandoned. In saying this, Bhāvaviveka is consistent with a number of important statements in MMK and VV. Nāgārjuna had laid emphasis on the claim that the Buddha had dealt out two kinds of truth, a quotidian transactional or conventional truth (vyavahāra-satya, saṃvṛti-satya) and a truth concerning the highest goal (paramārtha-satya), namely, nirvana. Of these, only the transactional truth is capable of being articulated in language. The highest goal, consisting of a silence of the mind in which there is no conceptual thinking, is naturally inexpressible in language, since language is necessarily bound up with concepts. Some form of this view was shared by all Mādhyamikas. Where they differed with one another was on the issue of how the teachings of Buddhism, which are communicated in language, relate to the highest goal of Buddhism, which lies outside the scope of language.

Nāgārjuna wrote in MMK 18.9 that the defining characteristics of reality (tattva, literally, “thatness” or quiddity) are that it is not conditioned by something other than itself, it is peaceful, it cannot be elaborated through verbal elaborations, it is non-conceptual, and it is uniform. In his commentary to that verse, Bhāvaviveka expands the meaning of the verse by saying that anything that is not conceptual in nature cannot be expressed through verbal elaborations or through any other kind of sign. In other words, what is non-conceptual in nature cannot be known indirectly, and knowledge gained through language is always mediated and indirect. For this reason, reality is entirely outside the range of language. That notwithstanding, says Bhāvaviveka, what language can do is convey something about the general nature of what is talked about. The statement that phenomena are lacking in inherent natures, for example, does convey useful general information about reality. Even though reality itself can be known only directly through a non-conceptual awareness, language can be helpful in conveying that very information, namely, that reality can be apprehended only directly and not through language. That the Mādhyamika has, and defends, the view that reality lacks inherent nature means that the Mādhyamika is not merely engaging in philosophical sniping of the vitaṇḍā variety.

In his Tarkajvālā, in which Bhāvaviveka is freed from the constraints of following Nāgārjuna’s texts and puts forward his own approach to Madhyamaka, he states that the term “highest goal” (paramārtha-satya) has two aspects. One aspect is that it is free from volitional thought, pure and beyond the reach of verbal elaborations. Another aspect is that it is volitional in nature, connected with the accumulation of knowledge and meritorious karma, and connected with verbal elaborations and with the transactional knowledge of everyday life. By seeing the ultimate goal in this way, Bhāvaviveka claims to give an account that leaves reality intact as a uniform whole about which knowledge can be diverse and incremental. This incremental nature of knowledge makes ample room for the traditional Mahāyāna teachings of the gradated bodhisattva path whereby one moves from the aspiration for enlightenment to the gradual realization of enlightenment. A metaphor that Bhāvaviveka uses for the Buddhist path is that it follows verbal teachings which are like a ladder that one slowly ascends until one can climb over the wall into non-conceptual direct awareness of the peaceful reality of nirvana in which there is nothing to be wished for, nothing to be understood and no hypothesis to be defended.

5. Candrakīrti

5.1 Life and works

As is usual for the majority of Indian philosophers, very little is known about the life of Candrakīrti. Modern scholars place him at the beginning of the seventh century. His two best-known works are his commentary to MMK entitled Prasannapadā Madhyamakavṛtti (Clear-worded Commentary on Centrism), which survives in Sanskrit as well as in Tibetan translation, and an independent treatise called Madhyamakāvatāra (Introduction to Centrism) available only in Tibetan translation. Madhyamakāvatāra is a verse text to which Candrakīrti provided a prose commentary. It is clearly an earlier work than his commentary to MMK, since in that commentary he refers the reader repeatedly to Madhyamakāvatāra for the full arguments for the positions he endorses. Both Prasannapadā and Madhyamakāvatāra have been studied by modern scholars and a significant number of passages have been translated into modern European languages. In addition to those works, Candrakīrti wrote a number of commentaries to relatively short texts by Nāgārjuna and Āryadeva.

5.2 Contributions

At the beginning of his commentary to MMK, Candrakīrti offers an extended criticism of Bhāvaviveka and a defense of Buddhapālita against the criticisms of Bhāvaviveka. Many centuries after he wrote, Buddhist scholastics in Tibet portrayed Candrakīrti as the founder of one of the subschools of the Madhyamaka that they perceived. Because Bhāvaviveka had advocated for producing independent (svatantra) arguments for the view that all phenomena are empty of inherent natures, the Tibetan scholastics dubbed his subschool the Svātantrika school; because Candrakīrti criticized that approach and advocated for being content to show the unwelcome consequences (prasaṅga) of all possible positions on any given philosophical issue, his subschool was named by Tibetans the Prāsaṅgika school of Madhyamaka. Although those terms were not used by Indian Mādhyamikas themselves, it has become standard practice in modern scholarship to portray the Madhyamaka school as comprising at least two subschools with those names and to see Bhāvaviveka and Candrakīrti as the founders of those two subschools.

The earlier of Candrakīrti’s two principal works, Madhyamakāvatāra, has ten chapters, one for each of the ten stages of the path of the bodhisattva. At each of these stages the bodhisattva focuses attention on one of the virtues that are to be brought to a stage of perfection (pāramitā). The virtues to be perfected are generosity; good habits of thought, word and deed; patience; courage; meditation; wisdom; proselytizing skill; application of vows; strength of character; and transcendental knowledge. The chapter dedicated to the sixth stage, at which wisdom is cultivated to perfection, is the chapter in which Candrakīrti lays out his most detailed exposition of the Madhyamaka school of philosophy. Candrakīrti begins this chapter with the claim that wisdom is like a sighted person who is capable of leading a group of blind people safely to a destination; similarly, wisdom guides all the other virtues to their destination of perfection. As for the content of wisdom, it is the realization that no phenomena come into being. Phenomena cannot arise from themselves, since that possibility would make arising unnecessary or redundant; if a thing already exists, it has no need to come into being. If, on the other hand, it were allowed that one being might rise out of a being other than itself, then there would be nothing to prevent one from saying that pitch darkness arises out of light. Another way of looking at the issue of production from causes is that the effect either already exists in the cause or it does not exist. If it already exists, it has no need or coming into being. If it does not exist, then it cannot be an agent that does the action of coming into being; but if there is no agent, then there is no action.

After showing that there cannot be any intelligible account of the arising of phenomena, Candrakīrti acknowledges that in everyday experience we encounter phenomena coming into being all the time. This leads to a discussion of the two truths. The ultimate truth—that is, truth concerning the highest goal—is that phenomena do not come into being; the conventional transactional truth, on the other hand, is that things do come into being and that their arising is conditioned. This conventional truth can therefore be understood as a kind of screen, an obstacle that stands in the way of seeing the ultimate truth. In other words, the putative truths of quotidian life are actually delusions that, if believed, prevent one from attaining the wisdom that is capable of leading to the imperturbable peace of nirvana. The truth of the highest goal cannot be conveyed in language; it can only be manifested in silence. That notwithstanding, the Buddha gave many teachings in words, so how is one to understand that? The Buddha, said Candrakīrti, spoke according to the linguistic conventions of the people to whom he talked. It is conventional to use pronouns such as “I” and “you” and words like “self”; without such pronouns, grammatically correct sentences cannot be formed. It does not follow from grammatical correctness, however, that those words used in sentences have referents. The Buddha’s insight was that there is no self, and yet he used the sort of conventional language that is commonly used by those who do believe that there is a self. Similarly, even though the Buddha realized that there are no phenomena coming into being and perishing, he spoke the same kinds of sentences used by those who believe that phenomena come into being through conditions and then perish when the conditions that sustain them are no longer operative. If one is going to use language at all, then one cannot avoid using words and constructions that apparently commit one to accepting the presuppositions upon which language rests. It is the task of the Mādhyamika philosopher to expose those presuppositions as untenable, to see that language is not grounded in realities but is purely conventional in nature. The Buddha, knowing what kinds of beliefs his listeners had, gave doctrines that helped people get past their false beliefs. For example, to those who believed in an enduring and unified and essentially independent self, says Candrakīrti, the Buddha taught that the self is not to be found in any of the aspects of being human that might be a candidate for being regarded as a self; he taught that the self is not the body, the personality, awareness, thoughts or feelings or anything else that arises through causes and conditions, nor is there anything outside those things that counts as a candidate for what people intuitively take to be their selves. To people who were inclined to a materialistic monism, the Buddha emphasized the importance of the mind as something that is independent of the body. (About this, more will be said below.)

As was discussed above (section 4.2), Bhāvaviveka criticized Buddhapālita for failing to state and defend the thesis of the Mādhyamikas. In the first chapter of his commentary to MMK, Candrakīrti comes to Buddhapālita’s defense and offers a sustained criticism of Bhāvaviveka, and of the tradition of Dignāga on whom Bhāvaviveka had based much of his approach. Bhāvaviveka’s call for an independent argument in favor of a conclusion accepted by Mādhyamikas, says Candrakīrti, is diametrically opposed to what Nāgārjuna and Āryadeva had written. Nāgārjuna had written in VV that he has no thesis to advance. He had also written that he apprehends no objects at all and therefore has no need to affirm or deny anything, and since he neither affirms nor denies any proposition, he need not supply any reasons to justify his stance. And Āryadeva had written that a person who makes no claims, either that anything exists or that something does not exist, cannot be refuted. Candrakīrti cites those passages with the additional comment that Buddhapālita had understood the spirit of Madhyamaka as set forth by those early Mādhyamikas. The Mādhyamika, Candrakīrti goes on to explain, does not put forward counter positions in opposition to the claims of other philosophers; rather, he shows the problems involved in the positions of others and argues only until the other philosophers realize the inadequacy of their positions and become silent. In the process of bringing others to silence, the Mādhyamika need not construct formal arguments, nor need he be consistent in what he says. Following Āryadeva’s observation, Candrakīrti says that the Mādhyamika cannot be refuted, precisely because he has no position to defend. If Buddhapālita had put forth arguments, then he would have opened himself up to endless disputation; since, however, he knew that the purpose of Madhyamaka is to bring all disputation, and indeed all kinds of idle chatter, to an end, he wisely avoided putting forth formal arguments that a persistent opponent might take as an invitation to debate. If Bhāvaviveka had understood the point of Madhyamaka, concludes Candrakīrti, he would not have made the criticisms he made of Buddhapālita.

After offering his criticisms of Bhāvaviveka, Candrakīrti addresses the school of Buddhist logic and epistemology founded by Dignāga. The followers of this school did not present themselves as Mādhyamikas, so Candrakīrti does not accuse them of having failed to understand Nāgārjuna properly. He does, however, confront them with having failed to supply a convincing response to the radical critique Nāgārjuna had made of the very enterprise of grounding convictions on indisputable foundations. He recapitulates a passage of Nāgārjuna’s VV in which it is said that any proposition that is supposed to be warranted must rest upon a foundation of either direct experience or one of three kinds of reasoning. But the very claim that a proposition is warranted by a foundation is itself a proposition, and as such it must either require a warrant of its own or be deemed self-validating. If it requires a warrant of its own, the result will be an infinite regress of propositions needing warrants; if it is declared self-validating, then why not say of all propositions they are self-validating? Dignāga and his followers went ahead and talked about the grounding of propositions as if Nāgārjuna had never questioned the enterprise. Unless they provide a clear and convincing response to what Nāgārjuna said, there is no reason for anyone to take them seriously.

One further Buddhist movement that Candrakīrti criticizes is the Yogācāra school, which he presents as advocating a form of subjective idealism. Their claim that the world of experience is consciousness only and that the contents of consciousness cannot be objects external to consciousness itself is supported by several texts within the Mahāyāna scriptural tradition. Candrakīrti explains these scriptures as examples of teachings that the Buddha gave to counter a particular kind of commonly held wrong view. There are, says Candrakīrti, those who mistakenly believe that all their suffering is due to causes outside themselves; they see themselves as unfortunate victims of a hostile world. The Buddha, wishing to make it clear that the predominant factor in dissatisfaction is the way one thinks about one’s experiences, said, in effect “It’s all in the mind.” It would be a mistake to take that statement literally and to conclude that nothing but consciousness exists and that the world of experience that feels as though it is external to consciousness is in fact produced by consciousness or is inseparable from consciousness. The Yogācāra offers good reasons to show that the contents of consciousness are conditioned and therefore are empty of inherent existence, but they fail to appreciate that exactly the same can be said of awareness itself. In other words, says Candrakīrti, the Yogācāra philosophers fail to acknowledge that everything, including consciousness itself, is empty.

In making the kinds of criticisms of other philosophers that Candrakīrti makes, he repeatedly advocates for taking ordinary experience seriously and at face value. In everyday experience, we feel that things arise and perish because of causes and conditions, and we feel that we are conscious subjects on whom an external world is impinging. We communicate with one another in readily comprehensible language. There is no reason to change any of that, no reason to replace everyday language with a more precise technical language that helps avoid misrepresenting the nature of things. At the same time, it is important to be aware that it cannot be shown that things have fixed natures and that there is no reason to believe about any of our beliefs that they are grounded. The task of philosophy for Candrakīrti is not to replace unwarranted beliefs with justified true beliefs, but to break the habit of forming beliefs, declaring them to be true, and then becoming attached to them.

6. Śāntideva

6.1 Life and works

According to traditional biographies, Śāntideva was born the son of a king but abandoned the royal household for life as a Buddhist monk. Best estimates of the time of his activity place him at the end of the seventh century. His best-known (and most frequently translated) work is Bodhicaryāvatāra (Introduction to the practice of enlightenment), also called Bodhisattvacaryāvatāra (Introduction to the practice of the bodhisattva). He also compiled Śikṣāsamuccaya, an annotated collection of passages from Mahāyāna scriptures for students, and he authored a commentary to Vasubandhu’s Triṃśikā, a key text in the Yogācāra tradition. Partly because he was a masterful stylist and wrote delightfully beautiful Sanskrit verse, and partly because his work exerted a strong influence on Tibetan Buddhism, Śantideva has been the focus of a considerable amount of modern scholarship in Japan, Europe and North America. All this makes him a good access point into Madhyamaka philosophy for those who are not specialists in Indian philosophy.

Bodhicaryāvatāra is a verse composition divided into ten chapters, each dealing with a different aspect of the traditional depiction of the bodhisattva’s career. The topics of the ten chapters are as follows:

  1. In praise of bodhicitta, the aspiration to become enlightened for the liberation of all sentient beings
  2. A reflection on cultivating good character through the confession of one’s personal shortcomings
  3. On acquiring bodhicitta
  4. On cultivating watchfulness with respect to bodhicitta
  5. On the guarding of awareness
  6. On the perfection of patience
  7. On the perfection of courage
  8. On the perfection of meditation
  9. On the perfection of wisdom
  10. On giving the merits accrued by cultivating virtues to all those suffering beings in need of merit

As is the case with most philosophical works written in verse, Bodhicaryāvatāra is usually studied with a prose commentary. Śāntideva himself provided no prose commentary to his work, but a Sanskrit commentary by Prajñākaramati is still extant and is usually consulted by those who translate the work into English from the original Sanskrit. Śāntideva’s work is also preserved in Tibetan translation and is furnished with several Tibetan commentaries, which are routinely consulted by those who translate Bodhicaryāvatāra into English from its Tibetan translation.

6.2 Contributions

Although beautifully written, Bodhicaryāvatāra does not display much philosophical originality. Its principal contribution is in offering a concise recapitulation of the currents of Madhyamaka thought and of Madhyamaka arguments against Yogācāra monism, which portrays consciousness as the ultimate source of all realities. While that is generally the case, one candidate for novelty occurs in earlier chapters of Bodhicaryāvatāra, where Śāntideva provides a line of argument that became standard in discussion of Mahāyāna ethics. His claim is that pain and unhappiness are by definition that which those who experience them wish to avoid. But given that there are no inherent natures that distinguish one person from another, or one kind of person from another kind, there is no rational basis to prefer one’s own experiences and judgments to those of anyone else or to prefer what one perceives as one’s own kind from other kinds of people. It is fundamentally irrational to take an interest only in one’s own pain and suffering; the only reasonable approach is to be concerned with all the pain and unhappiness of which one becomes aware and to try to eradicate all of it without making artificial distinctions. Since, however, most of what anyone finds painful and unpleasant arises from the conviction that some objects of experience are inherently undesirable or impure, the best strategy to follow in helping oneself and others overcome pain and suffering is to show that there is no basis for the belief that some objects are inherently undesirable or impure. That strategy also works, of course, when unhappiness arises from the frustration of not getting things that one falsely believes are inherently desirable and pure.

As was the case with Candrakīrti’s Madhyamakāvatāra, Śāntideva’s Bodhicaryāvatāra has the most to say about Madhyamaka philosophy in the chapter on the perfection of wisdom. A key verse in this chapter is 9.35, which says “When neither presence nor absence stands before the mind, the mind, having no content, calms down because of the absence of cognition.” This recapitulates a point made by both Nāgārjuna and Candrakīrti that the ultimate goal of Buddhist practice is nirvana, a stillness of the mind in which there is no object being grasped as the focus of awareness, no narratives (prapañca) being told to account for one’s experience, no theorizing and no argumentation. At the outset of the chapter on wisdom Śāntideva says that the ultimate truth is of a reality that is not within range of the intellect; the intellect operates only at the level of conventional truth. In this world there are two kinds of human being, which Śāntideva calls ordinary people (prākṛta loka) and meditators (yogin). The ordinary people are those who see the world in terms of presences and absences, being and non-being, but the conventional truths in which they trade are set aside by the truths of the meditators. The principal delusion of those who rely on conventional truths is that they mistakenly believe that propositions conventionally accepted as truth are grounded in the natures of things. Meditators, on the other hand, come to realize that things do not have inherent natures. That things do not have inherent natures cannot be established directly, but attempts to show that things do have inherent natures can be shown to be faulty. One who has cultivated the intention to become enlightened in order to lead others out of their delusion-driven suffering uses language to help people realize the limitations of language and conceptual thinking. In taking this approach, Śāntideva is clearly following the lead of Buddhapālita and Candrakīrti.

7. Jñānagarbha

7.1 Life and works

Jñānagarbha, who was most probably the teacher of Śāntarakṣita, probably lived in the early eighth century. Because his presentation of Madhyamaka incorporates much of the terminology used by Dharmakīrti, a member of the epistemological tradition founded by Dignāga, he is usually portrayed as a follower of Bhāvaviveka’s approach to Madhyamaka. Like his disciple Śāntarakṣita, Jñānagarbha also incorporates aspects of the Yogācāra philosophy into his presentation of Madhyamaka and can therefore be seen as a source of inspiration to those who strove to find a synthesis of the two principal schools of Mahāyāna Buddhism. He wrote a commentary to a key Mahāyāna scripture, Sandhinirmocanasūtra, which was one of the principal sources of the Yogācāra philosophy. He is best known for an independent treatise called Satya-dvaya-vibhaṅga-kārikā (Verses on the distinction between the two truths), on which he also provided a prose commentary. The verse text along with its commentary can be referred to together as Satyadvayavibhaṅga.

7.2 Contributions

Like all the Mādhyamika thinkers who came before him, Jñānagarbha regards it vitally important to have a clear understanding of two kinds of truth, the conventional and transactional truth of everyday life, and the truth that liberates one from attachment, aversion and delusion, this liberation being the ultimate goal (paramārtha) of Buddhism. In talking about these two truths, Jñānagarbha draws liberally from the work of Dharmakīrti, who had in turn built upon the epistemological foundations laid by Dignāga. Dharmakīrti had said that successful action is preceded by correct cognitions; what one deems to be truthful is any cognition that motivates action that leads to expected results. A true belief, then, is one that does not deceive one by promising to lead to a desired goal and then failing somehow to lead to that goal. A more positive way of expressing this, rather than saying a true belief is non-deceptive, is to say that a true belief is one that enables the realization of a goal (artha-kriyā-samartha). It turns out, said Dharmakīrti, that correct reasoning is instrumental in helping one form beliefs that motivate successful action. Therefore, one can say that conceptual thinking, when done carefully, can be of great value. Even when one’s goal is to achieve nirvana by having a direct experience of a still and peaceful awareness that is not conceptual and therefore beyond the range of language, one can arrive at that goal by learning to think carefully and clearly. Clear and careful thinking has the capacity to identify which of the ideas that arise in consciousness are ungrounded and delusional and therefore unlikely to motivate successful action. Clear and careful thinking about what one hears others say enables one to discard teachings that, if acted upon, are unlikely to produce expected results and to follow teachings that, if acted upon, will lead one to a desired goal, even the goal of the stillness of a mind that is not dealing in narratives and concepts. Without much modification, Jñānagarbha takes up Dharmakīrti’s terminology and the convictions that go with it. So Jñānagarbha, like Bhāvaviveka, sees value in conceptual thinking and in careful thinking and speaking and sees less of a need than Candrakīrti and Śāntideva saw in finding a way to eliminate all conceptual thinking and theorizing.

Jñānagarbha’s indebtedness to the epistemological tradition notwithstanding, he is still very much a Mādhyamika in that much of his approach consists in showing the absurdities that lurk menacingly inside all constructed theories. His notion of the ultimate goal, like Candrakīrti’s, is a wordless and concept-free lucid awareness, but he sees it as possible to reach that goal by using words and thoughts intelligently. Moreover, he agrees with other Mādhyamikas in his conviction that all thinking, even that which can be called verdical because it leads to expected results, is based on a presupposition that things have inherent natures—it is, after all, almost impossible to talk without at least an implicit nod in the direction of inherent natures and essences—and that that presupposition is demonstrably false. So according to Jñānagarbha rational thinking is simultaneously veridical, in that it leads to expected results, and false, in that it is based upon the demonstrably false presupposition that things that can be named are namable because they have inherent natures. While language operates within an ontology of causes and effects and various other kinds of relationship, such as temporal and spatial relationships, it can be shown that those relationships are all untenable if one thinks about them carefully and investigates them deeply enough.

At the heart of Jñānagarbha’s argument against the tenability of causality is his argument that none of the possible ways of looking at the relation of conditions and their effects are workable. There are four possibilities. Either many conditions produce a single effect, or many conditions produce many effects, or a single condition produces many effects, or a single condition produces a single effect. His presentation of an explanation for why each of these possibilities is untenable is in places terse and difficult to decipher. A single thing, such as vision, cannot be the effect of many conditions, such as the eye, visible color, an attentive mind and so forth, he says, because the effect has the feature of being one, while the causes are many, but there is nothing to account for what causes the reduction of many things to one. Without some coherent account of how a manifold can be reduced to a singularity, this hypothesis ends up being merely an assertion. If one imagines that a manifold set of causes produces a complex multiplicity of effects, then one is saying in effect that each component of the complex cause is producing one component of the complex effect, and this amounts to saying that there are many instances of one cause producing one effect. On the other hand, if one thinks that each aspect of the complex effect is a single effect of the totality of features within the complex cause, then one is saying that a single effect has many conditions, which has already been ruled out. Moreover, one faces the problem of explaining how the same totality of causes can have many distinct effects, each of which is a feature of the complex effect putatively arising from the causal complex. If one imagines that a multiplicity, such as the manifold universe, arises out of a single cause, such as God or Brahman or consciousness, then one must provide a coherent account of what causes the differentiation among the many effects. What one would expect is that some auxiliary condition combines with the single cause to produce different effects; but if that is the case, then a single cause plus an auxiliary condition is not really just a single cause. Finally, one might imagine that a single cause produces a single effect, such as when one momentary phenomenon perishes and in the act of perishing gives rise to a subsequent momentary phenomenon of the same kind. That, however, is impossible, since the putative cause must go entirely out of existence before its successor can takes its place, and once the preceding phenomenon has ceased to exist, there is nothing to cause its successor to arise. Since none of the possible ways of explaining causality turns out to survive close analysis, one can only conclude that the very ideas of causality, and of arising and perishing, and of unity and multiplicity cannot correspond to reality. Causality and arising and perishing and all the various relations that furnish the framework of conventional truth may be indispensable to conventional truth, but they cannot be features of reality. Jñānagarbha, like the Mādhyamikas who came before him, sees conventional truth as a kind of screen or obstacle to the reality that becomes apparent only to an awareness that is unencumbered by concepts and narratives.

8. Śāntarakṣita

8.1 Life and works

While it is difficult to find much reliable information about the lives of most Indian philosophers, quite a bit is known about the life, especially the later life, of Śāntarakṣita, details of whose life were recorded by Tibetans when he went to Tibet in about 763 and became the first abbot of Bsam-yas monastery. He was reportedly born into the royal family of what is now Bengal and spent his adult life in various Buddhist monastic universities. It is clear from his writings that he had studied all branches of Indian philosophy extensively. He seems to have been a direct disciple of Jñānagarbha, and his own disciple, Kamalaśīla, was also an influential thinker. Together Śāntarakṣita and Kamalaśīla, both of whom spent many years in Tibet, set the tone for Buddhist scholasticism in the eighth century, and their influence is felt in Tibetan Buddhism to this day. When Śāntarakṣita died in 788, he was succeeded by Kamalaśīla, who lived until 795.

Śāntarakṣita’s magnum opus is a composition entitled Tattva-saṃgraha (Summary of reality), which contains 3645 verses. The work was provided with a prose commentary by Kamalaśīla called Tattva-saṃgraha-pañjikā. A modern edition of the verse work and its commentary together runs to more than 1100 pages. Aside from its contribution to the development of Madhyamaka thought, the work is also a valuable source of information about the state of Indian philosophy in the eighth century. The work is divided into twenty-six chapters, the topics of which are as follows:

  1. The Sāṃkhya doctrine of primodial matter (prakṛti) as the source of the physical world
  2. Various doctrines of God as the source of the world
  3. The doctrine of inherent natures (svabhāva) as the source of the world
  4. Bhartṛhari’s doctrine of Brahman-as-language as the source of the world
  5. The Sāṃkhya-Yoga doctrine of human spirit (puruṣa)
  6. Examination of the doctrines of the self (ātman) in the Nyāya, Mīmāṃsā, Sāṃkhya, Digambara Jaina, Advaita and Buddhist personalist (pudgalavādin) schools
  7. The doctrine of the permanence of things
  8. Various doctrines of karma and its ripening
  9. A critical examination of substance
  10. A critical examination of quality
  11. A critical examination of action
  12. A critical examination of universals
  13. A critical examination of particularity
  14. A critical examination of inherence (the relation between universals and particulars and between substances and qualities)
  15. An examination of words and their meanings
  16. An examination of sense perception
  17. An examination of inference
  18. An examination of other means of acquiring knowledge
  19. A critical examination of Jaina epistemology
  20. An examination of time
  21. A critical examination of materialism
  22. On the external world (that is, the world external to consciousness)
  23. A critical examination of revelation as a source of knowledge
  24. Examination of the idea that some propositions are self-validating
  25. Examination of the notion of supernormal powers

In addition to Tattvasaṃgraha, Śāntarakṣita wrote commentaries on Dharmakīrti’s Vādanyāya (Methods of debate) and Jñānagarbha’s Satyadvayavibhaṅga. His most original contribution to the development of Madhyamaka philosophy is a verse treatise called Madhyamakālaṃkāra (Ornament of Centrism), which contains ninety-seven stanzas, to which he also provided a prose commentary.

8.2 Contributions

By the time Śāntarakṣita was active, the philosophy of the Yogacāra school had become so influential that it could not easily be dismissed. Whereas earlier Mādhyamikas wrote refutations of the Yogācara doctrine, which they presented as a kind of subjective idealism, Śāntarakṣita embraced it. Like Bhāvaviveka and Jñānagarbha, Śāntarakṣita adopted much of the terminology and the logic and epistemology of Dignāga and Dharmakīrti and their later followers. But whereas Bhāvaviveka had refrained from following Dignāga and Dharmakīrti’s lead into Yogacāra, Śāntarakṣita endorsed a kind of subjective idealism, albeit as a stage that prepared one for the Madhyamaka doctrine of the emptiness of all phenomena. Toward the end of Madhyamakālaṃkāra, in verses 92–93, he writes that by embracing the doctrine of mind only, one stops taking external objects as real; then by embracing Madhyamaka, one realizes that no objects at all have substance; then, taking the reins of reasoning, one rides the chariot of both systems as a single great vehicle (mahāyāna). The largest part of this treatise—where the reins of reasoning are taken up—is devoted to an extended version of the “neither one nor many” argument that had been presented by Jñānagarbha.

Madhyamakālaṃkāra begins with the observation that if a phenomenon has an essential nature, then either that nature is simple or complex, that is, it is either a single thing or many things; there is no third possibility. This leads to discussions of doctrines by several schools of Indian philosophy, both Buddhist and non-Buddhist. Each of the schools examined posits at least one entity that is completely uniform in nature and therefore has no internal differentiations. Several schools posit a uniform entity that is said to be the single source of all multiplicity. Drawing on arguments by earlier Buddhist thinkers such as Dharmakīrti, Śāntarakṣita argues that if there were a uniform, permanent and unobstructed singularity, then everything it supposedly causes would have to exist all the time. A cause is something in the presence of which an effect arises and in the absence of which the effect does not arise. But if a cause is permanent, then it is never absent, so none of its putative effects can ever be absent. In a theory that posits a single permanent cause of all things, there is no satisfactory account of all the changes that are experienced in daily life, nor is there any satisfactory account of temporal sequences or the fact that things exist in some places but not in others. This argument is applied to discredit the Sāṃkhya doctrine of primordial matter, the Nyāya doctrine of God, and the Vedāntin doctrine of Brahman. It is also applied to the Yogācāra doctrine that all things arise from consciousness. After arguing against the main candidates for singularity nominated by the various schools, Śāntarakṣita turns his attention to multiplicity. The very idea of multiplicity, he notes, only makes sense if one is talking about a collection of singularities. Given, however, that there are no singularities, there cannot be any collection of them. This being the case, no inherent nature of any entity can be either singular or multiple; if an entity has neither a singular nor a multiple inherent nature, it has no inherent nature at all. In other words, all phenomena are empty of inherent natures.


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