The Theory of Two Truths in Tibet

First published Thu Feb 17, 2011; substantive revision Sat May 28, 2022

Tibetan philosophers argue that the two truths theory is not only core ontological doctrine as it is understood within the Indian Buddhist thought, it also makes the central theory behind epistemology and soteriology. The Indian Buddhist schools are named after the theories of the two truths they each upheld as in the entry on the theory of the two truths in India. The same cannot be said about the schools of thought in Tibet. All Tibetan philosophers and the schools[1]—Nyingma, Kagyü, Sakya, and Gelug—they established are self-confessed followers of the Prāsaṅgika Madhyamaka school of thought, and follow Candrakīrti closely. Tibetans agree that Candrakīrti is the undisputed authority in commenting and interpreting Nāgārjuna’s Madhyamaka theory of the two truths. The Tibetan Prāsaṅgikas however disagreed, debated and fought fiercely amongst themselves concerning many philosophical questions. Who is the Prāsaṅgika? Does the Prāsaṅgika hold any position? What is it that constitutes the Prāsaṅgika’s core philosophical position? How should Candrakīrti’s hermeneutic approach towards Nāgārjuna be assessed, evaluated and interpreted? The debate amongst the Tibetan philosophers stems on a large part from the way in which they each differently interpreted and understood Candrakīrti’s theory of the two truths and its philosophical implications. The parameters within which this debate is conducted either in the monastic debate courtyards or in their philosophical writings, took a form around certain philosophical themes. Those themes later became the standard paradigmatic focus of any discussion on the subject of the two truths.

  • Basis of the division: What is divided into the two truths?
  • Etymological analysis (sgra bshad) of the two truths
  • Definition (mtshan nyid / nges tshig) of the two truths: Subjective or objective?
  • Enumeration (grangs nges): Is there one or two truths?
  • Classification (rab dbye): Are there many types of conventional truth or one?
  • Relation: Are the two truths distinct or identical?

Keeping with the Tibetan Madhyamaka traditions, the present essay on the theory of the two truths in Tibet focuses on the philosophical issues arising from and associated with these themes. Therefore our concern in this article is not historical evolution of the schools, or the philosophers and the ideas to which they each are associated, our concern is rather, first and foremost philosophical.

1. Nyingma

Longchen Rabjam sets out the course of the Nyingma theory of the truths and the later philosophers of the school took similar stance without varying much in essence. In Treasure he begins the section on the Madhyamaka theory of the two truths as follows: “The Madhyamaka tradition is the secret and profound teachings of the [Śākya]mūni. Although it constitues five ontological categories, the two truths subsume them” (Longchen, 1983: 204f).

Nyingma defines conventional truth as consisting of unreal phenomena that appear to be real to the erroneous cognitive processes of the ordinary beings while ultimate truth is reality which transcends any mode of thinking and speech, one that unmistakenly appears to the nonerroneous cognitive processes of the exalted and awakened beings. In other words (1) ultimate truth represents the perspective of epistemically correct and warranted cognitive process of exalted beings (‘phags pa); whereas (2) conventional truth represents the perspective of epistemically deceptive and unwarranted cognitive processes of the ordinary beings (Mipham Rinpoche 1993d: 543–544).

Let us consider these two definitions turn by turn. Nyingma supports definition (1) with two premises. The first one says that cognitive processes of the exalted (‘phags pa) and awakened beings (sang rgyas) are epistemically correct and non-deceptive, because “It is in relation to this cognitive content that the realisation of the ultimate truth is so designated. The object of an exalted cognitive process consists of the way things really are (gshis kyi gnas lugs), phenomena as they really are (chos kyi dbyings) which is undefiled by its very nature (rang bzin dag pa)” (Longchen 1983: 202f). However ultimate truth for Nyingma is not an object per se in the usual sense of the word. It is object only in the metaphorical sense. “From the [ultimate] perspective the meditative equipoise of the realised (sa thob) and awakened beings (sangs rgyas), there exists neither object of knowledge (shes bya) nor knowing cognitive process (shes byed) and so forth, for there is neither object to apprehend nor the subject that does the apprehending. Even the exalted cognitive process (yeshes) as a subject ceases (zhi ba) to operate” (Longchen 1983: 201f). Therefore “At this stage, [Nyingma] accepts the total termination (chad) of all the continua (rgyun) of the cognitive processes (‘jug pa) of the mind (sems) and mental factors (sems las byung ba). This exalted cognitive process which is inexpressible beyond words and thoughts (smra bsam brjod du med pa'i yeshes), and thus is designated (btags pa) as a correct and unmistaken cognitive process (yang dag pa'i blo ma khrul ba) as it knows the reality as it is” (Longchen 1983:201f).

The second premise comes from Nyingma’s transcendent theory. According to this theory ultimate truth constitutes reality and the reality constitutes transcendence of all elaborations. Reality is that which cannot be comprehended by the means of linguistic and conceptual elaboration, as it is utterly beyond the grasp of words and thoughts which merely defile the cognitive states. Given that exalted beings are free of defiled mental states, all forms of thoughts and conceptions are terminated in their realization of the ultimate truth. Ultimate truth transcends all elaborations, thus remains untouched by the philosophical speculations (Longchen, 1983: 203f). “In short the characteristic of [ultimate truth] is that of nirvāṇa, which is profound and peaceful. It is intrinsically unadulterated domain (dbyings). The cognitive process by means of which ultimate truth is realized must therefore be free from all cognitive limitations (sgribs pa), for it is disclosed to the awakened beings (sangs rgyas) in whose exalted cognitive processes appear the objects as they really are without being altered” (Longchen, 1983: 204f).

Nyingma’s defence of the definition (2) also has two premises. The first one comes from its theory of error, the most commonly used by the Nyingma philosophers. According to this theory, conventional truth is, as matter of fact, an error confined to the ordinary beings (so so skye bo) who are blinded by the dispositions (bag chags) of confusion (ma rig pa). It is argued that under the sway of confusion the ordinary beings falsely and erroneously believe in the reality of entirely unreal entities and the truth of wholly false epistemic instruments, just like the people who mistakenly grasps cataracts and falling hairs to be real objects. Conventional truths are mere errors that appear real to the ordinary beings, but they are in fact no more real than the falling hairs that are reducible into the “modes of apprehensions” (snang tshul) (Mipham Rinpoche 1993c: 3, 1977: 80–81ff, 1993d: 543–544).

The second premise comes from its representationalist or elaboration-theory which says that conventional truths constitute merely mental elaborations (spros pa) represented to appear (rnam par snang ba) in the minds of the ordinary beings as if they are realities having the subject-object relation. They are thus deceptive since they are produced through the power of the underlying cognitive confusion or ignorance, and that they do not cohere with any corresponding reality externally. Confusion is saṃvṛti because it conceals (sgrib) the nature, it fabricates all conditioned phenomena to appear as if they are real. Even though conventional truths are to be eventually eradicated (spang bya), the representational images of the conventional reality will nevertheless continue to appear in the minds of even those who are highly realized beings, that is, until they achieved a complete cessation of mind and mental states (Longchen, 1983: 203f). It is argued that when the eye that is affected by cataracts mistakenly sees hairs falling in containers, the healthy eye that is not affected by cataracts does not even perceive the appearances of falling hairs. Likewise, those who are affected by the cataracts of afflictive confusion see things as intrinsically real, hence for them things are conventionally real. Those noble beings who are free from the afflictive confusion and the awakened beings who are free from even the non-afflictive confusion see things as they are (ultimate truth). Just as the person without cataracts does not see the falling hairs, the noble beings and awakened beings do not see any reality of things at all.

Mipham Rinpoche also proposes another definition of the two truths which diverges significantly from the one we saw. As we saw Longchen’s definition is based on two radically opposed epistemic criteria whereas Mipham’s definition, as we shall see, has two radically opposed ontological criteria—one that withstands reasoned analysis and the other that does not withstand reasoned analysis. In his Clearing Dhamchoe’s Doubts (Dam chos dogs sel), Mipham says that: “Reality as it is (de bzhin nyid) is established as ultimately real (bden par grub pa). Conventional entities are actually established as unreal, they are subject to deception. Being devoid of such characteristics ultimate is characterized as real, not unreal and not non-deceptive. If this [reality] does not exist,” in Mipham’s view, “than it would be impossible even for the noble beings (ārya / phags pa) to perceive reality. They would, instead, perceive objects that are unreal and deceptive. If that is the case, everyone would be ordinary beings. There would be no one who will attain liberation” (1993a: 602).

Mipham anticipates objections to his definition from his Gelug opponents when he writes, “Someone may object: although ultimate truth is real (bden p), its reality is not established ultimately (bden grub), because to be established ultimately is for it to withstands reasoned analysis (rigs pas dpyad bzod)” (Mipham 1993a: 603). The response from Mipham makes it even clearer. “Conventional truth is not ultimately real (bden par grub pa) because it is not able to withstand reasoned analysis, in spite of the fact that those that are conventionally real (yang dag kun rdzob) are nominally real (tha snyad du bden pa) and are the objects of the dualistic cognitive processes” (Mipham 1993a: 603). In contrast: “Reality (dharmatā / chos nyid), ultimate truth, is really established (bden par grub pa) on the ground that it is established as the object of nondual exalted cognitive process. Besides, it withstands reasoned analysis, for no logical reasoning whatsoever can undermine it or destroy it. For that reason so long as it does not withstand reasoned analysis, it is not ultimate, it would be conventional entity” (Mipham 1993a: 603). According to Mipham’s argument, that an object that cannot withstand reasoned analysis is the kind of object that mundane cognitive processes find dually, and it is not the kind of object found by the exalted cognitive processes that perceive ultimate truth nondually (Mipham 1993a: 603).

As we have noticed, Mipham’s definition seems to have departed from Longchen’s some what significantly. In the final analysis, however, there does not seem to be much variation. Mipham Rinpoche also is committed to the representationalist argument to ascend to nonduality: “In the end,” he says, “there are no external objects. It is evident that they appear due to the force of mental impressions … All texts that supposedly demonstrate the existence of external objects are provisional [descriptions of] their appearances”(Mipham 1977: 159–60ff). Consequently whatever appears to exist externally, according to Nyingma, “is like a horse or an elephant appearing in a dream. When it is subjected to logical analysis, it finally boils down to the interdependent inner predispositions. And this is at the heart of Buddhist philosophy” (Mipham 1977: 159–60ff).

Following on from its definition, Nyingma argues that there is no one entity that can be taken as the basis from which divides the two truths; since there is no one entity which is both real (true) and unreal (false). Hence it proposes the two truths division based on the two types of epistemic practices “because it confirms a direct opposition between that which is free of the elaborations and that which is not free of the elaborations, and between what is to be affirmed and what is to be negated excluding the possibility of the third alternative. Thus it ascertains the two” (Longchen, 1983: 205–206ff). Nyingma has two key arguments to support the claim the two truths division is an epistemic. The first argument states, “It is definite that we posit the objects (yul rnams) in dependence upon the subjects (yul can). The subjects are exclusively two types—they are either ultimately (mthar thug pa) fallacious cognitive processes (khrul ba'i blo) or ultimately (mthar thug pa) non-fallacious cognitive processes (ma ‘khrula ba'i blo). The fallacious cognitive processes posit [conventional truth]—all saṃsāric phenomena—whereas as the non-fallacious cognitive processes posit the [ultimate] reality. Therefore it is due to the cognitive processes that we posit the objects in terms of two [truths]” (Longchen, 1983: 206f) The second argument states that ultimate truth is not an objective domain of the cognitive processes with the representational images (dmigs bcas kyi blo'i spyod yul), for the reason that it may be known by means of the exalted cognitive processes (yeshes) with no representational image (dmigs pa med). (Longchen, 1983: 206f) In contrast conventional truth is an objective domain of the cognitive processes with the representational images (dmigs bcas kyi blo'i spyod yul), for the reason that it may be known by means of the cognitive processes having the representational images (dmigs bcas kyi blo'i spyod ul).

Nyingma categorically rejects commitment to any philosophical position, for it would entail a commitment to, at least, some forms of elaborations. This is so since “the Prāsaṅgika rejects all philosophical systems, and does not accept any self-styled philosophical elaboration (rang las spros pas grub mtha’). (Longchen, 1983: 210ff) The Prāsaṅgika therefore presents the theory of the two truths and so forth by merely designating them in accordance with the mundane fabrications (sgro btags) (Longchen 1983: 211f). “Therefore ultimate truth which is transcendent of all elaborations cannot be expressed either as identical to or separate from the conventional truth. They are rather merely different in terms of negating the oneness (Longchen, 1983: 192–3ff, Mipham 1977: 84f). Interestingly Mipham Rinpoche also says that “the two truths constitute a single entity but different conceptual identities (ngo bo gcig la ldog pa tha dad). “This is because,” he says, “appearance and emptiness are indistinguishable. This is ascertained through reliable cognitions (tshad ma) by means of which the two truths are investigated. What appears is empty. If emptiness were to exist separately from what appears, the reality of that [apparent] phenomenon would not be empty. Thus the two [truths] are not distinct” (Mipham 1977: 81f). The identity of ultimate truth at issue here, according to Mipham, is that of absolute ultimate (rnam grangs min pa'i don dam ste), rather than provisional ultimate. This is because the kind of ultimate truth under discussion when we are discussing its relation with conventional truth is the ultimate truth “which is beyond the bound of any expression, although it is an object of direct perception” (Mipham 1977: 81f).

2. Kagyü

According to Karmapa Mikyö Dorje, Ātisha and his followers in Tibet, are the authoritative former masters of the Prāsaṅgika. It is this line of reading of the Prāsaṅgika that Kagyü takes it to be authoritative which the later Kagyü wholeheartedly embraces as the standard position (Mikyö Dorje, 2006: 272–273). Karmapa Mikyö Dorje cliams that it is a characteristic of Kagyü masters and their followers to recognise the ancient Prāsaṅgika tradition to be philosophically impeccable (‘khrul med) (2006: 272).

Unlike the other Tibetan schools, Kagyü rejects the more dominant view that each philosophical school in Indian Buddhism has its own distinctive theory of the two truths. “There are those who advance various theories proclaiming that the Vaibhāṣika on up to the Prāsaṅgika Madhyamaka, for the purpose of distinctive definitions of the two truths, unique rational and unique textual bases. This is true,” says Karmapa Mikyö Dorje, an indication “of the failure to understand the logic, and the differentiation between the definition (mtshan nyid) and the defined example (mtshan gzhi)” (Mikyö Dorje 2006: 293). The Indian Buddhist philosophical schools only disagree, according to Kagyü, on the issue concerning the defined example (mtshan gzhi) of the two truths. The instances of ultimate truth in each lower school are, it argues, their philosophical reifications, hence, they are the ones the higher schools logically refute. There is nevertheless no disagreement between the Indian Buddhist schools as far as the definiendum (mtshon bya / lakṣya) and the definition (mtshan nyid / lakṣaṇa) of the two truths are concerned. If they disagree on these two issues, there would be no commonly agreed definition, but there is a definition of the ultimate which is common to all schools, even though there is no commonly agreed defined example to illustrate such definition (Mikyö Dorje 2006: 293).

Where the Indian Buddhist philosophical schools party their company, Kagyü argues, is their conception of the defined example of the ultimate. For the realists (dngos smra ba) ultimate truth is a foundational entity (rdzas su yod pa) that withstands rational analysis. The Madhyamaka rejects this and argues that if ultimate truth is a foundational entity, it is not possible to attain an awakening to it. If it is possible to attain awakening, then ultimate truth is impossible to be a foundational entity, for the two mutually exclude each other. The foundational entity, like the substance of the Brahmanical metaphysicians, does not allow modification or change to take place whereas the attainment of awakening is an ongoing process of modification and change (Mikyö Dorje 2006: 294).

From the position Kagyü takes, it is clear then, that it does not endorse Gelug’s position that the Prāsaṅgika has its own theory of the two truths which affords a unique framework within which a presentation of the definition and the defined example of the two truths can be set out. (See Yakherds 2021 vol. 1 for the Gelugpa critiques)Kagyü argues that the Prāsaṅgika’s project is purely for pedagogical and heuristic reasons, “for it seeks to assuage the cognitive errors of its opponents—the non-Buddhists, our own-schools such as Vaibhāṣika on up to the Svātantrika—who assert philosophical positions based on certain texts” (Mikyö Dorje 2006: 294). The non-Prāsaṅgika philosophical schools equate the definition of the ultimate with the defined example, and this is the malady that the Prāsaṅgika seeks to allay. Therefore the Prāsaṅgika’s role, as Kagyü sees it, is to point out the absurdities in the non-Prāsaṅgika position and to show that the definition of the ultimate and the defined example are rather two separate issues, and that they cannot be identified with each other (Mikyö Dorje 2006: 294–95). The Prāsaṅgika does not, like Nyingma, entertain any position of its own, except for the purpose of a therapeutic reason, and for which “the Prāsaṅgika relies on the convention as a framework for things that need to be cultivated and those that are to be abandoned. For this, our own position does not need to base the linguistic conventions on the concepts of definition and the defined example. Instead [our position],” says Kagyü, “conforms to the non-analytical mundane practice in which what needs to be abandoned and what needs to be cultivated are undertaken in agreement with the real-unreal discourses of the conventional [truth]” (Mikyö Dorje 2006: 295).

Therefore according to Kagyü, the position of all Indian Buddhist philosophical schools—be it higher or lower—agree in so far as the definitions of the two truths are concerned. (1) “[Ultimate truth] is that which reasoned analysis does not undermine and that which withstands reasoned analysis. Conventional truth is the reverse. (2) Ultimate is the non-deceptive nature and it exists as reality. Conventional [truth] is the reverse. (3) Ultimate is the object of the non-erroneous subject. Conventional [truth] is the object of the erroneous subject” (Mikyö Dorje 2006: 294). Of these three definitions, the first one proposes conventional truth as one that does not withstands reasoned analysis whereas ultimate truth does indeed withstand the reasoned analysis. “Conventional [truth] is a phenomenon that is found to exist from the perspective of the cognitive processes that are either non-analytical (ma dpyad pa) or slightly analytical (cung zad dpyad pa), whereas ultimate [truth] is that which is found either from the perspective of the cognitive process that is thoroughly analytical (shing tu legs par dpyad pa) or meditative equipoise” (Mikyö Dorje 2006: 274). Conventional truth is non-analytical in the sense that ordinary beings assume its reality uncritically, and become fixated to its reifications in virtue of how it appears to their uncritical minds, rather than how it really is from the critical cognitive perspective. When conventional truth is slightly analysed, however, it reveals that it exists merely as collocations of the codependent causes and conditions (Mikyö Dorje 2006: 273). Therefore conventional truth is “one that is devoid of an intrinsic reality, rather it is mere name (ming tsam), mere sign (rda tsam), mere linguistic convention (tha snyad tsam), mere conception (rnam par rtog pa tsam) and mere fabrication (sgro btags pa tsam)—one that merely arises or ceases due to the force of the expressions or the conceptual linguistic convention” (Mikyö Dorje 2006: 273). Ultimate truth is defined, on the other hand, as one that is found by analytical cognitive process or by a meditative equipoise of the exalted beings, for the reason that when it is subjected to analysis, phenomena are fundamentally, by its very nature transcendent of the elaborations (spros pa) and all symbolisms (mtshan ma) (Mikyö Dorje 2006: 273).

On the second definition “Conventional truth is that which does not deceive the perspective to which it appears (snang ngor), or that which does not deceive an erroneous perspective (‘khrul ngor), or that which is non-deceptive according to the standard of the mundane convention” (Kun Khyen Padkar, 2004: 66). Ultimate truth, on the other hand, is defined as “that which does not deceive a correct perception (yang dag pa'i mthong ba), or that which does not deceive reality as it is (gnas lugs la mi bslu ba), or that which does not deceive an awakened perspective (sang rgyas kyi gzigs ngor)” (Kun Khyen Padkar, 2004: 74).

The third definition is based on the two conflicting epistemic practices. Here ultimate is defined as an ultimate object from the perspective of exalted beings (ārya / ‘phags pa). The ultimate reality, although, is not one that is regarded as cognitively found to exist in and of itself inherently (rang gi bdag nyid). Conventional truth is defined as the cognitive process that sees unreal phenomena (brdzun pa mthong ba) from the perspective of the ordinary beings whose cognitive processes are obscured by the cataracts of confusion. Conventional truth is unreal, for it does not exist in the manner in which it is perceived by the confused cognitive processes of the ordinary beings (Mikyö Dorje 2006: 269–70). Karmapa Mikyö Dorje puts the point in this way. “Take a vase as one entity, for instance. It is a conventional entity, for it is a reality for the ordinary beings, and it is found to be the basis from which arise varieties of hypothetical fabrications. The exalted beings,” he argues, “however, do not see any of these [fabrications], anywhere, whatsoever, and this mode of seeing by way of not seeing anything at all is termed as the seeing of the ultimate. Therefore the two truths, in this sense, are not distinct. They are differentiated from the perspective of the cognitive processes that are either erroneous or non-erroneous” (Mikyö Dorje, 2006: 274).

Although, like Nyingma and Sakya it is the view of Kagyü to maintain that erroneous cognitive process represents the nature of the ordinary beings, whereas non-erroneous cognitive processes represent the exalted beings. However, unlike Nyingma and Sakya, Kagyü insists that the distinctions between the two truths has nothing to do with the perspective of the exalted beings. Everything, it claims, has to do with how ordinary beings fabricate things erroneously—one more real than the other—and that it has nothing to do with how exalted beings experience things. “Even this distinction is made from the point of view of the cognitive process of the childish beings. Since all things the childish beings perceive are characteristically unreal (brdzun pa) and deceptive (bslu ba), they constitute the conventionality. The exalted beings, however, do not perceive at all anything in the way in which the childish beings perceive and fabricate. So ultimate truth is, according to Kagyü, that which is unseen and unfound by the exalted beings since it is the way things really are. Therefore both the truths are taught for the pedagogical reasons in accord with the perspective of the childish beings, but not because the exalted beings experienced the two truths or that there really exist the two truths (Mikyö Dorje 2006: 274). As for the conventional truth, Kagyu divides it into having two aspects: the conventional in the form of imputed concrete phenomena that are capable to appear concretely as such, and the conventional in terms of merely nominal imputations of abstract entities that are incapable of concrete appearance (Mikyö Dorje, see Yakherds 2021: 153–55).

What follows from the above discussion is that Kagyü is monist about truth (Karmapa Mikyö Dorje, 2006: 302) in that it claims only one truth and that truth it equates with transcendent wisdom. Despite minor differences, Nyingma, Kagyü and Sagya all emphasize the synthesis between transcendent wisdom and ultimate truth, arguing that “there is neither separate ultimate truth apart from the transcendent wisdom, nor transcendent wisdom apart from the ultimate truth” (2006: 279). For this reason Kagyü advances the view similar to Nyingma and Sakya that the exceptional quality of awakened knowledge consists in not experiencing anything conventional or empirical from the enlightened perspective, but experiencing everything from the other’s—nonenlightened—perspective. (Karmapa Mikyö Dorje, 2006: 141–42ff)

Finally, on the relationship of the two truths, Kagyü maintains a position which is consciously ambiguous—that they are expressible neither as identical nor distinct. Responding to an interlocutory question, “Are the two truths identical or distinct?” Karmapa Mikyö Dorjé, says, “neither is the case.” And he advances three arguments to support this position. First, “From a perspective of the childish beings, [the two truths] are neither identical, for they do not see the ultimate; nor are they distinct, for they do not see them separately” (Karmapa Mikyö Dorjé, 2006: 285). Second, “From standpoint of the meditative equipoise of the exalted beings, the two truths are neither identical, for the appearance of the varieties of conventional entities do not appear to them. Nor are they distinct, for they are not perceived as distinct” (Karmapa Mikyö Dorjé, 2006: 285). The third is the relativity argument which says, “They are all defined relative to one another—unreality is relative to reality and reality is relative to unreality. Because one is defined relative to the other, one to which it is related (ltos sa) could not be identical to that which it relates (ltos chos). This is because it is contradictory for one thing to be both that which relates (ltos chos) and the related (ltos sa). Nor is it the case that they are distinct because,” according to Kagyü’s view, “when the related is not established, so is the other [i.e., one that relates] not established. Hence there is no relation. If one insists that relation is still possible, then such a relation would not be relative to another” (Karmapa Mikyö Dorjé, 2006: 285–86).

So from these three arguments, Kagyü concludes that the two truths are neither expressible as identical nor distinct. It argues that “just as the conceptual images of a golden vase and a silver vase do not become distinct on the account of them not being expressed as identical. Likewise these images do not become identical on the account of them not being expressed as distinct” (Mikyö Dorjé, 2006: 286).

3. Sakya

Sakya’s theory of two truths is defended in the works of the succession of Sakya scholars—Sakya Paṅḍita (1182–1251), Rongtön Shakya Gyaltsen (Rong ston Śākya rgyal tshan, 1367–1449), the translator Taktsang Lotsawa (Stag tsang Lo tsā ba, 1405–?), Gorampa Sonam Senge (Go rams pa Bsod nams seng ge, 1429–89) and Shakya Chogden (Śākya Mchog ldan, 1428–1509). In particular Gorampa Sonam Senge’s works are unanimously recognised as the authoritative representation of the Sakya’s position. Sakya agree with Nyingma and Kagyü in maintaining that the distinction between the two truths is merely subjective processes, and that the two truths are reducible to the two conflicting perspectives (Sakya Paṅḍita 1968a: 72d, Rongtön Shakya Gyaltsen n.d. 7f, Taktsang Lotsawa n.d.: 27, Shakya Chogden 1975a: 3–4ff, 15f). “Although there are not two truths in terms of the object’s ontological mode of being (gnas tshul), the truths are divided into two in terms of [the contrasting perspectives of] the mind that sees the mode of existence and the mind that does not see the mode of existence…This makes perfect sense” (Gorampa 1969a: 374ab). Since it emphasizes the subjective nature of the distinction between the two truths, it proposes “mere mind” (blo tsam) to be the basis of the division (Gorampa 1969a: 374ab). It aruges that “Here in the Madhyamaka system, the object itself cannot be divided into two truths. Conventional truth and ultimate truth are divided in terms of the modes of apprehension (mthong tshul)—in terms of the subject apprehending unreality and the subject apprehending reality; or in terms of mistaken and unmistaken apprehensions (‘khrul ma ‘khrul); or deluded or undeluded apprehensions (rmongs ma rmongs); or erroneous or nonerroneous apprehensions (phyin ci log ma log); or reliable cognition or unreliable cognitions (tshad ma yin min)” (Gorampa 1969a: 375b). He also adds that: “The position which maintains that the truths are divided in terms of the subjective consciousness is one that all Prāsaṅgikas and Svātantrikas of India unanimously accepted because they are posited in terms of the subjective cognitive processes depending on whether it is deluded (rmongs) or nondeluded (ma rmongs), a perception of unreality (brdzun pa thong ba) or a perception of reality (yang dag mthong ba), and mistaken (khrul) or incontrovertible (ma khrul) (1969a: 384c).

Sakya’s advances two reasons to support its position. First, since the minds of ordinary beings are always deluded, mistaken, and erroneous, they falsely experience conventional truth. Conventional truth is thus posited only in relation to the perspective of the ordinary beings.[2] The wisdom of exalted meditative equipoise is however never mistaken, it is always nondeluded, and nonerroneous, hence exalted beings flawlessly experience ultimate truth. Ultimate truth is thus posited strictly in relation to the cognitive perspective of exalted beings. Second, the view held by Sakya argues for separate cognitive agents corresponding to each of the two truths. Ordinary beings have direct knowledge of conventional truth, but are utterly incapable of knowing ultimate truth. The exalted beings in training have direct knowledge of the ultimate in their meditative equipoise and direct knowledge of the conventional truth in the post meditative states. Fully awakened buddhas, on the other hand, only have access to ultimate truth. They have no access to conventional truth whatsoever from the enlightened perspective, although they may access conventional truth from the perspective of ordinary deluded beings.

Etymologically Sakya characterizes ultimate (parama) as a qualification of transcendent exalted cognitive process (‘jig rten las ‘das pa'i ye shes, lokottarajñāna) that belongs to exalted beings with artha as its corresponding object. The sense of ultimate truth (paramārthasatya) grants primacy to the exalted transcendent cognitive process of the noble beings, which supersedes the ontological status of conventional phenomena (Gorampa 1969a: 377d). “There is no realization and realized object, nor is there object and subject” (Gorampa 1969b: 714f, 727–729). As Taktsang Lotsawa puts it: “A wisdom without dual appearance is without any object” (Taktsang n.d.: 305f). Strictly speaking, transcendent wisdom itself becomes the ultimate truth. “Ultimate truth is to be experienced under a total cessation of dualistic appearance through exalted personal wisdom,” and further, “Anything that has dualistic appearance, even omniscience,must not be treated as ultimate truth” (Gorampa 1969b: 612–13ff).

Therefore conventionality (saṃvṛti, kun rdzob) means primal ignorance (Gorampa, 1969b: 377b, Sakya Paṇḍita 1968a: 72b, Shakya Chogden 1975a: 30f, Rongtön Shakya Gyaltsen 1995: 288). In agreement with Nyingma and Kagyü, Sakya treats primal ignorance as to the villain responsible for projecting the entire system of conventional truths. It argues ignorance as constituting the defining characteristics of the conventional truth.[3] (Sakya Paṇḍita 1968a: 72, Rendawa 1995: 121, Shakya Chogden 1975b: 378f, 1975c: 220, Taktsang Lotsawa n.d.: 27f, Rongtön Shakya Gyaltsen 1995: 287, n.d: 6–7ff) It formulates the definitions of the two truths in terms of the distinctions between the ignorant experiences of ordinary beings and the enlightened experiences of noble beings during their meditative equipoise. Sakya’s definition is based on three reasons. First, each conventionally real phenomenon satisfies only the definition of conventional truth because each phenomenon has only a conventional nature (in contrast to the two nature theory of Gelug), and that ultimate truth has a transcendent ontological status. Second, that each cognitive agent is potentially capable of knowing only one truth exhaustively, being equipped with either the requisite conventionally reliable cognitive process or ultimately reliable cognitive process. Each truth must be verified by a different individual and that access to the two truths is mutually exclusive—a cognitive agent who knows conventional truth cannot know ultimate truth and vice versa except in the case of exalted beings who are not fully enlightened. Third, that each conventional entity has only one nature, namely, its conventional nature, and the so-called ultimate nature must not be associated with any conventionally real phenomenon. If a sprout, for example, actually did possess two natures as proposed in Gelug’s theory of the two truths, then, according to Sakya, each nature would have to be ontologically distinct. Since the ontological structure of the sprout cannot be separated into a so-called conventional and ultimate nature, the sprout must possess only one phenomenal nature, i.e., the conventional reality. As this nature is found only under the spell of ignorance, it can be comprehended only under the conventional cognitive processes of ordinary beings, and of unenlightened noble beings in their post meditative equipoise. It is therefore not possible, in Sakya’s view, to confine the definition of ultimate truth to the framework of conventional phenomena.

Ultimate truth, on the other hand, requires the metaphysical transcendence of conventionality. Unlike conventional reality, it is neither presupposed nor projected by ignorance. Ultimate truth, in Gorampa’s words: “is inexpressible through words and is beyond the scope of cognition” (1969a: 370a). The cognition is always conceptual and thus deluded. “Yet ultimate truth is experienced by noble beings in their meditative equipoise, and is free from all conceptual categories. It cannot be expressed through definition, through any defined object, or through anything else” (1969a: 370a). In fact, Sakya goes so far as to combine the definition of ultimate truth with that of intrinsic reality (rang bzhin, svabhāva). When an interlocutor ask this question: “What is the nature of the reality of phenomena?” Gorampa replies that reality is transcendent and it has three defining characteristics: namely: “It is not created by causes and conditions, it exists independently of conventions and of other phenomena; and it does not change” (Gorampa, 1969c: 326a). Like Nāgārjuna’s hypothetical, not real, intrinsic reality, Sakya claims that ultimate truth is ontologically unconditioned, and hence it is not a dependently arisen phenomenon; it is distinct from conventional phenomena in every sense of the word; it is independent of conceptual-linguistic conventions; it is a timeless and unchanging phenomenon.

It is clear then, according to Sakya view, any duality ascribed to truth is untenable. Since there is only one truth, it cannot be distinguished any further. Like Nyingma and Kagyü, Sakya holds the view that truth itself is not divisible (Sakya Paṇḍita n.d.: 32ab, Rendawa 1995: 122, Rongtön Shakya Gyaltsen, 1995: 287, n.d.: 22f Taktsang Lotsawa n.d.: 263, Shakya Chogden 1975a: 7–8ff, 1975c: 222f). It agrees with Nyingma and Kagyü that the distinction between the two truths is essentially between two conflicting perspectives, rather than any division within truth as such. In Shakya Chogden’s words: “Precise enumeration (grangs nges) of the twofold truth all the earlier Tibetans have explained rests on the precise enumeration of the mistaken cognition (blo ‘khrul) and unmistaken cognition (blo ma ‘khrul). With this underpinning reason, they explained the precise enumeration through the elimination of the third alternative. There is not even a single figure to be found who claims the view comparable with the latter [i.e., Gelug], who asserts a precise enumeration of the twofold truth based on the certification of reliable cognitive processes” (1975a: 9–10ff).

Sakya rejects the reality of conventional truth by treating it as a projection of conventional mind—it is the ignorance of ordinary beings. When asked this question: “If this were true, even the mere term conventional truth would be unacceptable, for whatever is conventional is incompatible with truth,” Gorampa Replies: “Since [conventional] truth is posited only in relation to a conventional mind, there is no problem. Even so-called real conventionalities (yang dag kun rdzob ces pa yang) are posited as real with respect to a conventional mind” (1969b: 606b). By “conventional mind,” Gorampa means the ignorant mind of an ordinary being experiencing the phenomenal world. In other words, conventional truth is described as “truth” only from the perspective of ignorance. It is a truth projected (sgro brtag pa) by it and taken for granted.

Sakya equates conventional truth with “the appearances of nonexistent entities like illusions” (Gorampa 1969c: 287c). It follows Sakya Paṇḍita on this point who puts it: “Conventional truths are like reflections of the moon in the water—despite their nonexistence, they appear due to thoughts” (Sakya Paṇḍita 1968a: 72a). According to Sakya Paṇḍita “The defining characteristic of conventional truth constitutes the appearances of the nonexistent objects” (1968a: 72a). In this sense, conventional truths “are things apprehended by the cognition perceiving conventional entities. Those very things are found as nonexistent by the cognition analyzing their mode of existence that is itself posited as the ultimate” (Gorampa 1969a: 377a).

Since mere mind is the basis of the division of the two truths wherein ultimate truth—wisdom—alone is seen as satisfying the criterion of truth, so conventional truth—ignorance—cannot properly be taken as truth. Wisdom and ignorance are invariably contradictory, and thus the two truths cannot coexist. Sakya argues, in fact, that conventional truth must be negated in the ascent to ultimate truth. Given wisdom’s primacy over ignorance, in the final analysis it is ultimate truth alone that must prevail without its merely conventional counterpart. Conventional truth is an expedient means to achieve ultimate truth, and the Buddha described conventional truth as truth to suit the mentality of ordinary beings (Gorampa 1969a: 370b). The two truths are thus categorized as a means (thabs) and a result (thabs byung). Conventional truth is the means to attain the one and only ultimate truth.

According to this view, then, the relationship between the two truths is equivalent to the relationship between the two conflicting perspectives—namely, ignorance and wisdom. The question now arises: How is ignorance related to wisdom? Or conversely, how does wisdom relate to ignorance? It says that the two truths are distinct in the sense that they are incompatible with unity, like entity and without entity. In the ultimate sense, it argues, the two truths transcend identity and difference (Gorampa, 1969a: 376d). The transcendence of identity and difference from the ultimate standpoint is synonymous with the transcendence of identity and difference from the purview of the meditative equipoise of noble beings. However, from the conventional standpoint, it claims that the two truths are distinct in the sense that they are incompatible with their unity. It likens this relationship to the one between entity and without entity (Gorampa, 1969a: 377a).

Sakya’s claim that the two truths are distinct and incompatible encompasses both ontological and epistemological distinctions. Since what is divided into the two truths is mere mind, it is obvious that there is no single phenomenon that could serve as the objective referent for both. This also means that the two truths must be construed as corresponding to distinct spheres belonging to distinct modes of consciousness: conventional truth corresponds to ignorance and ultimate truth to wisdom. It is thus inappropriate to describe the relationship between the two truths, and their corresponding modes of consciousness, in terms of two ways of perceiving the same entity. Although the two truths can be thought of as two ways of perceiving, one based on ignorance and the other on wisdom, there is no same entity perceived by both. There is nothing common between the two truths, and if they are both ways of perceiving, then they do not perceive the same thing.

According to this view, the relationship between conventional truth and ultimate truth is analogous to the relationship between the appearance of falling hairs when vision is impaired by cataracts and the absence of such hairs when vision is unimpaired. Although this is a metaphor, it has a direct application to determining the relationship between the two truths. Conventional truth is like seeing falling hairs as a result of cataracts: both conventional truth and such false seeing are illusory, in the ontological sense that there is nothing to which each corresponds, and in the epistemological sense that there is no true knowledge in either case. Ultimate truth is therefore analogous, ontologically and epistemologically, to the true seeing unimpaired by cataracts and free of the appearance of falling hairs. Just as cataracts give rise to illusory appearances, so ignorance, according to Sakya, gives rise to all conventional truths; wisdom, on the other hand, gives rise to ultimate truth. As each is the result of a different state, there is no common link between them in terms of either an ontological identity or an epistemological or conceptual identity.

4. Gelug

Gelug’s (Dge lugs) theory of the two truths is campioned by Tsongkhapa Lobsang Dragpa (Tsong khapa Blo bzang grags pa, 1357–1419). Tsongkhapa’s theory is adopted, expanded and defended in the works of his immediate disciples—Gyaltsab Jé (Rgyal tshab Rje, 1364–1432), Khedrub Jé (Mkhas grub Rje, 1385–1438), Gendün Drub (Dge ‘dun grub,1391–1474)—and other great Gelug thinkers such as Sera Jetsün Chökyi Gyaltsen (Se ra Rje tsun Chos kyi rgyal tshan, 1469–1544), Panchen Sönam Dragpa (Paṇ chen Bsod nams grags pa,1478–1554), Panchen Lobsang Chökyi Gyaltsen (Paṇ chen Blo bzang chos kyi rgyal tshan,1567–1662), Jamyang Shepai Dorje (‘Jam dbyangs Bzhad ba'i Rdo rje, 1648–1722), Changkya Rölpai Dorje (Lcang skya Rol pa'i rdo rje, 1717–86), Könchog Jigmé Wangpo (Kon mchog ‘jigs med dbang po, 1728–91), and many others scholars.

Gelug maintains that “objects of knowledge” (shes bya) are the basis for dividing the two truths (Tsongkhapa 1984b:176).[4] This means that the two truths relate to “two objects of knowledge,” the idea it takes from the statement of the Buddha from Discourse on Meeting of the Father and the Son (Pitāputrasamāgama Sūtra)[5] By object of knowledge Gelug means an object that is cognizable (blo'i yul du bya rung ba). It must be an object of cognitive processes in general ranging from those of ordinary sentient beings through to those of enlightened beings. This definition attempts to capture any thing knowable in the broadest possible sense. Since the Buddha maintains knowledge of the two truths to be necessary for awakening, the understanding of the two truths must constitute an exhaustive understanding of all objects of knowledge.

Gelug’s key argument to support this claim comes from its two-nature theory in which it has been argued that every nominally (tha snyad) or conventionally (kun rdzob) given phenomenon possesses dual natures: namely, the nominal (or conventional nature) and the ultimate nature. The conventional nature is unreal and deceptive while the ultimate nature is real and nondeceptive. Since two natures pertain to every phenomenon, the division of the two truths means the division of each entity into two natures. Thus the division of the two truths, “reveals that it makes sense to divide even the nature of a single entity, like a sprout, into dual natures—its conventional and its ultimate natures. It does not however show,” as non-Gelug schools have it, “that the one nature of the sprout is itself divided into two truths in relation to ordinary beings (so skye) and to noble beings (āryas)” (Tsongkhapa 1984b: 173, 1992: 406).

The relation of the two truths comes down to the way in which the single entity appears to cognitive processes—deceptively and nondeceptively. The two natures correspond to these deceptive or nondeceptive modes of appearance. While they both belong to the same ontological entity, they are epistemically or conceptually mutually exclusive. Take a sprout for instance. If it exists, it necessarily exhibits a dual nature, and yet those two natures cannot be ontologically distinct. The ultimate nature of the sprout cannot be separate from its conventional nature—its color, texture, shape, extension, and so on. As an object of knowledge, the sprout retains its single ontological basis, but it is known through its two natures. These two natures exclude one another so far as knowledge is concerned. The cognitive process that knows the deceptive conventional nature of the sprout does not have direct access to its nondeceptive ultimate nature. Similarly, the cognitive process that apprehends the nondeceptive ultimate nature of the sprout does not have direct access to its deceptive conventional nature. In Newland’s words: “A table and its emptiness are a single entity. When an ordinary conventional mind takes a table as its object of observation, it sees a table. When a mind of ultimate analysis searches for the table, it finds the emptiness of the table. Hence, the two truths are posited in relation to a single entity by way of the perspectives of the observing consciousness. This is as close as Ge-luk-bas will come to defining the two truths as perspectives” (1992: 49).

Gelug’s two-nature theory not only serves as the basic reference point for its exposition of the basis of the division of the two truths, their meanings and definitions, but also serves as the basic ontological reference for its account of the relationship between the two truths. Therefore Gelug proposes the view that the two truths are of single entity with distinct conceptual identities. This view is also founded on the theory of the two natures. But how are the two natures related? Are they identical or distinct? For Gelug argues that there are only two possibilities: either the two natures are identical (ngo bo gcig) or distinct (ngo bo tha dad); there cannot be a third (Tsongkhapa 1984b:176). They are related in terms of being a single entity with distinct conceptual identities—thus they are both the same and different. Since the two natures are the basis of the relationship between the two truths, the relationship between the two truths will reflect the relationship between the two natures. Just as the two natures are of a same entity, ultimate truth and conventional truth are of same ontological status.

Gelug argues that the relationship between the two truths, therefore, the two natures, is akin to the relationship between being conditioned and being impermanent (Tsongkhapa 1984b:176). It appropriates this point from Nāgārjuna’s Bodhicittavivaraṇa, which states: “Reality is not perceived as separate from conventionality. The conventionality is explained to be empty. Empty alone is the conventionality, if one of them does not exist, neither will the other, like being conditioned and being impermanent” (v.67–68) (Nāgārjuna 1991:45–45, cited Tsongkhapa, 1984b: 176; Khedrub Jé 1992: 364). Commenting on this passage from the Bodhicittavivaraṇa, Tsongkhapa argues that the first four lines (in original Tibetan verses) show that things as they really are, are not ontologically distinct from that of the conventionality. The latter two lines (in the original Tibetan verse) show their relationship such that if one did not exist, neither could the other (med na mi ‘bung ba'i ‘brel ba). This, in fact, he says, is equivalent to their being constituted by a single-property relationship (bdag cig pa'i ‘brel ba). Therefore, like the case of being conditioned and being impermanent, the relation between the two truths is demonstrated as one of a single ontological identity (Tsongkhapa 1984b: 176–77).

The way in which the two truths are related is thus analogous to the relationship between being conditioned and being impermanent. They are ontologically identical and mutually entailing. Just as a conditioned state is not a result of impermanence, so emptiness is not a result of the conventional truth (the five aggregates) or the destruction of the five aggregates—Hence in the Vimalakırtinirdeśa Sūtra it is stated: “Matter itself is void. Voidness does not result from the destruction of matter, but the nature of matter is itself voidness” (Vimalakīrti, 1991:74). The same principle applies in the case of consciousness and the emptiness of consciousness, as well as to the rest of the five psychophysical aggregates—the aggregate and its emptiness are not causally related. For the causal relationship would imply either the aggregate is the cause, therefore its emptiness is the result, or the aggregate is the result, and its emptiness the cause. This would imply, according to Gelug’s reading, either the aggregate or the emptiness is temporally prior to its counterpart, thus leading to the conlusion that the conventional truth and ultimate truth exist independently of each other. Such a view is for Gelug is completely unacceptable.

The ontological identity between being conditioned and being impermanent does not imply identity in all and every respect. Insofar as their epistemic mode is concerned, conditioned and impermanent phenomena are distinct and contrasting. The concept impermanence always presents itself to the cognizing mind as momentary instants, but not as conditioned. Similarly, the concept being-conditioned always presents itself to its cognizing mind as constituted by manifold momentary instants, but not as moments. Thus it does not necessarily follow that the two truths are identical in every respect just because they share a common ontological identity. Where the modes of conceptual appearance are concerned, ultimate nature and conventional nature are distinct. The conceptual mode of appearance of ultimate truth is nondeceptive and consistent with its mode of existence, while that of conceptual mode of conventional truth is deceptive and inconsistent with its mode of existence.

Conventional truth is uncritically confirmed by conventionally reliable cognitive process, whereas ultimate truth is critically confirmed by ultimately reliable cognitive process. Hence, just as ultimate truth is inaccessible to the conventionally reliable cognitive process for its uncritical mode of engagement, so, too, is conventional truth inaccessible to ultimately reliable cognitive process for its critical mode of engagement. This is how, in Gelug’s view, the truths differ conceptually despite sharing a common ontological entity. In summarizing Gelug’s argument, Khedrub Jé writes: “The two truths are therefore of the same nature, but different conceptual identities. They have a single-nature relationship such that, if one did not exist, neither could the other, just like being conditioned and impermanent” (1992: 364).

The two nature theory also supports Gelug’s view that the truth is twofold. Since the two natures of every conventional phenomenon provide the ontological and epistemological foundation for each of the truths, the division of truth into two is entirely appropriate. Both the conventional and the ultimate are actual truths, and since the two natures are mutually interlocking, neither of the two truths has primacy over the other—both have equal status, ontologically, epistemologically, and even soteriologically.

Given Gelug’s stance on conventional truth as actual truth and its argument for the equal status of the two truths, Gelug must now address the question: How can conventional truth, which is unreal (false) and deceptive, be truth (real) at all? In other words, how can the two truths be of equal status given if conventional truth is unreal (false)? The success of Gelug’s reply depends on its ability to maintain harmony between the two truths, or their equal footing.There are several arguments by means of which Gelug defends this. The first, and the most obvious one, is the argument from the two-nature theory. It argues since two truths are grounded in the dual nature of a single phenomenon, then “just as the ultimate reality of the sprout [for instance] is taken as characteristic of the sprout, hence it is described as the sprout’s nature, so, too,” explains Tsongkhapa, “are the sprout’s color, shape, etc., the sprout’s characteristics. Therefore they too are its nature” (1992: 406). Since the two natures are ontologically mutually entailing, the sprout’s ultimate truth cannot exist ontologically separate from its conventional truth, and vice versa. Neither truth could exist without the other.

The most important argument Gelug advances for the unity of the two truths draws upon an understanding of the compatible relation between conventional truth and dependent arising on the one hand, and between ultimate truth and emptiness on the other. For Gelug emptiness and dependent arising are synonymous. The concept of emptiness is incoherent unless it means dependent arising, and equally the concept of dependent arising is incoherent unless it means emptiness of intrinsic reality. Gelug argues, as Tsongkhapa does in the Rten ‘brel stod pa (In Praise of Dependent Arising, 1994a), since emptiness means dependent arising, the emptiness of intrinsic reality and the efficacy of action and its agent are not contradictory. If emptiness, however, is misinterpreted as contradictory with dependent arising, then Gelug contends, there would be neither action in empty phenomena, nor empty phenomena in action. But that cannot be the case, for that would entail a rejection of both phenomena and action, a nihilistic view (v.11–12). Since there is no phenomenon other than what is dependently arisen, there is no phenomenon other than what is empty of intrinsic reality (v.15). Understood emptiness in this way, there is indeed no need to say that they are noncontradictory—the utter nonexistence of intrinsic reality and making sense of everything in the light of the principle this arises depending on this (v.18). This is so because despite the fact that whatever is dependently arisen lacks intrinsic reality, and therefore empty, nonetheless its existence is illusion-like (v.27).

Sometimes Gelug varies its ontological argument slightly, as does Tsongkhapa in the Lam gtso rnam gsum (The Three Principal Pathways), to stressing the unity of the two truths in terms of their causal efficiency. It argues that empty phenomena is causally efficient is crucial in understanding the inextricable relationship between ultimate truth and conventional truth. The argument takes two forms: (1) appearance avoids realism—the extreme of existence, and (2) emptiness avoids inhilism—the extreme of nonexistence. The former makes sense for Gelug because the appearance arises from causal conditions, and whatever arises from the causal conditions is a non-eternal or non-permanent. When the causal conditions changes any thing that dependently arises from them also changes. Thus the appearance avoids the realism. The latter makes sense because the empty phenomena arises from causal conditions, and whatever arise from the causal conditions is not a non-existent, even though it lacks intrinsic reality. Only when the causal conditions are satisfied do we see arising of the empty phenomena. Hence by understanding that the empty phenomenon itself is causally efficient, the bearer of cause and effect, one is not robbed by the extreme view of nihilism (1985: 252).

The argument for the unity of the two truths also takes epistemological form which also rests on the idea that emptiness and dependently arising are unified. The knowledge of empty phenomena is conceptually interlinked with that of dependently arisen phenomena—the latter is, in fact, founded on the former. To the extent that empty phenomena are understood in terms of relational and dependently arisen phenomena, to that extent empty phenomena are always functional and causally effective. The phrase “empty phenomena,” although expressed negatively, is not negative in a metaphysical sense—it is not equivalent to no-thingness. Although the empty phenomenon appears to its cognizing consciousness negatively and without any positive affirmation, it is nonetheless equivalent to a relational and dependently arisen phenomenon seen deconstructively. Since seeing phenomena as empty does not violate the inevitable epistemic link with the understanding of phenomena as dependently arisen, and the converse also applies, so the unity between the two truths—understanding things both as empty and as dependently arisen—is still sustained.

The unity between the two truths, according to Gelug, does not apply merely to ontological and epistemological issues; it applies equally to soteriology—the practical means to the freedom from suffering. As Jamyang Shepai Dorje argues that undermining either of the two truths would result in a similar downfall—a similar eventual ruin. If, however, they are not undermined, the two are alike insofar as the accomplishment of the two accumulations and the attainment of the two awakened bodies (kāyas), and so forth, are concerned. If one undermines conventional truth or denies it’s reality, one would succumb to the extreme of nihilism, which would also undermine the fruit and the means by which an awakened physical body (rūpakāya) is accomplished. It is therefore not sensible to approach the two truths with bias. Since this relation continues as a means to avoid falling into extremes, and also to accomplish the two accumulations and attain the two awakened bodies (kāyas), it is imperative, says Jamyang Shepai Dorje, that the two truths be understood as mutually interrelated (1992: 898–99).

One could object Gelug’s position as follows: If the two natures are ontologically identical, why is conventional truth unreal and deceptive, while ultimate truth real and nondeceptive? To this Gelugs replies that “nondeceptive is the mode of reality (bden tshul) of the ultimate. That is, ultimate truth does not deceive the world by posing one mode of appearance while existing in another mode” (1992: 411). Ultimate truth is described as ultimate, not because it is absolute or higher than conventional truth, but simply because of its consistent character, therefore non-deceptive—its mode of appearance and its mode of being are the same—in contrast with the inconsistent (therefore deceptive) character of conventional truth. Ultimate truth is nondeceptive for the same reason. The premise follows because to the cognizing consciousness, conventional truth presents itself as inherently or instrinsically real. It appears to be substance, or essence, and therefore it deceives ordinary beings. Insofar as conventional truth presents itself as more than conventional—as inherently real—they deceive the ordinary beings. We take them to be what they are not—to be intrinsically and objectively real. In that sense, they are unreal. “But to the extent that we understand them as dependently arisen, empty, interdependent phenomena,” as Garfield explains, “they constitute a conventional truth” (1995: 208).

Another objection may be advanced as follows: Gelug’s position contradicts the Buddha’s teachings since it is not possible to reconcile Gelug’s view that there are two actual truths with the Buddha’s declaration that nirvāṇa is the only truth.[6] For its answer to this objection Gelug appropriates Candrakīrti’s Yuktiṣaṣṭikāvṛtti which states that nirvāṇa is not like conditioned phenomena, which deceives the childish by presenting false appearances. For the existence of nirvāṇa is always consistent with its characteristic of the nonarising nature. Unlike conditioned phenomena, it never appears, even to the childish, as having a nature of arising (skye ba'i ngo bo). Since nirvāṇa is always consistent with the mode of existence of nirvāṇa, it is explained as the noble truth. Yet this explanation is afforded strictly in the terms of worldly conventions (1983: 14–15ff, cited in Tsongkhapa 1992: 312, Khedrub Jé 1992: 360).

For Gelug the crucial point here, as Candrakīrti emphasizes, is that nirvāṇa is the truth strictly in terms of worldly conventions. Gelug recognizes this linguistic convention as a highly significant to the Prāsaṅgika system and it insists on conformity with the worldly conventions for the following reasons. First, just as an illusion, a mirror image, etc., are real in an ordinary sense, despite the fact that they are deceptive and unreal, so, too, conventional phenomena in the Prāsaṅgika Madhyamaka sense are conventionally real, and can even be said to constitute truths, despite being recognized by the Mādhyamikas themselves as unreal and deceptive. Second, because the concept ultimate truth is also taken from its ordinary convention, nirvāṇa is spoken of as ultimate on the ground of its nondeceptive nature, in the sense that its mode of existence is consistent with its mode of appearance. The nondeceptive nature of the empty phenomenon itself constitutes its reality, and so it is conventionally described as ultimate in the Prāsaṅgika system.

Thus Gelug asserts that neither of the two truths is more or less significant than the other. Indeed, while the illusion only makes sense as illusion in relation to that which is not illusion, the reflection only makes sense as reflection in relation to that which is reflected. So, too, does the real only make sense as real in relation to the illusion, the thing reflected in relation to its reflection. This also holds in the case of discussions about the ultimate nature of things, such as the being of the sprout—it only makes sense inasmuch as it holds in discussions of ordinary phenomena. The only criterion that determines a thing’s truth in the Prāsaṅgika Madhyamaka system, according to Gelug, is the causal effectiveness of the thing as opposed to mere heuristic significance. The sprout’s empty mode of being and its being as appearance are both truths, insofar as both are causally effective, and thus both functional.

The two truths, understood as, respectively, the empty and the dependently arisen characters of phenomena, are on equal footing according to Gelug. Nevertheless these truths have different designations—the sprout’s empty mode is always described as “ultimate truth,” while the conventional properties, such as color and shape, are described as “conventional truths.” The former is accepted as nondeceptive truth while the sprout’s conventional properties are accepted as deceptive or false truth, despite common sense dictating that they are true and real.

In conclusion Gelug’s theory of the two truths is based on one fundamental thesis that each conventionally real phenomenon satisfies the definitions of both truths for each phenomenon, as it sees it, possesses two natures that serve as the basis of the definitions of the two truths. The two truths are conceptual distinctions applied to a particular conventionally real phenomenon, and every conventionally real phenomenon fulfills the criterion of both truths because each phenomenon constitutes these two natures they are not merely one specific nature of a phenomenon mirrored in two different perspectives. As each phenomenon possesses two natures, so each verifying cognitive process has a different nature as its referent, even though there is only one ontological entity and one cognitive agent involved.

5. Implications

Gelug considers the two natures of each phenomenon as the defining factor of the two truths. It argues that the conventional nature of an entity, as verified by a conventionally reliable cognitive process, determines the defining criterion of conventional truth; the ultimate nature of the same entity, as verified by an ultimately reliable cognitive practice, determines the defining criterion of ultimate truth. Since both truths are ontologically as well as epistemologically interdependent, knowledge of conventionally real entitity as dependently arisen suffices for knowledge of both truths. In contasty non-Gelug schools—Nyingma, Kagyü and Sakya Non-Gelug, as we have seen, rejects Gelug’s dual-nature theory, treating each conventional entity as satisfying only the definition of conventional truth and taking the definition of ultimate truth to be ontologically and epistemologically transcendent from conventional truth. They argue, instead, it is through the perspectives of either an ordinary being or an unenlightened exalted being (āryas) that the definition of conventional truth is verified—fully enlightened being (buddhas) do not experience the conventional truth in any respect. Similarly, for non-Gelug, no ordinary being can experience the ultimate truth. Ultimate truth transcends conventional truth, and the knowledge of empirically given phenomena as dependently arisen could not satisfy the criterion of knowing ultimate truth.

For Gelug, there is an essential compatibility between between the two truths, for the reason that there is a necessary harmony between dependently arisen and emptiness of intrinsic reality. As dependently arisen, empty phenomena are not constructions of ignorant consciousness, so neither is conventional truth such a construction. Both truths are actual truths that stand on an equal footing. Moreover, according to this view, whosoever knows conventional truth, either directly or inferentially, also knows ultimate truth; whosoever knows ultimate truth, also knows phenomena as dependently arisen, and hence knows them as empty of intrinsic reality. Where there is no knowledge of conventional truth, the converse applies. For non-Gelug, the incommensurability between dependently arisen and emptiness of intrinsic reality also applies to the two truths. Accordingly, whosoever knows conventional truth does not know ultimate truth, and one who knows ultimate truth does not know conventional truth; whosoever knows phenomena as dependently arisen does not know them as empty, whereas whosoever knows phenomena as empty does not know them as dependently arisen.

While Gelug thus distances itself from the subjective division of the two truths, Nyingma, Kagyü and Sakya attempt to demonstrate the validity of their view by arguing that perspective provides the primary basis for the division of the two truths. Unlike Gelug, non-Gelug schools hold that the two truths do not have any objective basis. Instead they are entirely reducible to the experiences of the deluded minds of ordinary beings and the experiences of the wisdom of exalted being.

According to Gelug, the agent who cognizes the two truths may be one and the same individual. Each agent may have all the requisite cognitive resources that are potentially capable of knowing both truths. Ordinary beings have only conceptual access to ultimate truth, while exalted beings, who are in the process of learning, have direct, but intermittent, access. Awakenened beings, however, invariably have simultaneous access to both truths. The view held by non-Gelug argues for separate cognitive agents corresponding to each of the two truths. Ordinary beings have direct knowledge of conventional truth, but are utterly incapable of knowing ultimate truth. The exalted beings in training directly know ultimate while they are meditative equipoise and conventional truth in post meditative states. Fully awakened buddhas, on the other hand, only have access to ultimate truth. Awakened beings have no access to conventional truth whatsoever from the enlightened perspective, although they may access conventional truth from unenlightened ordinary perspectives.


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