Notes to Margaret Lucas Cavendish

1. Letter to Cavendish from “Your Graces, Just Honourer, and most Intirely Devoted Servant, Walter Charleton,” May 7, 1667, in A Collection of Letters and Poems (1678), pp. 116-117.

2. This is Cavendish’s Philosophical Letters. For Cavendish’s own reflections on the matter, see Cavendish 1664, 506–7, and preface, fifth page; Cavendish 1668a, 12–13, 21; Cavendish 1663, 442–3. For more on the interaction between Cavendish and her contemporaries, see O’Neill 1998, 22–3; and 2002, 641–652.

3. “A Preface to the Reader,” in Cavendish (1664), unnumbered.

4. Cavendish 1664, 320–1. See also Cavendish 1668a, 197, 215, 221; Cavendish 1664, 12, 192, 238, 529; and Cavendish 1668b, 1–3.

5. Cavendish 1664, 451–2. Of course, the same argument is in Descartes’ Principles of Philosophy, Part II, section 16. See also Cunning 2016, 142–146.

6. Cavendish 1668a, 209. See also Cavendish 1664, 162–3, 186–7, and Cavendish 1668b, 47.

7. Cavendish wrote eight philosophical manuscripts depending on how we count. I like to count Philosophical and Physical Opinions (first edition, 1655; second edition, 1633) and Grounds of Natural Philosophy [1668] as two texts, but Cavendish makes clear in the preface to Grounds of Natural Philosophy that it is actually the third edition of Philosophical and Physical Opinions. I tend to count PPO (1655) and GNP (1668) as two monographs, just because the revisions over the 13 year period are extensive, but it is also accurate to regard GNP as just the third edition of the original Philosophical and Physical Opinions. Here I am disagreeing with Walters (2013) and Shaheen, who take PPO 1663 to be the final and definitive edition of PPO. Jonathan Shaheen has expressed the view in email correspondence.

8. Cudworth 1678, 858. See also pp. 156, 157, 648, 857, and 858; and Hutton 1997b, 96–9.

9. See Cavendish 1664, 350–1, 382, 404; and Cavendish 1663, 403–5, 436.

10. See also Cavendish 1655, 96, 106.

11. Cavendish 1664, 185–6. See also pp. 197, 225–6.

12. Cavendish 1668b, 2. See also Cavendish 1668a, 148; Cavendish 1664, 77, 402, 421; and Cavendish 1663, 86. See also Cunning 2016, 62–68.

13. For a different view, see Shaheen 2021, note 17.

14. Nicholas Jolley has argued that the doctrine of thinking matter is lurking throughout Locke’s corpus, and that one of Leibniz’s central concerns in New Essays on Human Understanding is to expose and then undermine it. See Jolley 1984, 18–25.

15. See Lucretius, 33, 37, 95–6; Gassendi 1641, 238–9; Spinoza 1662, 87–8; and Searle 1986, chapter 1. It is not clear if Cavendish read any works of Lucretius or if she just read paraphrases of them. There were two translations of De Rerum Natura written in the 1650s, one by Lucy Hutchinson, and she and Cavendish were acquaintances. It is possible that Cavendish had access to Hutchinson’s translation. Cavendish might also have read paraphrases of Lucretius’ work in Thomas Stanley’s three-volume History of Philosophy (London: Humphrey Moseley and Thomas Dring, 1655, 1666, 1660). The influence of Lucretius is present throughout Poems and Fancies. See Cavendish 1653; and Broad 2002, 44–5.

16. Cavendish 1664, 225. See also Cavendish 1664, 320, 137, 162, 220; and Cavendish 1668b, 240. Note that a critical issue in the interpretation of Cavendish is whether or not she holds that all interaction is by contact or whether there occurs action at a distance.

17. Cavendish 1668a, 89. See also Cavendish 1664, 215.

18. Cavendish 1664, 69. See also Peterman 2017 for a discussion of Cavendish on abstract mathematical ideas.

19. Cavendish 1664, 242. See also Hutton 1997a, 426–7, Detlefsen 2007, 162.

20. A common view in the Early Modern period was that bodies behave in an orderly manner because they obey laws of nature. See for example Descartes 1644, I:37–40; and Boyle 1668a, 70.

21. Cavendish 1663, “Another Epistle to the Reader,” ii. See also Cavendish 1663, 293–4; Cavendish 1664, 108, 151, 378, 417, 514–5; and Lucretius, 170–1.

22. Cavendish 1668b, 7. See also Cavendish 1664, 531. Cavendish might have come across this view in her reading of Henry More’s Antidote Against Atheism. See James, 1999, 222–3; and More 1653, 51–2.

23. See also Leibniz 1698, 504. He writes that “it is consistent neither with the order nor with the beauty or the reason of things that there should be something vital or immanently active only in a small part of matter, when it would imply greater perfection if it were in all.” He adds that laws of nature are not anything over and above creatures, but instead are written into them (500–502). See also Leibniz 1686, 331–5.

24. Cavendish 1668a, 15, 191–2. See also Michaelian 2009, 33–4. Note that Cavendish does not think that all bodies are knowledgeable and perceptive to the same degree. For example, she writes, “the Sun, the Stars, Earth, Fire, Water, Plants, Animals, Minerals; although they have all sense and knowledg [sic], yet they have not all sense and knowledg [sic] alike, because sense and knowledg [sic] moves not alike in every kind or sort of Creatures...” (Cavendish 1664, 153). See also Cavendish 1664, 184, 236, 287, 516–7; Cavendish 1663, 113–4, 274–5; Cavendish 1668b, 82, 163–4; and Cavendish 1668a, 218–9. See also Leibniz, Monadology, sections 21, 23–4.

25. See also the very similar argumentation in Strawson 2008.

26.For additional discussion of Cavendish and panpsychism see Branscum 2022.

27. For more on Cavendish on the three degrees of matter see Shaheen 2017.

28. Cavendish 1664, 97. This view is not so unusual in the Seventeenth Century. For example, it appears to be one of the things that is motivating Descartes’ (apparent) view that the cause of the movement of a body is never another body but always God. See Hatfield 1979, 113–140.

29. Ibid. See also Detlefsen 2007, 166–7.

30. There are instances of disorder in the behavior of bodies, which Cavendish explains in terms of the freedom of (intelligent and perceptive) bodies to respond as they please to the solicitations of the bodies that surround them. See Detlefsen 2007, 180–7.

31. Cavendish 1668a, 145–6. See also White 2009, Section 3.

32. Cavendish 1664, 539–40. See Chamberlain 2019 for a further discussion of Cavendish on patterning; Chamberlain highlights that even sensory features like color and sound are patterned, according to Cavendish, as those features are just as much in objects as features like size, shape, and motion.

33. See also Michaelian 2009, 39–41. For Cavendish, the “sensitive” corporeal motions of a body track the surface features of the object that we are perceiving, and the “rational” motions produce a speculative image of the features of the object that we do not sense. When a body senses the features of a body, Cavendish will say that the body is “patterning.” When a body is speculating or is otherwise unconstrained in the images that it produces, it is “figuring.” See Cavendish 1664, 64, 513; and Michaelian 2009, 39–50. Note finally that in some cases Cavendish uses the term ‘pattern’ to describe the self-moving activity of a body by which it adjusts to the bodies in its environment, after it “patterns” or perceives them. See for example Cavendish 1664, 104.

34. Cavendish 1664, 201, 139, 141, 186; Cavendish 1668a, 17. See also Detlefsen 2009, 429–30; Schiebinger 1991, 8; and Detlefsen 2007, 162.

35. See also Cavendish 1664, 107, 139–142, 221, 230–1, 322, 462, 503–5.

36. Cavendish 1664 164; Cavendish 1668a, 212, 71. See also Detlefsen 2009, 430–1; and James 1999, 230.

37. Relevant also is Cavendish’s experience in England when power was not in the hands of a single individual. See James 2003, x–xvii and xxiv–xxv.

38. See also Boyle 2006, 261–266. Boyle’s view appears to be very extreme. She notes that Cavendish thinks that we are interested in self-preservation but argues (263–264) that on Cavendish’s view what in fact motivates human behavior is our interest in our legacy and that it is our desire for fame (and the increased likelihood that our legacy will live on) that drives us to enter a commonwealth. Boyle does cite passages in which Cavendish speaks of our strong interest in fame, and also a passage in which she remarks that some people would prefer to live in the memory of others than to be alive but unkown (Cavendish 1655, 2; Boyle 2006, 264), but these are certainly consistent with the view that much of our behavior is driven by an interest in security and survival.

39. See Lascano 2021 and Lascano 2023 for a discussion of this sort of case. Lascano argues very convincingly that for Cavendish a body is not free in cases where its behavior is forced or occasioned, and I agree that in such cases the behavior of a body is not voluntary, for Cavendish says that an act is voluntary when it “doth not proceed from an exterior agent.” But I think that Cavendish allows that there is a sense in which an act is free so long as a body does not resist it. Many of the actions of natural bodies would be free in that sense, even though they are forced and occasioned.

40. See also the discussions in Cunning 2016 and McNulty 2018.

41. Boyle (2017) holds that Cavendish subscribes to a libertarian view of freedom, in part because Boyle holds that Cavendish assume that there is true normativity in nature. I am arguing that Cavendish does not do that.

42. See Siegfried 2020 and Cunning 2021 for a discussion of the respects in which Cavendish is fairly progressive in her politics.

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David Cunning <>

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