Margaret Lucas Cavendish

First published Fri Oct 16, 2009; substantive revision Thu Dec 8, 2022

Margaret Lucas Cavendish was a philosopher, poet, scientist, fiction-writer, and playwright who lived in the Seventeenth Century. Her work is important for a number of reasons. One is that it lays out an early and compelling version of the naturalism that is found in current-day philosophy and science. It also offers important insights that bear on recent discussions of the nature and characteristics of intelligence and the question of whether or not the bodies that surround us are minded and intelligent. Another reason that the work of Cavendish is important is that it anticipates some of the central views and arguments that are more commonly associated with figures like Thomas Hobbes and David Hume. She also offers novel and compelling responses to questions that are central to the discussions of the Seventeenth Century – for example, about whether sense perception is by means of impressions; about whether human beings are free in a libertarian or a compatibilist sense; about whether there is any true disorder in the natural world; about the limits of knowledge, and the limits of ideas and language; and about how motion is transferred between bodies. In addition, she takes on important debates in social and political philosophy, with a focus on issues of agency and authority. She asks in particular about the relation between an individual’s desire to live a life with which they identify and the receptivity that that desire encounters in the surrounding environment.

1. Introduction and Biography

Margaret Lucas was born in 1623 in Colchester, Essex. She did not receive a formal education in disciplines such as mathematics, history, philosophy, and the classical languages, but she had access to scholarly libraries and was an avid reader. She began to put her own ideas to paper at a very early age, and although it was regarded as unseemly at the time for a woman to be publicly intellectual, she was able to be an intellectual in private in regular conversations with her middle-brother John. This is noteworthy because John was already a well-established scholar: a student of law, philosophy, and natural science, he was fluent in Hebrew, Latin and Greek, and would eventually become a founding member of the Royal Society (Whitaker 2002, 11–12). In 1643, seeking a life of independence, Lucas applied to be a maid of honor at the court of Queen Henrietta Maria. When the queen was exiled to France in 1644, Lucas accompanied her and shortly thereafter met William Cavendish. They married in 1645, and would remain in exile (in Paris, then Rotterdam, then Antwerp) until the restoration of the crown in 1660 (Battigelli 1998, 1–10).

There are two reasons why it is important to mention the marriage of Margaret Lucas and William Cavendish. One is that William regularly organized and hosted meetings of the “Cavendish Circle” in the 1640s, and attendees included such seventeenth-century giants as Thomas Hobbes, Rene Descartes, Marin Mersenne, Pierre Gassendi, and Kenelm Digby (Hutton 1997a, 422–3; Whitaker 2002, 92–4; Clucas 1994, 256–64). Margaret attended many of these meetings, though we do not know the extent to which she participated. The second reason why it is important to mention the marriage of Margaret to William is that in the mid-seventeenth-century it was uncommon for a publisher to print the philosophical and scientific work of a woman. Margaret Cavendish was a sufficiently brilliant and impressive writer that she was able to publish some of her work without assistance (Whitaker 2002, 154), including her very first work [Poems and Fancies, 1653], but her more philosophical writings were published with the assistance of her well-connected husband. At the time women were not taken very seriously as philosophers, and there was not a large market for the work of a woman philosopher to be distributed and discussed. Margaret was extremely proactive about mailing copies of her philosophical monographs to scholars and to libraries in England and beyond, along with requests for commentary and continued correspondence, but the replies that she received tended to be very dismissive. For example, William Charleton wrote back to her that

Among many other things, by which your Grace is pleased to distinguish your self from other Writers, this seems to be not the least remarkable; that whereas they imploy only their wit, labour, and time, in composing Books, You bestow also great summs of Money in Printing Yours: and not content to enrich our Heads alone, with your rare Notions, you go higher, and adorn our Libraries, with your elegant Volumes…. I may have many rivals in these my thankful acknowledgements, you can have no Competitor in the Glory of their occasions. This double Felicity is augmented by the accession of two others, no less worthy admiration. One is, that as you have made your self an Original, so are you likewise secure from being Copied. … You exceed all of your delicate Sex, not only in this age, but in all ages past.[1]

Here the suggestion is that Cavendish had to expend an unusual sum of money to have her books printed and that those books are an adornment on library shelves. Charleton also makes clear that Cavendish need have no fear of being plagiarized. Other scholars and librarians were similarly dismissive, and with the exception of the case of Joseph Glanvill, a common denominator across the letters that Cavendish received in response is that there is almost no attempt to engage with her philosophical arguments and positions, and little evidence of their having been read (Cunning 2022). Unfortunately and sadly for her and for us, Cavendish was not able to participate in a philosophical back-and-forth with her contemporaries. When they would not critically correspond with her in print, she engaged their views critically in the form of a correspondence between herself and a fictional third person.[2] Cavendish wanted to secure a wide correspondence – “out of a love to Truth, and to make my own opinions the more intelligible, which cannot better be done then by arguing and comparing other mens opinions with them. …For a Philosopher or Philosopheress is not produced on a sudden.”[3] According to Cavendish, no one is a philosopher in a vacuum, just as no one is a military general, or barrister, or mathematician, or coach. To develop the skills that are part and parcel of philosophical inquiry, and to engage in philosophical debate itself, one needs interlocutors, and one needs to be seen as a potential authority. But the people in her surrounding environment were not going to comply. She left her books on the shelf in the hope that the self-same work might be far more impactful in a future generation.

Cavendish lived and wrote in the thick of the mechanistic revolution of the seventeenth century, though many of her views—about thinking matter, the transfer of motion, and the nature of scientific explanation—are largely anti-mechanistic, and in many respects her arguments run against the grain. In her own age, she was regarded alternately as mad, pretentious, a curiosity, and a genius. She finally received some much-wanted recognition from her male peers in 1667, when she was offered an extremely rare invitation to participate in a meeting of the Royal Society, though to be sure she was regarded as a spectacle by many in attendance (Whitaker 2002, 291–306). She died in December 1673 and was buried at Westminster Abbey. Over the course of her short life she produced a number of important works in philosophy. These include Worlds Olio (1655), Philosophical and Physical Opinions (1656), Philosophical Letters (1664), Observations Upon Experimental Philosophy (1666), The Description of a New World, Called the Blazing World (1666), and Grounds of Natural Philosophy (1668).

The central tenet of Cavendish’s philosophy is that everything in the universe—including human beings and their minds—is completely material. Her commitment to this tenet is reflected throughout her corpus:

Nature is material, or corporeal, and so are all her Creatures, and whatsoever is not material is no part of Nature, neither doth it belong any ways to Nature….[4]

According to Cavendish, none of the achievements of bodies are to be traced to immaterial agents such as God, immaterial finite minds, or substantial forms, because bodies have the resources to bring about everything that they do on their own. Cavendish also holds that bodies are ubiquitous and that there is no vacuum, because extensions of space cannot be extensions of nothing but must be extensions of matter.[5] Every body is infinitely divisible (Cavendish 1668a, 125, 263; Cavendish 1668b, 239), and all of the bodies in nature, at every level of division, are intelligent and perceptive (Cavendish 1668a, 16, 156; Cavendish 1668b, 7). As we will see, one of Cavendish’s motivations for accepting the latter view is that it makes sense of the order that we encounter in the natural world.

Cavendish is aware that she is writing in a tradition in which the prospect of thinking matter is not going to be taken seriously. In the eyes of many of her contemporaries and predecessors, matter is not only unintelligent, but also inert and utterly worthless. She writes,

I perceive man has a great spleen against self-moving corporeal nature, although himself is part of her, and the reason is his ambition; for he would fain be supreme, and above all other creatures, as more towards a divine nature: he would be a God, if arguments could make him such….[6]

Cavendish does not accept a conception of matter according to which matter is low-grade being. Her view that minds are corporeal is not the view that minds are

composed of raggs and shreds, but it is the purest, simplest and subtillest [sic] matter in Nature. (Cavendish 1664, 180)

Cavendish will argue that the processes that are traditionally identified as material are wondrous and impressive and that the processes that she would identify as material, but that others would identify as immaterial, are even more so. As we will see, her view on the sophistication of matter also informs other aspects of her thinking – for example, her metaphysics of imagination, according to which imaginings are not static pictures, but living figures that are creative and able to take on a life of their own; and also her view of the superiority of natural productions to human artifacts (Lascano 2020). According to Cavendish, the latter are composed of bodies that are put together quickly and do not have the same history of communication and synchronization as the entities that compose a production of nature (Cunning 2016, 185–196). When Cavendish says that ideas are material images, or that natural productions are more sophisticated than artifacts, she is not supposing a conception of matter according to which it is static and inert and dead. Her own views employ some of the language of the tradition – for example matter, image, and idea – but she fleshes out such terms in novel directions. She does not attempt to create an entirely new language, given that no one would understant it. For the most part she retains existing terminology and notes the respects in which it has been misused or abused.

The Cavendish corpus is a tour de force, even if Cavendish was not recognized in her own lifetime for the extent of her intellectual prowess. She wrote eight philosophical monographs, and she crafted plays and poems and fictional pieces that exhibit philosophical arguments and thought experiments as well.[7] Her thinking has important implications and tentacles, providing us with insights into the place of human beings in nature, the distinction between the social and the natural, and the interdependence of creatures. She also made significant contributions on other philosophical topics like causation, perception, motion, agency, gender, God, and free will. Her views and arguments might also be interpreted as bearing on contemporary movements in deep ecology and environmental ethics. As we will see, she holds that human beings would benefit from emulating the behavior and thinking of nonhuman creatures – for example in the case of social organization. However, Cavendish does not appear to have the resources to make any normative claims about our impact on nature. She admires nature, but her list of the qualities that pertain to bodies include size, figure, motion, activity, thought, and perception, and not qualities like goodness and badness. She is also not especially concerned about the long-term viability of the natural world. It will be fine. As an eternal entity, it is not going anywhere, even if we happen to impact it in a way that leads to our own demise.

Cavendish died in 1673 at the early age of 50.

2. Intelligent Matter in the History of Philosophy

Cavendish is working within a philosophical tradition in which the doctrine that matter is self-moving and intelligent is almost completely unintelligible. To those of her opponents who allow that the doctrine can be entertained, it is unlikely at best, and if true it is a terrible disappointment.

For example, in Plato we find the view that “the philosopher frees the soul from association with the body as much as possible” (Plato, 64e–65a). For Plato, souls are invisible and intangible and hence indivisible and divine, and bodies are their complete opposite (78b–80b). We know from an analysis of our concept of body, and from our presumably related observation of the sudden inactivity of things that die, that animated bodies have a soul and that bodies on their own are inert (105c–e). A soul is obviously what activates and enlivens a body, and the opposite of a soul, its body, is “death” (105e). Our embodiment and our resulting physical needs incline us to pursue sensible objects, but these are not worthy of our attention, and they interfere with our ability to attend to things that are.

We find a similar contempt for the body in prominent philosophers of later ancient philosophy and in medieval and early modern philosophers as well. In “On Beauty,” Plotinus speaks to “the darkness inherent in matter” (Plotinus, I.6, 37). He praises the sensible, but only to the extent that it imitates immaterial ideas and minds:

This is why fire glows with a beauty beyond all other bodies, for fire holds the rank of idea in their regard. Always struggling aloft, this subtlest of elements is at the last limits of the bodily. …It sparkles and glows like an idea. (Ibid.)

Fire is still material, of course, and material things are no substitute for things that are immaterial and (hence) divine (40). Plotinus continues,

[A]n ugly soul… is friend to filthy pleasures, it lives a life abandoned to bodily sensation and enjoys its depravity. …If someone is immersed in mire or daubed with mud, his native comeliness disappears; all one sees is the mire and mud with which he is covered. Ugliness is due to the alien matter that encrusts him. If he would be attractive once more, he has to wash himself, get clean again, make himself what he was before. Thus we would be right in saying that ugliness of soul comes from its mingling with, fusion with, collapse into the bodily and material…. (39)

In a word, Plotinus thinks that we should do all that we can to mitigate the unfortunate fact of our embodiment and instead engage in philosophical reflection. A hundred years later Augustine repeats the same view exactly:

How highly do you value th[e] will? You surely do not think it should be compared with wealth or honours or physical pleasures, or even all of these together. …Then should we not rejoice a little that we have something in our souls—this very thing that I call a good will—in comparison with which those things we mentioned are utterly worthless…? (Augustine, 19)

For Augustine, body is so bad that sin consists in turning our attention away from eternal things to things that are temporal and corporeal (27). Augustine is working in the Christian tradition, and it cannot be ignored that although Christ made a tremendous sacrifice in giving up his body, the abandonment of the physical in favor of the purely spiritual reads very differently through an Augustinian and Platonic lens.

This same manner of thinking finds its way into the seventeenth century as well. In the Cartesian (and very Augustinian and Platonic) philosopher Nicolas Malebranche, we find the view that bodies are “inferior things” that are essentially passive and inert (Malebranche 1674–5, VI.ii.3, 447, 448). He brings together the whole spectrum of themes that are advanced by his body-dismissing predecessors. In Dialogues on Metaphysics and on Religion, his spokesperson Theodore says to his opponent Aristes that our embodiment is a burden and that we should neutralize it to whatever extent we can:

You are now ready to make thousands and thousands of discoveries in the land of truth. Distinguish ideas from sensations, but distinguish them well…. Your modalities are only darkness, remember that. Silence your senses, your imagination and your passions, and you will hear the pure voice of inner truth, the clear and evident responses of our common master. Never confound evidence, which results from the comparison of ideas, with the vivacity of the sensations which affect and disturb you. The more vivid our sensations, the more they spread darkness. …In a word, avoid all that affect you and quickly embrace all that enlightens you. We must follow Reason despite the seductions, the threats, the insults of the body to which we are united, despite the action of the objects surrounding us. (Malebranche 1688, III.viii, 36)

For Malebranche, the search for truth is very literally a matter of retreating to the study, where the possibility is minimized that we will be distracted by the lures of the sensible world. In Malebranche’s (and Cavendish’s) contemporary Ralph Cudworth we find a similar disgust for the body. Cudworth argues that there is a hierarchy of being that applies to creatures and that minds are at the top. Bodies are dead and lowly, and are squarely at the bottom:

There is unquestionably, a Scale or Ladder of Nature, and Degrees of Perfection and Entity, one above another, as of Life, Sense, and Cogitation, above Dead, Sensless and Unthinking Matter; or Reason and Understanding above Sense, &c.[8]

Cudworth is certainly aware that the bodies that surround us are active and engage in behaviors that are orderly and (at least apparently) teleological, but none of this is evidence that matter is not dead. Cudworth concludes that because matter is dead, its orderly and purposive behavior can only be explained on the assumption that it is accompanied by a (necessarily immaterial) guide (Cunning 2003).

There are other philosophers in the seventeenth century who agree that matter is a detestable sort of being, but conclude that it does not exist, or at least that it does not exist as conceived by the tradition. In Anne Conway we find the view that God would not, and did not, create it:

how can any dead thing proceed from him or be created by him, such as mere body or matter…? It has truly been said that God does not make death. It is equally true that he did not make any dead thing, for how can a dead thing come from him who is infinite life and love? Or, how can any creature receive so vile and diminished an essence from him (who is so infinitely generous and good)…? (Conway 1690, 45)

For Conway, God creates only beings that are alive, and so the everyday objects that surround us are something other than what Plotinus, Malebranche and Cudworth had thought. There exists nothing that is brutish, inert, and unthinking, and instead there is a continuum of creatures that exist on a spectrum from highly intelligent and active to largely dim and dull. Cavendish agrees with Conway that nothing answers to the traditional conception of matter, but unlike Conway she is happy to say that matter surrounds us. Cavendish and Conway are for the most part in agreement; Cavendish simply rejects the traditional conception of matter as inadequate, and then proceeds to argue that the things that our concept of matter has always picked out—the things that our language has designated as ‘material’—are something more (Borcherding 2022). Unlike many of her opponents, Cavendish is not disappointed by the result that minds are material. She thinks on the contrary that it is a source of hope. For example, if we appreciate that minds are corporeal, we will be able to come up with better and more systematic and less groping treatments of mental illness.[9] As evidence for her view, she points to the obvious facts that a person’s mood and energy are affected by nutrition (Cavendish 1663, 431–2), and that old age and injury to the brain can neutralize some of our cognitive functions (Cavendish 1668b, 85–6, 113; Cavendish 1663, 334–5). Cavendish is breaking with her tradition and arguing that the fulfillment of a person is not a matter of turning away from the body but understanding all of its dynamics and embracing it.[10]

3. Material minds

An important strand in Cavendish’s argument for materialism is her defense of the view that minds are material. One of her arguments for this view begins with the assumption that our minds are housed in our bodies. She assumes that we are being serious when we say that our thinking takes place in the head, and concludes that to the extent to which we are speaking literally our thoughts must have figure and be spatially situated:

I would ask those, that say the Brain has neither sense, reason, nor self-motion, and therefore no Perception; but that all proceeds from an Immaterial Principle, and an Incorporeal Spirit, distinct from the body, which moveth and actuates corporeal matter; I would fain ask them, I say, where their Immaterial Ideas reside, in what part or place of the Body? …[I]f it [the spirit] have no dimension, how can it be confined in a material body?[11]

Since “[p]lace [is] an attribute that belongs onely to a Body” (Cavendish 1664, 8), minds and their ideas are material. Thinking does not take place only in the brain, according to Cavendish. She will argue that it is ubiquitous in nature and that, in the case of a human being, it pervades the brain and the rest of the body.

A related reason that Cavendish offers in favor of the view that thinking is material is that

Though Matter might be without Motion, yet Motion cannot be without matter; for it is impossible (in my opinion) that there should be an Immaterial Motion in Nature.[12]

Cavendish takes it to be obvious that only material things move. That is to say, there is no immaterial motion. She also takes it to be obvious that if a person is thinking and their body partakes of motion, their mind partakes of motion as well. In the current day we might be at the airport, thinking about a philosophical question, and then we might continue to think about the question midflight, and then we might finally give the question a rest when we have arrived at our destination. Our thinking took place at the airport, and on the plane, and at our final stop. Taking issue with the ancient Greek philosopher Protagoras, she writes,

I cannot conceive how it is possible, that … the Soul, being incorporeal, can walk in the air, like a body; for incorporeal beings cannot have corporeal actions, no more then corporeal beings can have the actions of incorporeals. (Cavendish 1668d, 368)

If minds do travel, and Cavendish supposes that they do, then they are material. Cavendish indeed supposes that minds partake of all kinds of motion.[13] She holds that the “rational” parts of the mind “move freely without Burdens” (Cavendish 1668b, 5) – for example, when the mind quickly assembles an image of an entity. Ideas are extremely active in their motions, according to Cavendish, and she supposes that only material things move. Note however that in holding that ideas move, she does not want to say that they move from place to place. That is because strictly speaking Cavendish does not hold that there is such a thing as place or location that bodies inhabit. Instead, a body and its place are identical (Cavendish 1668a, 4). For Cavendish, what it means to say that a body moves will be a function of its mereological relations to the bodies that surround it (Peterman 2019).

In bringing together the datum that minds move and the premise that immaterial things do not partake of motion, Cavendish anticipates a line of argumentation that we later find in Locke:

No Body can imagine, that his Soul can think, or move a Body at Oxford, whilst he is at London; and cannot but know, that being united to his Body, it constantly changes place all the whole Journey, between Oxford and London, as the Coach, or Horse does, that carries him; and, I think, may be said to be truly all that while in motion…. (Locke 1689, 307)

Locke only hints at the conclusion that minds are material, but Cavendish by contrast is not concerned to pull any punches.[14] The thesis that matter thinks is an unrevisable element of her philosophical system. It is not an unwelcome appendage but instead is a straightforward consequence of tenets that she takes to be obvious. Cavendish is also cornering her opponent into explaining what the sense is in which minds move or are housed in our brains if they are not material. A figure like Leibniz is comfortable elucidating the nature of (immaterial) minds in terms of the language of mirrors, dizziness, and spatial perspective (Monadology, sections 83, 21, 57). Cavendish is insisting that the language of dimension and motion applies to bodies alone.

An objection of course is that there is something odd in saying that minds move or that they are spatial. There are plenty of figures in the history of philosophy who have posited the existence of entities that are not in space, even though these entities still in some way apply to, or are a part of, everyday objects. Most famous, perhaps, is Plato’s positing of the existence of numbers, perfect geometrical figures, and other universal entities. Here Cavendish and her opponents are presumably at loggerheads. There may be something odd about saying that minds move, she would insist, but there is something even more odd about saying that the entirety of person partakes of motion without their mind partaking of motion as well. She might grant that perhaps there are immaterial minds – and also numbers and geometrical figures, etc. – that exist in a non-spatial Platonic realm, but she would insist that these are not what we are referencing when we speak of the minds by which we deliberate on earth and have ideas. The latter minds travel with us when we move and are material. Cavendish is in effect imploring us to take seriously that the language of moving minds is only unusual against the background of an impoverished conception of matter.

Another argument that Cavendish puts forward for the view that thinking is material is from mind-body interaction. First, she presupposes a standard materialist premise: that nothing can interact with or come into contact with a body but a body. She writes,

In fine, I cannot conceive, how a Spirit … can have the effects of a body, being none it self; for the effects flow from the cause; and as the cause is, so are its effects…. (Cavendish 1664, 197)

it is, in my opinion, more probable, that one material should act upon another material, or one immaterial should act upon another immaterial, then that an immaterial should act upon a material or corporeal. (Cavendish 1664, 207)

This is a standard kind of argument that we find in philosophers ranging from Lucretius to Gassendi to Spinoza to Searle: that things cannot stand in causal relations with bodies unless they are material themselves.[15] Our minds interact with our bodies on a regular basis, but the interaction of immaterials and materials is impossible, and so minds must be material also.

We might worry that Cavendish has only provided reason to think that the minds with which our bodies interact are material. Perhaps human beings have bodies and material minds, and in addition we have an immaterial mind (or soul) that is something above and beyond our material mind. In a way she actually concedes the point:

there may be supernatural spiritual beings or substances in Nature, without any hinderance to Matter or corporeal Nature. The same I may say of the natural material, and the divine and supernatural Soul; for though the divine Soul is in a natural body, and both their powers and actions be different, yet they cause no ruine or disturbance to each other….[16]

Here Cavendish is allowing that for all we know there exist immaterial entities like a divine and supernatural soul, but if so, we do not detect any such entities, and they are not the things that we are referencing when we talk about the minds by which we think and have ideas. Those interact with bodies, and partake of motion, and hence they are material. If there is a divine and supernatural soul, our material minds (and bodies) cannot interact with it, and we cannot detect it. Cavendish writes,

Wherefore no part of nature (her parts being corporeal) can perceive an immaterial; because it is impossible to have a perception of that which is not perceptible, as not being an object fit or proper for corporeal perception.[17]

[N]atural reason cannot know nor have naturally any perception or idea of an Incorporeal being. (Cavendish 1668a, 78)

But as for Immaterial, no mind can conceive that, for it cannot put it self into nothing, although it can dilate and rarifie it self to an higher degree, but must stay within the circle of natural bodies….[18]

There might exist immaterial souls, Cavendish seems to be allowing in these passages, but if immaterial souls do exist we cannot perceive or form ideas of them. Furthermore, the entities that we do conceive and discuss are not those immaterials but something else.

Sometimes Cavendish comes close to saying something even stronger: that finite immaterial things have no being or reality at all. For example, she writes,

[Immaterial things are] Non-beings, for they are the weakest of all, and can do her [Nature] the least hurt, as not being able to obstruct real and corporeal actions of Nature…. (Cavendish 1664, 242)

Here she is agreeing with her contemporary Thomas Hobbes, who argued that spirits exist but that the only existents are things that inhabit space and have dimension, and so spirits are material. He holds that

The World, (I mean no the Earth onely, that denominates the Lovers of it Worldly men, but the Universe, that is, the whole masse of all things that are) is Corporeall, that is to say, Body; and hath the dimensions of Magnitude, namely, Length, Breadth, and Depth: also every part of Body, is likewise Body, and hath the like dimensions; and consequently every part of the Universe, is Body; and that which is not Body, is no part of the Universe: And because the Universe is All, that which is no part of it, is Nothing; and consequently no where. Nor does it follow from hence, that Spirits are nothing: for they have dimensions, and are therefore really Bodies…. (Hobbes 1651, xlvi.15, 463)

Here Hobbes is suggesting that even God is a body, if God in fact has any reality, but Cavendish will not go quite that far. In one passage she says that God is an immaterial, and is the only immaterial:

an Immaterial, in my opinion, must be some uncreated Being; which can be no other than GOD alone. Wherefore, created Spirits, and Spiritual Souls, are some other thing than an Immaterial; for surely, if there were any other Immaterial Beings, besides the Omnipotent God, these would be so near the Divine Essence of God, as to be petty gods, would, almost, make the power of an Infinite God. But God is Omnipotent, and only God. (Cavendish 1668b, 239)

In the preponderance of passages Cavendish says that there are no natural finite immaterials, and so she appears to allow that non-natural finite immaterials might have some being or other. She subsccribes to the view that only material things are real and substantial,[19] but perhaps she just holds that our word ‘real’ picks out things that are tangible and spatial, even if there are other existents as well. Cavendish suggests as much when she says that we might be surrounded by immaterials, but that we cannot detect them. She also writes,

all that is called Immaterial, is a Natural Nothing, and an Immaterial Natural Substance, in my opinion, is non-sense…. (Cavendish 1664, 321)

Cavendish is committed to saying that the ideas and minds that we encounter are a part of nature and are material. Presumably she is right to hold that there might exist other things as well, even if they are nothing to us.

A problem that arises however is that as we have seen Cavendish holds that we cannot form ideas of immaterials. If so, it is not clear how (on her view) we can have the thought that immaterials might exist. Cavendish suggests very strongly that we can think and speak of immaterials in her remark that they might in fact surround us; she says that even if they did, we would be none the wiser. But still the question remains about how Cavendish can allow that we are able to think or talk about immaterials at all, if we are not able to perceive, detect or have ideas of them.

There are a number of ways that Cavendish might maneuver here. One would be to defend the thesis that although our natural (and hence material) minds can form no conception of an immaterial, there is another aspect of our minds — an aspect that is not material — and it can form conceptions of immaterials. Cavendish hints at this thesis when she states that natural reason cannot have an idea of an incorporeal being, leaving open that non-natural reason could have an idea of an incorporeal being. A problem of course is that Cavendish does not seem to be able to allow that natural reason can have an idea of non-natural reason or that it can put forward the thesis that non-natural reason can form conceptions of immaterials.

Another maneuver would be to make a distinction between knowledge and faith and argue that although our minds cannot detect immaterials or have any evidence for their existence, there must be some way in which our minds are able to conceive of immaterials (such as God), or else we would not even be capable of faith. Cavendish writes for example that

the rational [component of the mind] perceives some effects of the omnipotent power of God; which effects are perceptible by finite creatures, but not his infinite nature, nor essence, nor the cause of his infiniteness and omnipotency. (Ibid., 90)

A problem of course is that if Cavendish is committed to the view that natural reason can form no conception of an immaterial, then she can allow that we have ideas of things that are the effect of an immaterial cause, but it is difficult to see how we could have an idea of that immaterial cause itself. So long as she “take[s] an idea to be the picture of some object” (Cavendish 1668, 74) and so long as immaterials cannot be captured in a figure or image, it would appear that she is committed to saying that we can have no ideas of immaterials at all.

A third maneuver that Cavendish could make is to say that when she talks in the language of immaterials, she is using terms that she does not take to be referential, but that are still serving an important communicative role. For example, when she speaks of the immaterial souls that might surround us, and the way in which they would be nothing to us, she might be trying to make a point in the language of her opponents. They speak in terms of immaterials, and Cavendish might want to attempt to engage them. She says for example at the start of Philosophical Letters,

I shall meerly go upon the bare Ground of Natural Philosophy, and not mix Divinity with it, as many Philosophers use to do, except it be in those places, where I am forced by the Authors Arguments to reflect upon it, which shall yet be rather with an expression of my ignorance, then a positive declaration of my opinion of judgment thereof; for I think it not onely an absurdity, but an injury to the holy Profession of Divinity to draw her to the Proofs in Natural Philosophy; wherefore I shall strictly follow the Guidance of Natural Reason, and keep to my own ground and Principles as much as I can…. (Cavendish 1664, 3)

A potential problem for the view that Cavendish is making this third maneuver in all cases in which she uses the word “God” is that there are texts outside of Philosophical Letters in which she uses the word but is not directly responding to the view of a theistic opponent. But she is also clear in numerous passages that we have no idea of God or any other immaterials, and no idea of infinitude, and so it is likely that in those texts she is responding to a presumptive opponent, or perhaps just that she is being careful to articulate her piety.

A final argument that Cavendish offers for the view that matter thinks and is intelligent is from the orderly behavior of bodies. One of the longstanding puzzles of seventeenth-century philosophy and science was how to explain this behavior. Cudworth lays out the puzzle very neatly. First, he offers a trilemma:

since neither all things are produced Fortuitously, or by the Unguided Mechanism of Matter, nor God himself may reasonably be thought to do all things Immediately and Miraculously; it may well be concluded, that there is a Plastick Nature under him, which as an Inferior and Subordinate Instrument, doth Drudgingly Execute that Part of his Providence, which consists in the Regular and Orderly Motion of Matter. (Cudworth 1678, 150)

Cudworth settles on the third horn of the trilemma after ruling out the other two. Bodies are dumb and dead, and so are not the source of their own order, and it would be beneath God to attend to bodily affairs Himself (Cunning 2003, 348–50). Cudworth also considers a fourth option—that the orderly behavior of bodies is secured by the existence of laws of nature.[20] He concludes that it is not an additional option after all but is subsumed by the other three:

These men (I say) seem not very well to understand themselves in this. Forasmuch as they must of necessity, either suppose these their Laws of Motion to execute themselves, or else be forced perpetually to concern the Deity in the Immediate Motion of every Atom of Matter throughout the Universe, in Order to the Execution and Observation of them… we cannot make any other Conclusion than this, That they do but unskillfully and unawares establish that very Thing which in words they oppose; and that their Laws of Nature concerning Motion, are Really nothing else, but a Plastick Nature… (Cudworth 1678, 151)

Here Cudworth is pointing out, and Cavendish will agree, that we do not account for the orderly behavior of bodies by positing laws of nature if we do not know what a law of nature is or how it operates. On Cudworth’s view, the orderly behavior of bodies is secured by immaterial minds (or plastic natures) that attach to bodies and work to keep them on the rails. In something like the way that our (immaterial) minds intelligently guide our bodies, plastic natures intelligently guide the bodies that compose the plant and animal and mineral world. Cavendish agrees with a [highly modified] version of this last statement. She will raise the objection, though, that minds that move and come into contact with and attach to bodies must be material themselves.

Like Cudworth, Cavendish generates her view on the orderly behavior of bodies from a rejection of the Epicurean doctrine that the order that we encounter in nature arises by chance. She writes,

[T]hough the Opinion of Atoms is as Old as from the Time of Epicurus, yet my Conceptions of their Figures, Creating and Disposing, are New, and my Own. … It is not probable that the Substance of Infinite matter is only Infinite, Small, Senseless Fibres, Moving and Composing all Creatures by Chance, and that Chance should produce all things in such order and Method, unless every Single Atome were Animated Matter, having Animated Motion, which is Sense and Reason, Life and Knowledge.[21]

Something is keeping bodies in line, according to Cavendish, and to do its job it must be active and knowledgeable and perceptive. It cannot be immaterial, however, and so

If nature were not Self-knowing, Self-living, and also Perceptive, she would run into Confusion: for there could be neither Order, nor Method, in Ignorant motion….[22]

Cavendish rejects the view that matter is not capable of engaging in orderly behavior on its own. It does not require the assistance of a plastic nature, for example, and it is not clear how such a thing could be of any help anyway. Cavendish is indeed shocked at the temerity of those who think that we can speak intelligibly of an immaterial divine being but then allow that some of its creatures would be dead and barren. She writes,

I cannot imagine why God should make an Immaterial Spirit to be the Proxy or Vice-gerent of his Power, or the Quarter-master General of his Divine Providence, as your Author is pleased to style it, when he is able to effect it without any Under-Officers, and in a more easie and compendious way, as to impart immediately such self-moving power to Natural Matter, which man attributes to an Incorporeal Spirit. (Cavendish 1664, 215)

Cavendish does not appear to allow that we can speak intelligibly of God (or other immaterials), and so here she is presumably just granting some theistic assumptions for the sake of argument. She is saying that if Cudworth and others are correct that God is an impressive creator, He would not have created lousy bodies along with high-grade minds to keep them on the rails; he would have made high-grade bodies that are able to exhibit order on their own.[23] They would be knowledgeable of the order that they are supposed to realize, and they would know the details of the bodies in their vicinity.[24]

4. Panpsychism

Cavendish does not think that thinking is restricted to human brains and nervous systems. She argues that thinking takes place across the spectrum of creatures – from human beings to non-human animals, to insects and cells, and to all of creaturely reality. For Cavendish mentality is ubiquitous throughout the entire universe.

First she cites what she takes to be obvious data about particular non-human animals. She writes,

the knowledge of other Creatures many times gives information to Man: As for example, the Egyptians are informed how high the River Nilus will rise by the Crocodil’s building her nest higher or lower, which shews, that those Creatures fore-see or fore-know more then Man can do: also many Birds fore-know the rising of a Tempest, and shelter themselves before it comes: the like examples might be given of several other sorts of Animals. (Cavendish 1668c, 297)

Then she supposes that the same applies to insects like ants and bees and spiders. In what is basically an ode to the ant, she writes,

A Company of Ants meeting together, chose the Root, or bottom thereof, to build a City; they build after one fashion, which is like a Hill, or half-Globe, the outside being Convex, the inside Concave; a Figure, it seems, they think most lasting, and least subject to Ruin…. They, being Wiser than Man, know Time is precious; and therefore judiciously order it, forecasting while they work, and taking up the whole time with Contrivance…. Likewise, they are careful of Repairs, lest Ruin should grow upon them; insomuch, that if the least Grain of Dust be misplaced, they stop, or close it up again. …So their care and affection is not less to bury their Dead. (Cavendish 1671, 280–82)

According to Cavendish, crocodiles and birds exhibit extremely sophisticated behavior that is guided by intelligence and mentality. So do ants and other insects. And so do other creatures that we might suppose are too primitive to think. She indeed supposes that cells and other microscopic creatures are mindful as well:

the Elemental Creatures are as excellent as Man, and… I cannot perceive more abilities in Man then in the rest of natural Creatures…. (Cavendish 1664, 147)

Life and knowledg is animate matter, and is in all parts of all Creatures. (Ibid., 514)

Cavendish supposes that it is obvious that there is mentality in all creatures. She looks around; she sees it; and she describes what she takes to be in front of her.

But someone might object that it is only metaphorical to say that ants and spiders – or cells – exhibit mentality. Perhaps they are just a kind of machine, and Cavendish is anthropomorphisizing when she insists (and projects) otherwise. So she also makes sure to back her contention with arguments.

One especially clever argument begins with the assumption that human brains think. That seems fair enough. Then Cavendish argues that the only way that human brains could think is if the elemental bodies that compose the brain were also mental and perceptive. In effect, she is asking the question: if the physical elements that make up the brain are entirely non-mental – and exhibit no trace of mentality – how could they add up to a larger brain that thinks? If the basic elements of the brain do not have any mentality at all, then they could not combine together into a larger body that thinks. That would be magic, and Cavendish is not going to appeal to magic in her explanations of things. Non-mental elements could certainly combine together to compose a larger thing that is also not mental or minded. But if elements combine together to form a brain that thinks, then those elements must have some trace of mentality or proto-mentality.[25] She writes,

I shall never be able to conceive, how senseless and irrational Atomes can produce sense and reason, or a sensible and rational body, such as the soul is…. ‘Tis true, different effects may proceed from one cause or principle; but there is no principle, which is senseless, can produce sensitive effects; nor no rational effects can flow from an irrational cause… (Cavendish 1668d, 375)

Here Cavendish is taking a stand on a critical question of the early modern period – the question of how bodies would be able to think if their most basic features did not include mentality of some kind. Many of her contemporaries argued that the most basic features of body are extensive features like size, shape and motion; they concluded that bodies cannot think because there is no way to explain how thinking would arise or emerge from building blocks that are utterly non-mental. Descartes is an example (Descartes 1644, I.53, 210–1), as is Malebranche:

Can a thing extended in length, width, and depth reason, desire, sense? Undoubtedly not, for all the ways of being of such an extended thing consist only in relations of distance; and it is evident that these relations are not perceptions, reasonings, pleasures, desires, sensations—in a word, thoughts. Therefore this I that thinks, my own substance, is not a body, since my perceptions, which surely belong to me, are something entirely different from relations of distance. (Malebranche 1688, 6)

For Malebranche, “the ways of being” of a body are restricted to what can be understood as bearing relations of distance to other things. It is impossible to conceive of a thought as having a size, or as being a certain distance from another thought or from a body, so a thought is not a body or the property of a body.

Cavendish turns the debate on its head. In a nutshell, she argues that if elemental bodies do not exhibit an iota of mentality, then human brains would not exhibit an iota of mentality. But human brains do exhibit mentality. Therefore the smaller elemental bodies that compose the brain exhibit mentality as well. Those bodies that make up the brain have electrons and protons (although that language was not yet available in the Seventeenth Century); they also have a kind of proto-mentality and perception.

Cavendish would then just need to appeal to the assumption that the bodies that make up the brain are not essentially different from the bodies that compose everything else. Or better put: she would need to appeal to the assumption that the elemental bodies that make up the bodies that make up the brain are not essentially different from the elemental bodies that compose the bodies that make up everything else. She takes that assumption to be confirmed in the behavior of the bodies that surround us. We might again consider bees, or ants, or the natural and highly sophisticated processes by which an eyeball is produced, or the process of the formation of metal. She writes,

I cannot perceive more abilities in Man then in the rest of natural Creatures; for though he can build a stately House, yet he cannot make a Honey-comb; and though he can plant a Slip, yet he cannot make a Tree; though he can make a Sword, or Knife, yet he cannot make the Mettal. (Cavendish 1664, 147)

We can create a sword, but we cannot create the metal that makes up a sword. Perhaps we can do it in the current day, but Cavendish would insist that if so, nature figured it out first, and we are just imitating the skill of nature and following its lead. There is also a sense in which we can make a tree, but not really. We can certainly plant a shrub, or what Cavendish is calling a “slip.” But when we do that, we aren’t doing all the productive work, and indeed the contribution on our end is fairly minimal. We put a seed or shrub in the ground and water it, and a tree eventually forms. All of the real work is done by the complicated genetic and physical structure of the seed or shrub, and if it did not have that structure, we could water the thing all day long and nothing would grow. Two people might also announce that they made a baby together, but the same applies again: the real legwork is done by the sophistication of the reproductive organs and the infrastructure by which nutrition is redistributed to the growing fetus – for example through the placenta. A human being forms, and it consists of things like the human eye, which is about as intricate an entity as could be. Perhaps we have caught up to nature in some instances – for example we can now create synthetic seeds that become plants – but again Cavendish would insist that in such a case we are imitating the wisdom of nature and that nature figured it out first. But we still cannot make a human eye or much else that nature has been manufacturing seamlessly and skillfully for eons.

Cavendish accordingly concludes that the wisdom that is exhibited in natural bodies is often of a higher order than the wisdom that is exhibited in human beings. Indeed we are at our best when we imitate nature:

Natural reason is above artific[e]: wherefore those Arts are the best and surest Informers, that alter Nature least, and they the greatest deluders that alter Nature most. (Cavendish 1668a, 12–13)

Non-human bodies are intelligent and creative, according to Cavendish, and they communicate with each other in the course of bringing about impressive and coordinated feats. She writes,

it is well to be observed, that there being an entercourse and commerce, as also an acquaintance and agreement between parts and parts, there must also of necessity be some knowledg or perception betwixt them. that is, one part must be able to perceive another part, and the actions of that same part; for wheresoever is life and knowledg, that is, sense and reason, there is also perception; and though no part of Nature can have an absolute knowledg, yet it is neither absolutely ignorant, but it has a particular knowledge, and particular perceptions, according to the nature of its own innate and interior figure. (Ibid., 165)

The bodies that compose an artifact are also natural bodies, of course, and so they have a history of perception and communication with the bodies with which they are standardly continguous, but human artifice is often a matter of extracting such bodies from their normal context and putting them in a position that is foreign and unfamiliar. These bodies are still perceptive, but the combinations into which they are forced to enter are not as well-functioning. An everyday example that might shed light on Cavendish’s thinking here is the difference between an office staff of individuals who have a long history of working together and a group of office workers that was just recently assembled. Statistically speaking the first group would be able to get a lot more done. Or perhaps a better example is Muppet Man.

Cavendish would also appeal to the order that is exhibited throughout the natural world as evidence for her view that thinking is ubiquitous. As we have seen, she holds that bodies do not exhibit orderly behavior unless they are guided by intelligence and mentality. Order is exhibited throughout nature, and so mentality abounds.

Note however that Cavendish is not thereby committed to the view that non-human creatures exhibit the same kind of thinking as human beings. She writes that

there are different Knowledges, in different Creatures; … they are different Knowledges proper to their kind, (as, Animal-kind, Vegetable-kind, Mineral-kind, Elemental-kind) and are also different Knowledges in several sorts: As for example, Man may have a different Knowledg from Beasts, Birds, Fish, Flies, Worms, or the like; and yet be no wiser than those sorts of Animal-kinds. (Cavendish 1668b, 163–64)

She then offers the same kind example that we find later in the work of Cudworth, who also held that thinking is ubiquitous in nature, though he argued that thinking is immaterial. If we worry that it sounds odd to say that there is thinking in trees, cells, and other bodies that exhibit order, Cudworth notes that not all thinking is the highly conscious and reflective variety that is showcased by Descartes. Instead, there is the intelligence that is exhibited by the fingers of the “exercised lutonist” – fingers that are able to create beautiful music without being conscious (Cudworth 1678, 157). We might point to other examples of expert behavior that are more mundane – like driblling a basketball, or doing the steps of a dance – where we do well when we proceed unthinkingly, but where get tripped up if we bring our behavior to the level of conscious attention. Anticipating Cudworth, and anticipating much-later philosophers who posit the existence of embodied cognition, Cavendish writes:

[M]ost spend their time in talk rather then in thought; but there is a wise saying, think first, and speak after; and an old saying that many speak first, and think after; and doubtlesse many, if not most do so, for we do not alwayes think of our words we speak, for most commonly words flow out of the mouth, rather customarily then premeditately, just like actions of our walking, for we go by custome, force and strength, without a constant notice or observation; for though we designe our wayes, yet we do not ordinarily think of our pace, nor take notice of every several step; just so, most commonly we talk, for we seldom think of our words we speak, nor many times the sense they tend to; unlesse it be some affected person that would speak in fine phrases … . (Cavendish 1655, Epistle, unnumbered)

Some of us might squirm at using an expression like “muscle memory” – if we think that (material) muscles cannot exhibit mental states. But for Cavendish phenomena like muscle memory are to be expected if bodies are mindful across the board.

She would add for good measure that although human beings do engage in conscious and reflective thinking, most of our thinking is not of that sort. A human being is composed of a very large number of bodies, and most of these are involved in such orderly functions as the beating of the heart, digestion, the absorption of nutrients, the disposal of waste, reproduction, and the significant amount of communication that takes place between cells. That is a lot of mentality, and arguably it is much more than the mentality that is constituted by episodes of conscious reflection. Cavendish even offers a clever argument to the effect that episodes of conscious mentality of a human being presuppose a torrential amount of unconscious cognitive labor that is taking place behind the scenes.

The example of a conversation is especially telling, Cavendish supposes – “for most commonly words flow out of the mouth, rather customarily then premeditately.” In the course of a conversation a string of thoughts often just comes to us, and then we utter them. A similar example is that in which we come to have a witty or clever idea in response to a situation that we inhabit. It’s not that we have the conscious idea already, among many other conscious thoughts that are in our mind, and then we choose to express the one that has a high-relevance flag attached to it; the thought just presents itself. Or if we have many thoughts and one has attached to it the high-relevance flag, something attached that flag, and that is cognitive work. Or we might consider the case of the late-night talk-show host who thinks of exactly the right thing at exactly the right time, though it is one of perhaps a hundred million possible thoughts in their wheelhouse. But they think of – and utter – just the one. Cavendish shines a light on the phenomenon by positing the existence of unconscious cognitive workers in the brain that wisely select our thoughts and put them before our conscious mind. She writes (“Of small Creatures, such as we call Fairies,” in Cavendish 1653a, 162):

Who knows, but in the Braine may dwel
Little small Fairies, who can tell?
And by their several actions they may make
Those formes and figures, we for fancy take.

And when we sleep, those Visions, dreames we call
By their industry may be raised all;
And all the objects, which through sens’es get
Within the Braine they may in order set.

Cavendish does not suppose that there are actual winged fairies flying around in our brain. What she does suppose is that there must be a cause that puts before our mind the intelligent thoughts that we come to have – in the coherent and intelligent order in which we come to have them. Otherwise we would not have those thoughts, or we would come to have them in an order that is jumbled and random. In the course of a conversation, and in the course of any train of thought, there is something of which we are not aware that “in order set[s]” our ideas. This something is cognitive and perceptive and discriminating by nature. If a comedian or philosopher or witty person is identified as intelligent for articulating a clever idea, the process by which the idea comes to them is properly identified as intelligent – if not more so. But by hypothesis we are not conscious of that background process; we are just conscious of the thoughts themselves. The background process is quite intelligent, however; and we would be lost without it. Indeed, a fun exercise in which a person might engage is to notice when a funny quip comes to them out of the blue, and ask how it arose. Cavendish would say that it’s fairies, which are the intelligent (and hence mindful) entities that “in order set” our ideas. These engage in a tremendous amount of mental activity, and for every bit of conscious reflective activity that we count, there is at least one bit of unconscious mental activity (if not more) that makes it possible. And then there is digestion, the absorption of nutrients, the disposal of waste, reproduction, the significant amount of communication that takes place between cells, etc. Just a fraction of the thinking that takes place in a human body is of the conscious and reflective variety, according to Cavendish, even if we think that kind of thinking is special and that it is the only kind of thinking that we do. But conscious thinking is an outlier, and if so, at most a fraction of the thinking that takes place in nature is of the sort with which we identify. The parts of a human body exhibit mentality – “one part of a mans body, as one hand, is not less sensible, then the other, nor the heel less sensible then the heart, nor the legg less sensible then the head, but each part hath its sense and reason, and so consequently its sensitive and rational knowledge….” (Cavendish 1664, 113–14). If a human hand or heel is composed of the same elemtental bodies that compose the rest of the bodies in nature, then unconscious embodied mentality abounds.

Another philosophical tenet that bears on Cavendish’s view on the ubiquity of thinking is her view that nature is a plenum. If there were empty space between bodies, then there would be no thinking that takes place between bodies, but Cavendish holds that the notion of empty space is a fiction. In the regions that we call “empty space,” there is air, for example, and in addition there are other bodies that are below the threshold of human perception. She offers a number of reasons for supposing that the universe is a plenum, including that nothingness can have no properties and that God would not create non-being. She writes,

an incorporeal dimension or extension, seems, in my opinion, a meer contradiction; for I cannot conceive how nothing can have a dimension or extension, having nothing to be extended or measured. (Cavendish 1664, 451–452)
my sense and reason cannot believe a Vacuum, because there cannot be an empty Nothing; but change of motion makes all the alteration of figures, and consequently all that which is called place, magnitude, space, and the like; for matter, motion, figure, place, magnitude, &c. are but one thing. But some men perceiving the alteration, but not the subtil motions, believe that bodies move into each others place…. (Cavendish 1664, 521)
God being not a Creator of Nothing, nor an annihilator of Nothing, but of Something, he cannot be a creator of Vacuum; for Vacuum is a pure Nothing. (Cavendish 1664, 453–454)

Cavendish will have to be careful about putting any weight on this last argument, if she also holds that we have no idea of God and no ideas of any immaterials more generally, but she does make sure to offer the additional argument that contains no theological premises. Non-being is nothing, she supposes, and in addition nothingness cannot have any properties. The universe is a plenum of contiguous bodies, and these bodies are also perceptive and are in regular communication with the bodies in their local environment. Cavendish is a panpsychist in the sense that she holds that all creatures exhibit mentality, and she holds that there is no space that is not inhabited by a creature. All creatures think, and there is no region of the universe that does not exhibit mentality.[26]

Cavendish does make a distinction between three kinds of matter – rational, sensitive, and inanimate – and so it might seem that she allows that some creatures, for example inanimate bodies, do not exhibit mentality. She writes,

The truth is, nature considered as she is, and as much as our sense and reason can perceive by her various effects, must of necessity be composed, or consist of a commixture of animate, both rational and sensitive, and inanimate matter: for, were there no inanimate matter, there would be no ground, or grosser substance to work on, and so no solid figures: and, were there no animate sensitive matter, there would be no ‘‘labourer,’’ or ‘‘workman,’’ as I may call it, to form the inanimate part of matter into various figures; such infinite changes, compositions, divisions, productions, dissolutions, etc. (Cavendish 1668a, 157–58)

The basic idea here is that if all matter were rational matter – of the sort that composes our ideas – then macroscopic bodies would assemble (and also decompose) just as quickly as our ideas of those bodies, but they do not. In imagination we can quickly form an idea of a house or mountain or dragon, and then recombine the components of that idea into an idea of something very different, but in nature things are more slow. They are also more steady. The three kinds of matter are more precisely “degrees of matter” (Cavendish 1668b, 4–5).[27] Cavendish supposes that all three are so intimately blended that there is no region of matter that does not exhibit at least some mentality and perception (O’Neill 2001, xxiii–xxvi).

Perhaps a final question that arises in the context of a discussion of Cavendish and panpsychism is about artificial intelligence. Cavendish would agree that a creature would never exhibit thinking if the elemental bodies of nature did not have features like thought and perception. In that circumstance, there is absolutely no chance, and no risk, that a computer would ever think, no matter its program, and a robot would never think, no matter how complicated the arrangement of its parts. But Cavendish holds that the elemental bodies of nature do exhibit thought and perception. There is no chance that a machine would think just in virtue of the size and shape of the bodies that compose it, but an artist or technologist might still create a thinking machine – not in virtue of its code or its wiring, but in virtue of the mentality of the bodies that are blended with them. As we will see, Cavendish has numerous reservations about human artifice. A twenty-first-century application of her view is to note that (non-panpsychist) artists and technologists are being naive and reckless in any attempt to create a powerful and efficient machine that merely simulates thinking; they lack a proper appreciation of what it is that is thereby combined.

5. Occasional Causation

An interesting wrinkle in Cavendish’s view of the orderly behavior of bodies is her insistence that when bodies interact they do not transfer motion to each other.[28] Instead, bodies communicate with each other about how to coordinate their behavior, and each is then the source of its own motion. On the assumption that properties cannot literally slide or hop from one body to another, cases in which one body does take on the motion of another body would be cases in which the second body also takes on the matter that has that motion. But we do not observe a body to become more massive when it is moved as a result of its contact with another body. As Cavendish explains in her description of a hand that moves a bowl,

I cannot think it probable, that any of the animate or self-moving matter in the hand, quits the hand, and enters into the bowl; nor that the animate matter, which is in the bowl, leaves the bowl and enters into the hand. (Cavendish 1664, 445)

Cavendish adds that “if it did, the hand would in a short time become weak and useless, by losing so much substance….”[29] She instead proposes that when one body appears to move another, it is simply an occasion or prompt for the second body to move on its own. The second body moves in the right way in response to the first body (and the other bodies in its vicinity), but only because all bodies are intelligent and perceptive and (for the most part) agreeable, and they communicate with each other about how to proceed.[30] A body B might appear to acquire new motion from a body A if body B at first was still, or a body B might appear to be stationary after a body A “stops” it from moving, but Cavendish supposes that bodies that appear to be stationary are always quite active below the surface:

though a particular motion doth not move in that same manner as it did before, nevertheless it is still there, and not onely there, but still moving; onely it is not moving after the same manner as it did move heretofore, but has changed from such a kind of motion to another kind of motion, and being still moving it cannot be said to cease: Wherefore what is commonly called cessation from motion, is onely a change of some particular motion, and is a mistake of change for rest. (Cavendish 1664, 436)

A given amount of motion is inseparably tied to the body that has it, according to Cavendish, and so motion never transfers from a first body to a second – unless of course the first body loses some of its matter, in which case there is a transfer of motion, but only because there is at the same time a transfer of matter. The motion that is transferred is not transferred from the matter that has it; instead, that matter and motion both transfer together. Cavendish supposes that motion is never transferred on its own, but she also allows that a body can redirect motions that another body already has. That is, a body never transfers any amount of motion to a second body, but a body can (and often does) redirect the motions of a second body. Bodies indeed often dominate other bodies and force their motions to run counter to what they would otherwise be:

…Nature’s Parts move themselves, and are not moved by any Agent. Secondly, Though Nature’s Parts are Self-moving, and Self-knowing, yet they have not an infinite or uncontroulable Power; for, several Parts, and Parties, oppose, and oft-times obstruct each other; so that many times they are forced to move, and they may not when they would. (Cavendish 1668b, 105)
there is no particular creature, that hath an absolute power of self-moving; so that Creature which hath the advantage of strength, subtilty, or policy, shape, or figure, and the like, may oppose and over-power another which is inferior to it, in all this; yet this hinderance and opposition doth not take away self-motion. (Cavendish 1664, 96)

A body never loses its motion, and motion is never transferred on its own from one body to another, but a body can redirect the motions that a second body already has, and in a way that might give the appearance that motion has been transferred. Cavendish will allow appearances to tell part of the story of a given body-body interaction, but she also makes sure that any such story is informed by deeper metaphysical considerations like that strictly speaking a body and its motion are inseparable.

A given body never loses or acquires motion, according to Cavendish. Instead, the motion of a body is always its own self-motion. If so, we can draw a conclusion about the motions that occur in a sense organ when an object is perceived. The motions are self-motions. They are not motions that are transfered from the object that is perceived; such a transfer is unintelligible. New motions are not transfered from the object that is perceived (unless the sense organ gets bigger); nor are they impressed upon the sense organ by bodies that travel through the air and stamp themselves on the organ.[31] Instead, the motions in the sense organ are self-motions. The sense organ patterns an image of the perceived body, and it does so via motions that it possessed all along:

By prints I understand the figures of the objects which are patterned or copied out by the sensitive and rational corporeal figurative motions; as for example, when the sensitive corporeal motions pattern out the figure of an exterior object, and the rational motions again pattern out a figure made by the sensitive motions, those figures of the objects that are patterned out, I name prints … Thus by prints I understand patterns, and by printing patterning. … [It is] not that the exterior object prints its figure upon the exterior sensitive organs, but that the sensitive motions in the organs pattern out the figure of the object.[32]

For Cavendish, both of the causal participants of a sensory perception are active, which is to say that the sense organ – usually regarded as passive – is active.[33] The body that is perceived is also a cause; it is what Cavendish calls an occasional cause: “I say that some things may be Occasional causes of other things, but not the Prime or Principal causes…” (Cavendish 1664, 79). Commentators have worried that even if we allow Cavendish the view that bodies are active and vital and the source of their own motion, she has no way to account for how it is that bodies communicate so successfully with each other if nothing is transmitted between them. Bodies seem to “suggest” (Detlefsen 2007, 168), or “induc[e]” (O’Neill 2001, xxx), or perhaps they transmit “a sort of signal that triggers the self-motion” of the body that moves (Michaelian 2009, 47), but the question is how they do this. As Detlefsen writes,

Although it is true that there is no transfer of motion between bodies in cases of interaction by occasional causation, there is still some sort of causal interaction [when the first body induces the second body to act]…. How is this possible if nothing is physically transferred? (Detlefsen 2007, 168)

O’Neill points the way to an answer. First, she points out that even though (for Cavendish) a body never transfers its motion to a second body, it still serves as a partial cause of its movement (O’Neill 2001, xxx–xxxi). Cavendish says,

I do not say, that the motion of the hand does not contribute to the motion of the ball; for though the ball has its own natural motion in itself … nevertheless the motion of the ball would not move by such an exterior local motion, did not the motion of the hand, or any other exterior moving body give it occasion to move that way; wherefore the motion of the hand may very well be said to be the cause of that exterior local motion of the ball, but not to be the same motion by which the ball moves. (Cavendish 1664, 447–8)

It is clear how an occasional cause contributes to the motion of a second body in a case where the occasional cause “oppose[s] and over-power[s] another which is inferior to it.” The occasional cause “hinder[s]” the second body and “force[s]” it to move in ways that it otherwise would not. The second body still moves by its own self-motion, for “this hinderance and opposition doth not take away self-motion.” Motion is never transfered from one body to another, and so the motion of a body – and even the motion of a body that is over-powered – is motion that the body has possessed all along. But the occasional cause still redirects the self-motion of the second body; it re-directs the self-motion of the second body, which is to say that it re-directs the motions that the second body already had. Note that Cavendish uses the language of “occasional causes” (for example at Cavendish 1664, 79), but her understanding of occasional causation is not the same as that of 17th-Century contemporaries like Malebranche and Boyle. For Cavendish an occasional cause is something that triggers or occasions motion that is already in (and is inseparable from) the affected body.

Cavendish then makes sense of cases that are more mundane. She considers for example of our sensory perception of distant objects like the sun. As we would expect, she holds that there is an occasional cause that plays an active role with respect to the prompting of motion that is already in the eye, and she holds that the eye plays an active role as well. She writes,

Neither is the influence of the Stars performed beyond a certain distance, that is, such a distance as is beyond sight or their natural power to work; for if their light comes to our Eyes, I know no reason against it, but their effects may come to our bodies. (Cavendish 1664, 301–302)

We perceive a distant body because light travels from that body to our sense organ and does something to the sense organ. The light does not add new motion to the sense organ; that is absurd. Instead, the light re-directs the bodies of the sense organ to form a pattern of the distant body. In the very next sentence Cavendish offers the same account of the causal process by which a creature acquires a disease: she says that “as for infectious Diseases, they come by corporeal imitation, as by touch, either of the infected air, drawn in by breath, or entring through the Pores of the Body, or of some things brought from infected places…” (ibid.). For Cavendish, occasional causation occurs by contact when a body re-directs the self-motion of a second body. Bodies interact with other bodies by contact, when they hinder each other and they re-direct (but never transfer) motion. In the case of perception, the self-motions of the sense organ pattern an image of the distant body upon the arrival of light (or some other medium). As we would expect, Cavendish does not hold that light travels all the way from the distant body; instead, that light is patterned by air or light that is in the plenum of matter that lies in-between object and perceiver, and in the end the sense organ patterns that air or light. She says that “as for air, it patterns out the light of the Sun, and the sensitive motions in the eyes of animals pattern out the light in the air” (Cavendish 1664, 83). She owns as a consequence that in the plenum that is the material universe there is a lot of patterning that takes place that we do not notice; there are objects that we and other creatures pattern but that are below the threshold of awareness (Cavendish 1668a, 211). The same bit of light does not travel all the way from object to perceiver; nor does light pass through walls. Instead, patterning abounds, along the lines of Newton’s Cradle.

6. God

We have seen that Cavendish holds that natural reason cannot perceive or have an idea of an immaterial being. She says in particular that “as for Immaterial, no mind can conceive that” (Cavendish 1664, 69) and that “when we name God, we name an Unexpressible, and Incomprehensible Being” (Cavendish 1664, 315). One way to reconcile her view that we cannot have ideas of immaterials with her numerous attempts to speak of God is to say that she is attempting to speak in the language of her opponents. A problem, however, is that there are passages in which she appears to be doing a lot more. For example, she writes that,

I Sent you word in my last, I would not meddle with writing any thing of the Divine Soul of Man, by reason it belongs to Faith and Religion, and not to Natural Philosophy; but since you desire my opinion concerning the Immortality of the Divine Soul, I cannot but answer you plainly, that first I did wonder much you made me question of that, whose truth, in my opinion, is so clear, as hardly any rational man will make a doubt of it; for I think there is almost no Christian in the world, but believes the Immortality of the Soul, no not Christians onely, but Mahometans and Jews: But I left to wonder at you, when I saw Wise and Learned Men, and great Divines, take so much pains as to write whole Volumes, and bring so many arguments to prove the Immortality of the Soul, for this was a greater Miracle to me, then if Nature had shewed me some of her secret and hidden effects, or if I had seen an Immaterial Spirit. Certainly, Madam, it seems as strange to me to prove the Immortality of the Soul, as to convert Atheists; for it is impossible, almost, that any Atheist should be found in the World: For what Man would be so senceless as to deny a God? Wherefore to prove either a God, or the Immortality of the Soul, is to make a man doubt of either: for as Physicians and Surgeons apply strengthening Medicines onely to those parts of the body which they suppose the weakest, so it is with proofs and arguments, those being for the most part used in such subjects, the truth of which is most questionable. (Cavendish 1664, 220)

Here Cavendish is stating quite straightforwardly that we can have faith in the existence of immaterials, and in particular in the existence of God, but that immaterials are not within the province of natural reason. If so, Cavendish is reflecting the view that our best and only interface with God is via faith; she is reflecting her commitment to fideism.

A problem, of course, is that it would seem that a person would need to have an idea of God in order to have faith that God exists. Cavendish is clear that we can have an idea of the effects of God’s omnipotence, but she does not think that natural reason can have an idea of an immaterial itself. We can have an idea that there is a cause of these effects, but not an idea of what the cause is, or what it is that makes that idea and idea of God as opposed to something else. Cavendish might posit that we have supernatural and immaterial souls and that these can have an idea of God, but the question again is how she would be entitled to make suppositions about immaterial souls. One of her aims in circumscribing the limits of natural philosophy is presumably to make room for faith, but there is a worry that she has gone too far in holding that we cannot have ideas of immaterials. As Descartes remarks,

…[I]f someone says of himself that he does not have any idea of God,… he is making the most impious confession he could make. He is saying that he does not know God by natural reason, but also that neither faith nor any other means could give him any knowledge of God. For if one has no idea, i.e. no perception which corresponds to the meaning of the word ‘God’, it is no use saying that one believes that God exists. One might as well say that one believes that nothing exists, thus remaining in the abyss of impiety and the depths of ignorance. (Descartes 1641, 273)

God is not to be conceived or understood, according to Cavendish, but “is rather to be admired, adored and worshipped.” We do not have any idea of Him, however, and so it is difficult to make sense of how our intentional states could ever point specifically in His direction.

Cavendish appears to be committed to the view that the only things of which we can think or speak are material things that we can detect. In some passages, she refers to God and His infinitude in order highlight that God is beyond us and to highlight the limits of human understanding. In such passages, Cavendish might be speaking of God in ways that are in tension with her view that we do not have ideas of immaterials. An alternate explanation is that she might instead be attempting to rein in the ambitions of natural reason. She writes,

Shall or can we bind up Gods actions with our weak opinions and foolish arguments? Truly, if God could not act more then [sic] Man is able to conceive, he were not a God of an infinite Power; but God is Omnipotent, and his actions are infinite, supernatural, and past finding out; wherefore he is rather to be admired, adored and worshipped, then to be ungloriously discoursed of by vain and ambitious men, whose foolish pride and presumption drowns their Natural Judgment and Reason…. (Cavendish 1664, 527)

Cavendish is clear in this passage that if a finite mind is able to subsume a being under its necessarily limited ideas and categories, then whatever that being is, it is not God. Our attempts to investigate the ways and nature of God are hopeless, and accordingly, we should restrict our faculties to a subject matter to which they are appropriately fitted.[34] Even then, we should still be appropriately humble and fallibilistic. Cavendish’s criticism of the scientist William Harvey is a case in point:

he doth speak so presumptuously of Gods Actions, Designs, Decrees, Laws, Attributes, Power, and secret Counsels, and describes the manner, how God created all things, and the mixture of the Elements to an hair, as if he had been Gods Counsellor and Assistant in the work of Creation; which whether it be not more impiety, then to say Matter is Infinite, I’le let others judg [sic]. Neither do I think this expression to be against the holy Scripture; for though I speak as a natural Philosopher, and am unwilling to cite the Scripture, which onely treats of things belonging to Faith, and not to Reason; yet I think there is not any passage which plainly denies Matter to be infinite, and Eternal, unless it be drawn by force to that sense…. [A]lso the Scripture says, That Gods ways are unsearchable, and past finding out. (Cavendish 1664, 462)

Here Cavendish is also referencing her view that matter is eternal, which she thinks is an obvious consequence of the datum that it is “impossible, to wit, that something should be made or produced out of nothing” (Cavendish 1664, 53). Not wanting to ground her metaphysics in ideas of God that we do not have, she does not want to venture that God created matter out of nothing, and the only remaining option if something cannot come from nothing is to suppose that it is eternal. She wants to emphasize however that it is not heretical to say that the matter out of which the earth and heavens are created has no beginning of existence itself, and so in the passage immediately above she highlights that there are no passages in scripture that deny that. Cavendish is not the most humble philosopher, but she is careful to exercise restraint when it comes to matters that our beyond our ken. She is assuming that there is a difference between the domains that our minds are capable of investigating and the domains that piety suggests are not accessible to us. Infallibilism with respect to either domain is inappropriate, but it is especially so with respect to the second.[35]

In some passages Cavendish speaks of God to say that He is inconceivable and inexpressible. In other passages she speaks of God to say that our knowledge of His existence has to be via faith and not natural reason. In other passages she speaks of God to highlight the ways in which a finite mind should not expect to understand matters that are beyond it. In other passages she speaks of God to offer positive evidence for her view that everything in nature is material. For example, she says that it follows from the premise that God is good and just that He would make sure that all of His creatures would be able to worship Him, and so would make sure that all of His creatures had knowledge and perception (Cavendish 1664, 518–9). She also speaks of God’s creation of everything, including the intellectual and perceptual capacities of matter, as a way of making sense of the teleology that we find (and that given the features of the creator we would expect to find) in nature.[36] If God creates everything, however, and matter is eternal, and then God and matter would appear to be co-eternal.

For all of its apparent problems, one of the reasons that it is important to remark upon Cavendish’s view on our inability to conceive of God is to highlight that even though she thinks that the organized behavior of bodies is due to intelligence, she does not subscribe to any version of a theory of intelligent design. There is a difference between the thesis that the orderly behavior of bodies is due to the intelligence and perceptual capacities of the bodies themselves and the thesis that it is due to the intelligence of a designer. Cavendish might add that either thesis has to posit the existence of intelligent and perceptive matter. If God had created matter that was not equipped with the resources to detect the matter around it and act in ways that are coordinated, chaos would ensue almost immediately. Cavendish is forced to admit that if matter is intelligent and perceptive, there is no further explanation as to why it is intelligent and perceptive, or at least not one that can be known by natural reason. Intelligence and perceptive matter just is. It is something that has always existed (Cavendish 1664, 14, 462) and it has the resources within itself to bring about all the things that we observe it to bring about on a daily basis. She would side with Hume on the question of whether or not it is more likely that the only beings that exist with such resources are immaterial:

…when it is asked, what cause produces order in the ideas of the supreme Being, can any other reason be assigned by you, anthropomorphites, than that it is a rational faculty, and that such is the nature of the Deity? But why a similar answer will not be equally satisfactory in accounting for the order of the world, without having recourse to any such intelligent Creator as you insist on, may be difficult to determine. It is only to say, that such is the nature of material objects, and that they are all originally possessed of a faculty of order and proportion. (Hume 1779, dialogue 4, p. 65)

For Cavendish, matter has a tremendous number of resources built into it. If it is eternal, then we can offer no account of its origin, but in this respect the competing thesis that God is the source of the order in the universe is on a par. The latter thesis has additional problems, however: if God is wholly immaterial, then it is not clear how He could produce matter, or how He would be able to interact with it once it was made (Cavendish 1668a, 199–200; Cavendish 1668b, 241; Detlefsen 2009, 430); and if God’s supremacy is inversely proportional to our finite ability to conceive of Him, it is difficult to see how our confidence about His nature and operations could be anything more than arrogance. Cavendish thinks that the view that matter has always existed and is the source of its own order is not only a contender, but is really the only option.

7. Social and Political Philosophy

An issue of interpretation that arises in the attempt to reconstruct Cavendish’s social and political philosophy is that for the most part the texts in which she addresses social and political questions are not formal philosophical treatises but works of fiction. What is regarded as her central work on political philosophy, Description of a New World, Called the Blazing World, is a novel, and in another central text, Orations of Divers Sorts, Cavendish presents a multiplicity of opposing perspectives on social and political topics: gender roles, virtue, war, and the proper form of government, among others. Cavendish is indeed the author of Blazing World, and she also makes an appearance as a character, but it is difficult to be certain that all of the conclusions and insights of the narrator are ones that Cavendish would identify as her own. The interpretive problem is even worse in the case of Orations, as there are as many as three or four speeches that are offered on any given subject, and the speeches are in some cases contradictory. Still, there are a few texts in which Cavendish puts forward claims about social and political matters and in which she is clearly speaking in her own voice — in particular, World’s Olio. We can use these claims to determine which of the perspectives she is endorsing in her more fictional work and to get a concrete sense of how she might follow up on these (Boyle 2006, 253–254).

Cavendish disagrees with Hobbes on a number of questions of natural philosophy. For Hobbes, thoughts and sensations are motions in the brain (Hobbes 1651, 27–28). For Cavendish thinking and intelligence are basic features of bodies – they are basic features that are ubiquitous in nature and that admit of no further explanation. Nor would Hobbes agree with Cavendish that when bodies interact their rational elements communicate with each other and co-ordinate their behavior. But on questions of social and political philosophy Cavendish and Hobbes to a significant degree align. Like Hobbes, Cavendish holds that human beings are primarily motivated by self-interest:

Self-love is the ground from which springs all Indeavours and Industry, Noble Qualities, Honourable Actions, Friendships, Charity, and Piety, and is the cause of all Passions, Affections, Vices and Virtues; for we do nothing, or think not of any thing, but hath a reference to our selves in one kind or other. (Cavendish 1655, 145)

She adds that self-love is “the strongest Motion of the Mind” (Ibid.). Also like Hobbes, Cavendish thinks that life outside of civil society is so dangerous and chaotic that it does not allow us to pursue our self-interest in a stable and consistent way. Outside of civil society, we cannot secure food or shelter without threat that they will be taken; we do not have, and we cannot create and sustain, the infrastructure that enables commerce; we cannot make plans; and the bulk of our energy is expended on security and safety in the moment. Orations offers multiple perspectives on social and political issues, but the emphasis on social stability is a constant (Boyle 2006, 258 and 282–286):

If [there is] no safety [there is] no propriety, either of goods, wives, children nor lives, and if there be no propriety there will be no husbandry and the lands will lie unmanured; also there will be neither trade nor traffic, all which will cause famine, war, and ruin, and such a confusion as the kingdom will be like a chaos. (Cavendish 1662a, 70)

As for Hobbes, for Cavendish the stability of civil society is not an end in itself; it is instead a necessary condition for us to pursue our self-interested projects and goals. If we remained in a state of nature, we would be in perpetual fear. We would not be likely to live very long, and we would not live well. We would not be healthy. We would not be able develop our latent skills and abilities, and we would not be able to engage in the activities of which those skills and abilities are an expression.

Cavendish also agrees with Hobbes that civil society is most stable and secure when it is ruled by a single individual who has absolute power and sovereignty (Lewis 2001, 345; Boyle 2006, 282). She writes,

This Commonwealth to be governed by one Head or Governour, as a King, for one Head is sufficient for one Body: for several Heads breed several Opinions, and several Opinions breed Disputations, and Disputations Factions, and Factions breed Wars, and Wars bring ruin and Desolation; for it is more safe to be governed, though by a Foolish Head, than a Factious Heart. (Cavendish 1655, 205–206)

If a sovereign is to have absolute power, there is some risk of course that they might use that power unwisely and in a way that does not optimally promote peace and stability. Cavendish is more worried however about all of the alternatives. For example, democracy is not a sustainable option:

the common people is not only Insolent, when they have Power, Commanding Imperiously, Condemning Unjustly, Advancing Unworthily, but they are so Inconstant, as there is no Assurance in them, and so Foolish, as they Know not what to Choose. (Cavendish 1662a, 278)

If the security and order of civil society is left in the hands of the majority, or in the hands of a person who is selected by the majority, there is too high a risk that society will return to chaos. Cavendish also holds that power should not be in the hands of a smaller but very talented and intelligent and sophisticated minority: she appears to think that the likelihood is high that such a body will become divided and govern ineffectively, perhaps because “It is the nature of most of Mankind … to be Ungratefull, Malicious, Revengefull, and Inhumane” (Cavendish 1662a, 259). The members of such a body might be in perpetual conflict as a result of honest disagreement or as a result of their ambition to have more power for themselves. Cavendish concludes that the best prospect for security and stability — though to be sure this is not a guarantee — is to have all power in the hands of a single individual.[37]

Cavendish does not get into a lot of detail about how the sovereign should best bring about peace and security, but she does offer a number of suggestions. In Blazing World, she depicts a scene in which the Empress returns to her home world (from the Blazing World) and saves her people from an enemy attack. The Empress is depicted as possessing super-human abilities, as having the all-encompassing breadth and reach and power of a god:

Which sight, when her countrymen perceived at a distance, their hearts began to tremble; but coming something nearer, she left her torches, and appeared only in her garments of light, like an angel, or some deity, and all kneeled down before her, and worshipped her with all submission and reverence: but the Empress would not come nearer than at such a distance where her voice might be generally heard, by reason she would not have that of her accoutrements anything else should be perceived, but the splendour thereof. … But, good Lord! what several opinions and judgments did this produce in the minds of her country-men; some said she was an angel; others, she was a sorceress; some believed her a goddess; others said the devil deluded them in the shape of a fine lady. (96)

While still on Blazing World, the Empress had received intelligence that her people were under attack and that their kingdom was likely to be destroyed (90). The clear suggestion is that peace and security are best secured and maintained if a country is governed by a sovereign who is and is believed to be capable of the extraordinary. The sovereign should not be selected by democracy, and ideally the sovereign will be one of the few who is naturally born with the talents that are requisite to do the job:

Let me Advise you to Choose one that is Born a King, and Bred a King, who will Rule and Govern Magnificently, Majestically, Heroically, as a King ought to Do. (Cavendish 1662b, 283)

It is difficult to resist the thought that Cavendish is writing in part with an eye to Hobbes and the problem of the fool (Hobbes 1651, 90). To the subject who thinks that it is rational to break the covenants of civil society, and who thinks that he can get away with it, Cavendish is suggesting that a capable sovereign would make sure that subjects have reason to believe that the eyes and ears of the sovereign are ubiquitous and that situations in which a subject concludes that he is under the radar are likely to be situations that the sovereign has had skillfully and majestically staged. Perhaps Cavendish is also suggesting that there is no good Hobbesian response to the problem of the fool in that she is fleshing out what a sovereign would have to be to make the behavior of the “fool” count as irrational, and how a sovereign cannot realistically be anything close to that.

Cavendish also does not speak in a lot of detail about how a sovereign is established or about the formation of a commonwealth. She appears to assume that a sovereign will emerge from the among the most powerful and talented and that the majority of people will come to see subjugation as in their overall interest. She does however sketch some parameters that she thinks a wise sovereign will keep in mind, and these parameters tend to be in keeping with her occasionalist view that things or persons have power not as a function of what they force onto their objects but as a function of whether or not these objects respond to the person or thing as requested. For example, Cavendish says that a wise sovereign will be fair and consistent in the application and enforcement of laws (Cavendish 1655, 112). The sovereign will also be a model of virtue, and in a way that allows his or her subjects to register that the highest forms of happiness and pleasure do not in fact accompany the life of vice. (Cavendish 1664b, 114) A wise sovereign will also make sure that subjects have access to letters and to education more generally — to poetry that softens our animalistic and reactive side (Cavendish 1655, 64); to plays and other representations that not only articulate and defend but also exhibit the virtues and joys that come with enacting them; and also philosophy and history (Cavendish 1655, 6). Cavendish writes,

the mind will be Wild and Barbarous, unless it be inclosed with Study, Instructed by Learning, and Governed by Knowledg and Understanding, for then the Inhabitants of the Mind will live Peaceably, Happily, Honestly, and Honourably, by which they will Rule and Govern their associate Appetites with Ease and Regularity. (Cavendish 1664b, 51)

One of the benefits of an education is that our minds become more filled with information that helps us to navigate the world — not only to achieve our local aims but to work toward the more global result of peace and security (Boyle 2006, 285–287). Cavendish does not think that we can achieve these aims blindly and by a brute act of will. We need knowledge and familiarity with the ways of the world, and we cannot come up with these by a brute act of will either. Ecosystems and other collections of bodies are able to sustain themselves in existence, in large part because of the skillful communication that takes place between their members. A commonwealth will have a better chance of surviving for the long haul if its members are prepared to listen to each other and if they are in synchrony with respect to a larger aim and if they have the wherewithal to respond to each other intelligently and without resistance.

Cavendish would also recommend that a sovereign hold constant the extent to which human beings are driven by the pursuit of public recognition and fame. Cavendish herself thinks that our material minds do not live on after we die and that, if we have immaterial souls that continue to exist, we have absolutely no notion of these or how or why we would identify with them. She thinks that deep down the rest of us are suspicious as well:

perceiving … that their after-life cannot be the same as their present life is, they endeavour … that their Society may remain in remembrance amongst the particular and general Societies of the same sort of Creatures, which we name Mankind: and this design causes all the Sensitive and Rational Parts, in one Society, to be industrious, to leave some Mark for a lasting Remembrance, amongst their fellow-Creatures: which general resemblance, Man calls Fame. (Cavendish 1668b, 75–76)

Cavendish is very astute to point out the extent to which human beings are motivated by a desire for public recognition. She saw the evidence in her own day, and we can clearly see it in our own.[38] She can then argue that if generally speaking people are interested in the promotion of peace and stability, one of the ways that an individual will have a good chance at achieving fame is by engaging in activities and projects that help to secure peace and stability. These would include inventions, infrastructure, and the construction of schools and libraries (Boyle 2006, 264). A wise sovereign will make sure that such behavior is encouraged and that it is also acknowledged. Not everybody is noble and exalted and impressive by birth, and not everybody has all of the same talents (Cavendish 1655, 69; Cavendish 1662a, 27, 37–38), but there are still a number of ways that any human being can contribute to peace and stability. Society can be structured so that people can operate in line with their own talents and be acknowledged for what they do well — whether they be scientists, philosophers, laborers, members of the military, writers, or something else — and a wise sovereign would recognize all of these achievements so that a person would not be motivated to secure fame in ways that are more unseemly. We are remembered well if we do our part to promote peace and social stability. And it is only if society lives on, and is stable and orderly and civilized, that there will be people who might remember us.

Another issue that comes up in interpreting Cavendish’s social and political philosophy is whether or not she is a feminist. It is tempting again to look to her view on occasional causation to shed light on her view of the proper roles for females and males. Cavendish herself wanted to be a practicing scientist and philosopher, but whether or not she could be so was a function not only of her decisions but also of the receptivity of the surrounding world. She could decide to be a scientist, but whether or not she would be a scientist is up to a lot of additional factors — whether her results are disseminated and discussed, whether they are published, whether she is taken seriously and seen as authoritative, and whether she is part of a larger scientific community. Alternately, she (or a Cavendish in a nearby possible world) might decide to open a business, or be a constable or barrister, but whether or not she is successful would depend only in part on what she decides to do. To be a businessperson she would need to have a customer base, and to be an attorney she would need to be authoritative and believable in front of those who deliver a verdict. Cavendish was not a prominent scientist in her time; nor was she a prominent philosopher. She attempted to correspond with Hobbes and others, but unlike the bodies that interact in constituting the ecosystems of nature and other organic units, these philosophers were not cooperative.

In her natural philosophy Cavendish argues that the behavior of bodies is due in part to messages that are signaled from the “agent” body and in part to the response of the “passive” body and to whether or not the “passive” body is appropriately hospitable. Some of her texts suggest very strongly that her social and political philosophy is informed by her view of the normal operations of nature. In Blazing World, the Empress is transported from her home planet and is pleased to find that the beings on the Blazing World will interact with her and respect her authority. In real life, the human men on earth would not engage with Cavendish, but the worm-men and bear-men and bird-men and fish-men and ape-men have extensive conversations with the Empress about the cosmos, the nature of matter and mind, chemistry, and mathematics (29–42). At one point the Empress seeks counsel from “the soul of one of the most famous modern writers, as either of Galileo, Gassendus, Descartes, Helmont, Hobbes, H. More, etc.” (67–68). She is informed, however, that “they would scorn to be scribes to a woman” (68). The atmosphere of the Blazing World is quite different from the atmosphere on earth, and whether or not a person is a scientist or philosopher or other authority is only in part dependent on what is happening on her end.

Cavendish presents women as accomplished and successful in other texts as well. In Bell in Campo, Cavendish has a group of women form an army for the sake of showing men that women should be “co-partners” in government, and “help rule the World” (588–589). The women submit to a powerful generalless, and together they defeat the enemy and save the male army at the same time. The events in Bell in Campo are fairly straightforward, but there might remain a question about Cavendish’s own attitude toward those events, and in particular about her attitude toward the achievements of the female army. On the one hand, it is reported in Bell in Campo that men take women to be “a trouble in the Commonwealth” (588). In addition, the members of the female army are rewarded for their achievements — rewarded by the men in power — with the right to control their family finances, and the freedom to wear whatever they choose. On the other hand, Cavendish depicts the female army as being capable of doing what a male army is normally commissioned to do, and as capable of doing even more. Furthermore, she is depicting how males in power would in fact respond (or how the males in her own world have responded) to a circumstance in which a female army sweeps in to save the day. On one reading, Cavendish herself is suggesting that men and women are not equal in terms of the roles that they should perform and that men are in important ways superior. On another reading, Cavendish is reflecting that men are not superior to women but that the achievements of women have always occurred in an atmosphere in which men are heavily advantaged.

Some commentators have suggested that Cavendish leaves open the question of whether or not women are inferior by training and education or if they are inferior by nature (for example Boyle 2006, 278–281). It seems unlikely that Cavendish thinks that women are inferior by nature if she depicts women as capable of the highest levels of achievement in alternative possible worlds. Women are still women in these alternative worlds; what is different is the structure of the surrounding audiences with which men and women have to contend. Cavendish herself was a remarkable person, as was the Empress and the generalless of Bell in Campo. It is true that women are depicted as exceptional only in Cavendish’s fictional work (McGuire 1978, 198; Boyle 2006, 279), and that might indicate that she takes the idea of a skilled and capable woman to be fictional, but as per her view on occasional causation she might just be reflecting in these alternative worlds that what it is for an agent to be successful is in part due to what the agent signals and in part to how its larger environment is responsive. Cavendish might have thought (with Spinoza) that no individual is an island and that what an individual can do and cannot do is to some degree a part of its physical and psychological constitution and to a large degree a part of the lay of the land on which the individual would act.

Cavendish does however encourage a very conservative set of behaviors for women to perform, and again the question arises of whether she is basing her view on some assumptions about the nature of women more generally or if she has an eye to the environment in which women have happened to find themselves. In World’s Olio she emphasizes the importance of the virtue of chastity, and also patience, humility and being fashionable and constant (73). The list is expanded by one of the speakers of Orations:

Modest, Chast, Temperate, Humble, Patient, and Pious; also to be Huswifely, Cleanly, and of few Words, all which will Gain us Praise from Men, and Blessing from Heaven, and Love in this World, and Glory in the Next. (229)

Here Cavendish might be reflecting how women ought to behave in any possible world irrespective of the power and responses of the beings that surround them. If she thinks that the nature of women is such that women should be chaste and humble and quiet, then to the extent that she thinks that other characteristics are higher and more exalted she takes women to be an inferior part of the species. If she is instead reading off of her own world what behaviors are regarded as legitimate for women, then she is just describing the behavior that is adaptive to that environment. The generalless of Bell in Campo is not especially modest or temperate or quiet, but her behavior would not “gain us praise” or “love in this world” — the seventeenth-century environment in which Cavendish thinks we find ourselves. But perhaps Cavendish thinks that the generalless is operating counter to her own nature. Alternately, if Cavendish is reading off of her culture how women would be most wise to behave, then she might just be offering conservative advice about how women can best flourish in the short material life that has been allotted to them.

A final interpretive issue that arises for Cavendish is exactly how the sovereign is supposed to have so much power and authority if power and achievement are in large part a function of the responsiveness of the surrounding world. A sufficiently powerful sovereign would have to have full control of the military and other underlings, and these in turn would need to be able to control the larger populace (James 2003, xxv–xxvi). The sovereign would have to have enough power to force all of these people to act in accord with his or her will, but in the light of her view on occasional causation Cavendish is committed to the view that all that a sovereign would be able to do is send a signal or message to these beings in the hope that they would obey. The sovereign might try to take steps to increase the odds that underlings will abide by his message, but that would be a matter of sending another message still. A sovereign cannot simply decree that certain things happen: whether or not they happen is a function of the responsiveness of the members of the commonwealth. For Cavendish, an ecosystem holds together, but not because a single member imposes its will on the others. Instead, the members work together as a group, and if human beings are a part of nature, they would function under the same constraints. If Cavendish is right, a sovereign has to be extremely powerful to secure peace and stability, but what it is for a sovereign to have power is to be wise enough to figure out which are the messages that his subjects would accommodate (also Walters 2014, 180–182)

8. Free Will and the Orderly Behavior of Bodies

Like many of her seventeenth-century contemporaries, Cavendish subscribes to the view that the universe is a plenum of contiguous bodies and that there is no empty space. We might wonder how individual bodies would have any freedom or wiggle room to behave as they please if they are so surrounded and tightly packed in. As we have seen, Cavendish holds that bodies sometimes dominate and over-power the bodies that surround them, but she thereby suggests that bodies are sometimes not dominated. She writes for example that

Nature is full of variety of motions or actions, so are her parts, or else she could not be said to be self-moving, if she were bound to certain actions, and had not liberty to move as she pleases. (Cavendish 1668a, 158)
Nature having a free power to move, may move as she will. (Cavendish 1664. 214).
the spirits work more easie, at least more freely, when they are not taskt, than when they are like Apprentices or Journey-men; and will be many times more active when they take or have liberty to play, or to follow their own Appetites, than when they work (as I said) by constraint… (Cavendish 1671, 590)

Here we have Cavendish indicating that (in at least some circumstanes) the various parts of nature are able to move as they please or as they will. But we do not yet know what it means for her to say that a body moves as it will. Perhaps Cavendish subscribes to a libertarian view of freedom according to which a creature is free when it possesses a two-way contra-causal ability to do otherwise. On such a view, an agent will always act in a certain way at a given moment, but at the time of action it is always possible for the agent to do otherwise. Or perhaps Cavendish subscribes to a compatibilist view of freedom according to which creatures do not possess a two-way ability to do otherwise, but their action is free in the sense that is due to their will alone, and is not encumbered by other causes.

Bodies are generally speaking free, Cavendish supposes, but it is not yet clear if she holds that the freedom of bodies is of a libertarian or a compatibilist variety. She does not use that contemporary terminology herself, of course, and so the question is whether or not she cashes out freedom in terms of a contra-causal power by which bodies possess the ability to do otherwise than they do – again, even if she does not use that language – or if she takes freedom to be a matter of the wherewithal that a body has to act by the motions that are internal to it and to keep those motions from being squelched or redirected by an obstacle or hindrance. She nowhere speaks in these exact terms either, but she does make some comments that are very revealing.

For example, she defines voluntary motion as self-motion, and she describes the freest bodies at those that are able to make their way through the plenum with agility and without constraint. She writes,

by voluntary actions I understand self-actions; that is, such actions whose principle of motion is within themselves, and doth not proceed from an exterior Agent…. (Cavendish 1668a, “To the Reader”)
had not the Sensitive Parts incumbrances, they would be, in a degree, as agil, and as free as the Rational. (Cavendish 1668b, 20)
all the motions are so ordered by Natures wisdom, as not any thing in Nature can be otherwise, unless by a Supernatural Command and Power of God. (Cavendish 1664, 144)

We might want to be more skeptical of this last passage, because Cavendish is making a claim that makes reference to the nature and activity of a being of which she thinks we have no idea, but the claim is still suggestive. Bracketing a miracle, nothing can happen in nature in any other way than it happens in fact, she is saying, but she also supposes that bodies are still generally speaking free. They are free, she indicates in the other two passages, when their activity and behavior is not obstructed or constrained.

There are numerous passages throughout her corpus in which Cavendish describes bodies as free, but there are just a few in which she fleshes out what it is to which freedom and voluntariness amount. In these, her view is squarely compatibilist. There are also passages in which address the issue of free will from a theological perspective – where she considers whether or not an omniscient God would have preordained all things from eternity or whether God would have left the behavior of creatures more open (for example in Cavendish 1668a, 295–296, “Further Observations Upon Experimental Philosophy”) – but in these she is careful to suspend judgment. Other passages suggest a compatibilist reading of the free behavior of creatures as well:

But man, and for all that I know, all other things, are governed by outward Objects, they rule, and we obey; for we do not rule and they Obey, but every thing is led like dogs in a string, by a stronger power, but the outward power being invisible, makes us think, we set the rules, and not the outward Causes, so that we are governed by that which is without us, not that which is within us; for man hath no power over himself. (Cavendish 1663, 29)
As for Chance, it is the visible Effects of some hidden Cause; and Fortune, a sufficient Cause to produce such Effects: for, the conjunction of sufficient Causes, doth produce such or such Effects; which Effects could not be produced, if any of those Causes were wanting. (Cavendish 1668b, 16)

In a plenum of contiguous bodies, a body will sometimes redirect the motions of a second body in way that that body resists, and in such cases the behavior of the second body is not free. In other cases the behavior of the second body is amenable to the redirection of motion, and in these cases the motions of the second body are “occasioned” and “forced” (Cavendish 1664, 443), yet the body is still moving as it pleases.[39] In yet other cases still, a body moves by way of motions that (of course) are internal to it, but without any outside interference or obstruction. But in such a case a body has the motions that it has in fact, and not any others. Nor will a body ever be the spontaneous source of any new motion; nor does it (ever) acquire any new motion from other bodies. It has the motions that it has, and it acts accordingly. In a plenum of bodies that are always surrounded by further bodies, no individual body will ever be entirely independent, but Cavendish is surely correct that some bodies are able to surround themselves with a buffer that weakens or neutralizes the impact of bodies further out.

One potential objection to a compatibilist reading of Cavendish on freedom is that there are numerous passages in her corpus in which she says that bodies behave in a manner that is irregular (Boyle 2017). If bodies exhibit irregularity and disorder, they would appear to be in possession of a faculty of spontaneity, and Cavendish would appear to hold that in at least some instances they exercise freedom of the libertarian variety.

Here are some of the passages in which Cavendish speaks of irregularities that occur in nature:

… [S]ome diseases have such sudden alterations, by the sudden changes of motions, that a wise Physician will not, nor cannot venture to apply so many several medicines so suddenly as the alteration requires; and shall therefore Physicians be condemned? And not onely condemned for what cannot be helped by reason of the variety of irregular motions, but what cannot be helped in Nature? (Cavendish 1664, 376)
… Nature poysing her Actions by Opposites, there must needs be Irregularities, as well as Regularities; which is the cause that seldom any Creature is so exact, but there is some Exception. (Cavendish 1668b, 84)
GOD, Eternally Perfect: Nature, Eternally Imperfect. GOD, Eternally Inalterable: Nature Eternally Alterable. GOD, without Error: Nature, full of Irregularities. GOD knows exactly, or perfectly, Nature: Nature doth not perfectly know. (Cavendish 1668b, 241)

Cavendish certainly speaks of irregularities and disorder, but there are also passages in which she steps back and says that what she has in mind when she speaks of an irregularity is just an entity or event that appears irregular to us against the background of our expectations and conceptions.[40] She says for example that

there cannot be confusion amongst those parts of Nature, but there must be a constant union and harmony betwixt them; for cross and opposite actions make no confusion, but onely a variety; and such actions which are different, cross and opposite, not moving always after their usual and accustomed way, I name Irregular, for want of a better expression; but properly there is no such thing as Irregularity in Nature…. (Cavendish 1664, 538–539)
… Nevertheless, all these motions, whether regular or irregular, are natural; for regularity and irregularity hath but a respect to particulars, and to our conceptions, because those motions which move not after the ordinary, common or usual way or manner, we call Irregular. (Cavendish 1664, 359–360)

There are a couple of different ways to read the passages in which Cavendish speaks of irregularities in nature. One is to count them up and argue that because they outnumber the competing passages – and they do – Cavendish holds that irregularities are real. Another is to argue that she holds that there exist no irregularities at all. On this approach, we would emphasize the passages in which she says that we identify something as an irregularity when it runs counter to our expectations. Any such passage would be treated as a kind of meta-text that is instructing us how to read the passages in which irregularities are introduced. In that case, Cavendish could speak of irregularities in a million passages or even more, but if she also tells us that all that she means by the term “irregularity” is something that runs counter to our expectations, then there is no need to count up the passages pro and con. They are all consistent with the view that nature exhibits an exceptionless order.

Perhaps another reason for thinking that creatures have libertarian freedom is that there is normativity in nature – that there are things that are good and things that are bad, and things that creatures ought (or ought not) to do – but if there is normativity in nature, then there must be a robust (and libertarian sense) in which it is possible for creatures to abide by that normativity. But it is difficult to locate normativity in Cavendish’s system. She holds that the elemental bodies of nature have features like size, figure, motion, thought, and perception, but there is not a single passage in her corpus in which she includes normative features like goodness and badness. Instead she says things like that “Nature knows of notthing else but of corporeal figurative Motions” (Cavendish 1664, 333). In a piece entitled “No Judge in Nature,” she writes that “No Intreaty, nor Petition can perswade Nature, nor any Bribes can corrupt, or alter the course of Nature. Justly there can be no complaints made against Nature, nor to Nature.” (Cavendish 1653b, 5). There is certainly room for Cavendish to develop what we now call a naturalist meta-ethics, according to which normative claims just reduce to factors like the attitudes and preferences of subjects. She supposes that different humans have different preferences and desires, and that non-human creatures have preferences and desires also, and she could easily make sense of how different moral codes arise in different communities and subcommunities. But none of that is to suggest that she allows that there is such a thing as good or bad simpliciter or that she supposes that because there are things we ought to do, there are things that we have the libertarian freedom to do (or not do).[41]

9. Fancies

Cavendish holds that what it is for a being to be free is for it to have the wherewithal to do as it pleases without obstacle or interference. She holds that many beings are in fact unfree, because they have goals and aims that the surrounding world of objects works to thwart and prohibit. Cavendish’s own goals of being a philosopher and scientist and political leader are a case in point. In many of her texts she proposes that an appropriate response to the obstacles and constraints of the real-world plenum is to develop and employ our faculty of imagination to model alternative worlds that are more amenable to our values, interests, and needs. She suggests a number of reasons why the construction of imaginary worlds might be of benefit: (1) they allow us to experience a version of the life that we are blocked from pursuing in the actual world; (2) they are enjoyable to inhabit; (3) they allow us to hold onto the self with which we identify when the actual world does not leave room for us to express it; (4) they allow us to register for the record and for posterity why that self was not a viable option.

Cavendish writes in “To all Noble and Worthy Ladies,” a preface to Blazing World, that if the real life blocks her from embodying a life with which she identifies, she will construct an analogue of that life in her imagination. She writes,

I am not Covetous, but as Ambitious as ever any of my Sex was, is, or can be; which is the cause, That though I cannot be Henry the Fifth, or Charles the Second; yet, I will endeavour to be, Margaret the First: and, though I have neither Power, Time, nor Occasion, to be a great Conqueror, like Alexander, or Cesar; yet, rather than not be Mistress of a World, since Fortune and the Fates would give me none, I have made One of my own. (Cavendish 1666, 6)

Cavendish supposes that imaginary worlds are enjoyable to inhabit. Here she is reflecting a view that is uncontroversial, at least if we take seriously the level of pleasure that individuals seem to secure from getting lost in a book or play or other fictional realm. A person will sometimes encounter a significant amount of frustration in their day-to-day life, for example in their job or their personal relationships, and that person might be quite impatient to return to a story in which they have been immersed. Cavendish herself suggests that a vividly imagined world can be a source of greater satisfaction than the world that is in front of us:

Fancy is the Ground whereon the Poetical aery Castles are built. There is no such sweet and pleasing Compagnion as Fancy, in a Poetical Head. (Cavendish 1655, 100–101)

Cavendish also has some of the characters in her fiction express a similar view. In The Lady Contemplation, the main character proposes that

the greatest pleasures that can be in Fruition, I take in Imagination: for whatsoever the sence enjoys from outward objects, they may enjoy in inward thoughts. For the mind takes as much pleasure in creating of Fancies, as Nature to create and dissolve, and create Creatures anew: For Fancy is the Minds creature, & imaginations are as several worlds, wherein those Creatures are bred and born, live and dye; thus the mind is like infinite Nature. (Playes, 184)

We might concede that Cavendish is right that a fictional world can often be a welcome alternative to our actual everyday affairs (also Walters 2014, 167–168), but we might worry that she is overstating the case if she supposes that we can be just as fulfilled imagining a life with which we identify as we can by living it in fact. There is a difference between inhabiting a world of fictional characters – for example in an engrossing book or play – and inhabiting a world that represents our own longing for a life that has been denied to us. To inhabit the latter sort of world might just bring despair. Cavendish does not appear to think so, however, but she might also be supposing that there is pleasure in capturing for the record why a particular world has been cut off from us, rather than just allowing ourselves to dissolve into one of the lives that has been made available. She might also be supposing that we can achieve an afterlife of fame if we write about alternative worlds and what they have going for them, in a way that helps them to come to be. If there is an alternative world that is much more desirable than the one in which we find ourselves, a written record of it might have both a personal and a social impact.

Cavendish indeed speaks in a wide spectrum of texts of the ways in which the seventeenth-century world that surrounds her is not as accommodating to the pursuits and goals of women as it is to the pursuits and goals of men. In some of these texts she says that the climate for women has been so hostile that it is in fact true that women do not have the same capacities as men: women are either denied the relevant training and expertise, or they are not taken seriously and their capacities are not allowed a platform. She writes,

I here present the sum of my works, not that I think wise School-men, and industrious, laborious students should value my book for any worth, but to receive it without a scorn, for the good incouragement of our sex, lest in time we should grow irrational as idiots, … through the carelesse neglects, and despisements of the masculine sex to the effeminate, thinking it impossible we should have either learning or understanding, wit or judgement, as if we had not rational souls as well as men, and we out of a custom of dejectednesse think so too, which makes us quit all industry towards profitable knowledge being imployed onely in loose, and pettie imployments, which takes away not onely our abilities towards arts, but higher capacities in speculations, so as we are become like worms that onely live in the dull earth of ignorance, winding our selves sometimes out, by the help of some refreshing rain of good educations which seldom is given us; for we are kept like birds in cages to hop up and down in our houses, not sufferd to fly abroad to see the several changes of fortune, and the various humors, ordained and created by nature; thus wanting the experiences of nature, we must needs want the understanding and knowledge and so consequently prudence, and invention of men: thus by an opinion, which I hope is but an erronious one in men, we are shut out of all power, and Authority by reason we are never imployed either in civil nor marshall affaires, our counsels are despised, and laught at, the best of our actions are troden down with scorn, by the over-weaning conceit men have of themselves and through a dispisement of us. (Cavendish 1663, “Two the Two Universities,” unnumbered)
There will be many Heroick Women in some Ages, in others very Propheticall; in some Ages very pious, and devout: For our Sex is wonderfully addicted to the spirits. But this Age hath produced many effeminate Writers, as well as Preachers, and many effeminate Rulers, as well as Actors. And if it be an Age when the effeminate spirits rule, as most visible they doe in every Kingdome, let us take the advantage, and make the best of our time, for feare their reigne should not last long ; whether it be in the Amazonian Government, or in the Politick Common-wealth, or in flourishing Monarchy, or in Schooles of Divinity, or in Lectures of Philosophy, or in witty Poetry, or any thing that may bring honour to our Sex. (Cavendish 1653, “To all Writing Ladies,” unnumbered)
since all Heroick Actions, Publick Employments, as well Civil as Military, and Eloquent Pleadings, are deni’d my Sex in this Age, I may be excused for writing so much. (Cavendish 1671, C4)

In this last passage Cavendish is suggesting that one outlet for the energies of an individual who is blocked from pursuing their more outwardly directed aspirations is to write. In Blazing World, Bell in Campo, and other texts, Cavendish indeed utilizes that outlet to enact roles that are regularly denied to women in the plenum of seventeenth-century England. The plenum does not allow women to take on any number of roles, and it does not advance them the opportunity to acquire the requisite skill and training and know-how. But even if women did acquire that training, there is an important sense in which they would still lack the capacities for the roles in question. Consider the following scene that Cavendish constructs in the Introduction to her Playes:

1. Gentleman. This Play that I would have you go to, is a new Play.
2. Gentleman. But is there newes in the Play, that is (is there new wit, fancyes, or new Scenes) and not taken out of old storyes, or old Playes newly translated?
1. Gentleman. I know not that, but this Play was writ by a Lady, who on my Conscience hath neither Language, nor Learning, but what is native and naturall.
2. Gentleman. A woman write a Play! Out upon it; out upon it, for it cannot be good, besides you say she is a Lady, which is the likelyer to make the Play worse, a woman and a Lady to write a Play; sigh, sigh.
3. Gentleman. Why may not a Lady write a good Play?
2. Gentleman. No, for a womans wit is too weak and too conceived to write a Play.
1. Gentleman. But if a woman hath wit, or can write a good Play, what will you say then?
2. Gentleman. Why, I will say no body will believe it, for if it be good, they will think she did not write it, or at least say she did not, besides the very being a woman condemnes it, were it never so excellent and care, for men will not allow women to have wit, or we men to have reason, for if we allow them wit, we shall lose our prehemency … .

We might consider alternative cases that are just as easy to envision – a woman who is highly trained as doctor or attorney, but who does not come across as sufficiently authoritative to a patient or jury; an Asian-American who is a seriously talented actor but who cannot get a role in a movie except as a caricature, if that is all that audiences are willing to see; a highly-trained African American carpenter who has trouble getting hired to build a backyard fence or deck if that means leaving him with a key to enter the house during the day; a figure like Mersault in Camus’s The Stranger, who would have easily merited acquittal by self-defense if he had not come across as such an outsider. In all of these cases, there are the motions that take place on the side of the agent, and there are the motions that occur in the outside environment. Cavendish is pointing out that our ability to live a life with which we identify is a function of both kinds of motion and that the second kind of motion is much more amenable to some than to others. The judge and jury in all such cases do not necessarily run through a conscious pattern of exclusionary reasoning to single out the agent in question; there might just be a feeling of discomfort, and often it is easiest to take the path of least resistance.

There are number of explicit reasons that Cavendish suggests as to why the construction of imaginary worlds would be of benefit. There are additional reasons that she might have as well, but to posit these on her behalf is a bit more speculative and requires further research. The reasons include: (5) they allow us to model a picture of a world that might come to be – that is, to model a route by which we might get there, and to shine a light on otherwise invisible obstacles that might be in our way; (6) they habituate other minds and ready them for change that would otherwise feel sudden and abrupt; and (7) written records of the most successful of our imaginings might survive and secure us an afterlife of fame. Cavendish was fairly conservative in her politics, but that does not mean that the she did not single out particular phenomena for criticism, and it does not mean that she had an in-principle aversion to social change.[42] In passages that we have considered, she certainly takes issue with practices that perpetuate gender inequality, and she models science-fictional worlds that expose how that inequality would be dramatically reduced if our own world were very different. She also indicates in some passages that an advantage of modeling alternative scenarios in imagination, as opposed to straightforwardly imposing them on the world, is that certain kinds of violence and unrest can be avoided. In the Epilogue to Blazing World, she writes,

By this Poetical Description, you may perceive, that my ambition is not onely to be Empress, but Authoress of a whole World; and that the Worlds I have made, both the Blazing- and the other Philosophical World, mentioned in the first Part of this Description, are framed and composed of the most pure, that is, the Rational parts of Matter, which are the parts of my Mind; which Creation was more easily and suddenly effected, than the Conquests of the two famous Monarchs of the World, Alexander and Cesar. Neither have I made such disturbances, and caused so many dissolutions of particulars, otherwise named deaths, as they did; for I have destroyed but some few men in a little Boat, which dyed through the extremity of cold, and that by the hand of Justice, which was necessitated to punish their crime of stealing away a young and beauteous Lady. And in the formation of those Worlds, I take more delight and glory, than ever Alexander or Cesar did in conquering this terrestrial world; and though I have made my Blazing-world a Peaceable World, allowing it but one Religion, one Language, and one Government; yet could I make another World, as full of Factions, Divisions and Warrs, as this is of Peace and Tranquility; and the Rational figures of my Mind might express as much courage to fight, as Hector and Achilles had; and be as wise as Nestor, as Eloquent as Ulysses, and as beautiful as Hellen. But I esteeming Peace before Warr, Wit before Policy, Honesty before Beauty; instead of the figures of Alexander, Cesar, Hector, Achilles, Nestor, Ulysses, Hellen, &c. chose rather the figure of Honest Margaret Newcastle, which now I would not change for all this Terrestrial World; and if any should like the World I have made, and be willing to be my Subjects, they may imagine themselves such, and they are such, I mean in their Minds, Fancies or Imaginations; but if they cannot endure to be Subjects, they may create Worlds of their own, and Govern themselves as they please. (Cavendish 1666, 109)

In this passage, Cavendish speaks to the way in which participation in fictional stories does not lead to some of the difficult and problematic consequences that would occur if those stories unfolded in real life. We know that Cavendish witnessed the horrors of civil war in her own time, and she might subscribe to the view that social change needs to be gradual if it is to occur at all and not lead to such consequences – in particular, to the kind of backlash that sets progress back further still. Writing is no doubt a platform that can make more malleable some of the resistance to social change. If a tradition is predominant and entrenched, and a critical mass of individuals benefit from its continued existence, the attempt to overturn it in real life will be countered with at least as much force. Imagination would appear to be more fluid, and over the long haul a vividly entertained scenario might become so familiar as to be innocuous. If we are the author of that scenario, we might even become famous for playing a part in changing the world.

10. Conclusion

Cavendish’s philosophical work was not taken very seriously in the seventeenth century, but it is certainly relevant today. She is presumably right to warn about the inconsistency in insisting that God is utterly transcendent while being utterly confident in putting forward claims about His nature. She has also anticipated a contemporary emphasis on the study of the brain and body in addressing mental health. In addition, she has made a contribution to the current debate about how to understand the relation between the most basic elements of body and the mental activity that is manifested in human beings and other organisms (Strawson 2008; McGinn 1999, 6–18; Chalmers 1996, 3–6; and Nagel 1974, 435–450). She is also important insofar as she anticipates the arguments and views of early modern thinkers who are firmly in the canon and who already secure a great deal of attention. Finally, she offers extremely compelling insights into issues of agency and authority. She argues that one of the reasons why an individual is often unsuccessful in embodying a life with which they identify is that, even if everything is in order on the side of their decisions and talents and skills, there is often social and political corrosion in the interface between their decisions and the world.


Primary Literature

Works by Cavendish

  • 1653, Poems and Fancies, London, printed by T.R. for J. Martin and J. Allestrye.
  • 1653, Philosophicall Fancies, London, printed by Tho. Roycroft for J. Martin and J. Allestrye.
  • 1655, The World’s Olio, London, printed for J. Martin and J. Allestrye.
  • 1662, Cavendish, Margaret, Orations of Divers Sorts, Accommodated to Divers Places, London.
  • 1662, Bell in Campo, in Playes, London: John Martyn, James Allestry, and Tho. Dicas.
  • 1663 [1655], Cavendish, Margaret, Philosophical and Physical Opinions, London: printed for William Wilson (1655). The references in the text are to the second edition (1663). Note that Cavendish produced a third edition of Philosophical and Physical Opinions in 1668, though she also gave the edition a new title – Grounds of Natural Philosophy – as she explains in its preface.
  • 1664, Cavendish, Margaret, Philosophical Letters, London.
  • 1664, Sociable Letters, London: William Wilson.
  • 1666, The Description of a New World, Called the Blazing World, in Margaret Cavendish: Political Writings, ed. Susan James, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press (2003).
  • 1668, Observations upon Experimental Philosophy, ed. Eileen O’Neill, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press (2001).
  • 1668, Grounds of Natural Philosophy, ed. Colette V. Michael, West Cornwall, CT: Locust Hill Press (1996).
  • 1668, “Further Observations Upon Experimental Philosophy,” in Observations Upon Experimental Philosophy, London, printed by A. Maxwell, in the Year 1668.
  • 1668, “Observatios Upon the Opinions of Some Ancient Philosophers,” in Observations Upon Experimental Philosophy, London, printed by A. Maxwell, in the Year 1668.
  • 1671, Natures Picture, London, printed by A. Maxwell, in the year 1671.

Other Primary Works

  • Augustine, On Free Choice of the Will, Thomas Williams (ed. and trans.), Indianapolis and Cambridge: Hackett Publishing Company, 1993.
  • Boyle, Robert (1666), The Origin of Forms and Qualities According to the Corpuscular Philosophy, in M.A. Stewart (ed.), Selected Philosophical Papers of Robert Boyle, Indianapolis and Cambridge: Hackett Publishing Company, 1991.
  • Conway, Anne (1690), The Principles of the Most Ancient and Modern Philosophy, Alison P. Coudert and Taylor Corse (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • Cudworth, Ralph (1678), The True Intellectual System of the Universe, Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: F. Fromann Verlag, 1964.
  • Descartes, René (1641), “Appendix to Fifth Objections and Replies,” in John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, and Dugald Murdoch, The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, Volume II, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1984, 268–277.
  • Descartes, René (1644), Principles of Philosophy, in John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, and Dugald Murdoch, The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, Volume I, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1985.
  • Digby, Kenelm (1644), Two Treatises in the One of Which, the Nature of Bodies; in the Other, the Nature of Mans Soule; is Looked Into: in Way of Discovery, of the Immortality of Reasonable Soules, Paris: printed by Gilles Blaizot.
  • Gassendi, Pierre (1641), Fifth Objections, in John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, and Dugald Murdoch, The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, Volume II, Cambridge, Cambridge University Press, 1984, 179–240.
  • Hobbes, Thomas (1651), Leviathan, ed. Richard Tuck, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • Hume, David (1748), An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, ed. Tom L. Beauchamp, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999.
  • Hume, David (1779), Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, in J.C.A. Gaskin (ed.), David Hume: Dialogues and Natural History of Religion, Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press, 1993.
  • Leibniz, G.W. (1698), “On Nature Itself,” in Leroy E. Loemker (ed. and trans.), Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz: Philosophical Papers and Letters, 2nd Edition, Dordrecht & Boston: D. Reidel Publishing Company, 1969.
  • Leibniz, G.W. (1686), “Letter to Arnauld, July 14, 1686,” in Leroy E. Loemker (ed. and trans.), Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz: Philosophical Papers and Letters, 2nd Edition, Dordrecht & Boston: D. Reidel Publishing Company, 1969.
  • Locke, John (1689), An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, ed. Peter H. Nidditch, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975.
  • Lucretius, On the Nature of Things, Anthony M. Esolen (trans. and ed.), Baltimore: The Johns Hopkins University Press, 1995.
  • Malebranche, Nicolas (1674–5), The Search After Truth, Thomas M. Lennon and Paul J. Oscamp (ed. and trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997.
  • Malebranche, Nicolas (1688), Dialogues on Metaphysics and on Religion, Nicholas Jolley and David Scott (ed. and trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997.
  • More, Henry (1653), Antidote Against Atheism, London: printed by Roger Daniel, 51–2.
  • Plato, Phaedo, in Five Dialogues, G.M.A. Grube (ed. and trans.), Indianapolis and Cambridge: Hackett Publishing Company, 1981.
  • Plotinus, “On Beauty,” in Essential Plotinus: Representative Treatises from the Enneads, Elmer O’Brien (trans. and ed.), Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Company (1975).
  • Spinoza, Baruch (1662), Short Treatise on God, Man, and His Well-Being, in Michael Morgan (ed.) and Samuel Shirley (trans.), Spinoza: The Complete Works, Indianapolis and Cambridge: Hackett Publishing Company, 2002.

Secondary Literature

  • Adams, Marcus P., 2016, “Visual Perception as Patterning: Cavendish Against Hobbes on Sensation,” History of Philosophy Quarterly, 33: 193–214.
  • Battigelli, Anna, 1998, Margaret Cavendish and The Exiles of the Mind, Lexington: The University Press of Kentucky.
  • Borcherding, Julia, 2022, “A Most Subtle Matter: Cavendish’s and Conway’s (Im)Materialism,” in The Routledge Handbook of Idealism and Immaterialism, ed. Joshua Farris and Benedikt Paul Göcke, New York: Routledge.
  • Boyle, Deborah, 2006,“Fame, Virtue, and Government: Margaret Cavendish on Ethics and Politics,” Journal of the History of Ideas, 67: 251–289.
  • –––, 2017, A Well-Ordered Universe: The Philosophy of Margaret Cavendish, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Branscum, Olivia, 2022, Recovering Matter’s “Most Noble Attribute:” Panpsychist-Materialist Monism in Margaret Cavendish, Anne Conway, and 17th-Century English Thought, Ph.D. Dissertation, Columbia University.
  • Broad, Jacqueline, 2002, Women Philosophers of the Seventeenth Century, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2007, “Margaret Cavendish and Joseph Glanvill: science, religion and witchcraft,” Studies in the History and Philosophy of Science, 38: 493–505.
  • Chalmers, David, 1996, The Conscious Mind: In Search of a Fundamental Theory, New York and Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Chamberlain, Colin, 2019, “Color in a Material World: Margaret Cavendish Against the Early Modern Mechanists,” The Philosophical Review, 128: 293–336.
  • Clucas, Stephen, 1994, “The Atomism of the Cavendish Circle: A Reappraisal,” The Seventeenth Century, 9: 247–273.
  • –––, 2003, “Variation, Irregularity and Probabilism: Margaret Cavendish and Natural Philosophy as Rhetoric,” in Stephen Clucas, A Princely Brave Woman: Essays on Margaret Cavendish, Duchess of Newcastle, Hampshire (England) and Burlington, VT: Ashgate Publishing Company, 199–209.
  • Cunning, David, 2003, “Systematic Divergences in Malebranche and Cudworth,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 43: 343–363.
  • –––, 2006, “Cavendish on the Intelligibility of the Prospect of Thinking Matter,” History of Philosophy Quarterly, 23: 117–136.
  • –––, 2016, Cavendish, New York: Routledge.
  • –––, 2017, “Mind-Body Problems,” in Daniel Kaufman (ed.), Routledge Companion to Seventeenth-Century Philosophy, New York: Routledge Publishing.
  • –––, 2021, “The Feminist Worlds of Margaret Cavendish,” in World-Making Renaissance Women, ed. Pamela Hammons and Brandie Siegfried, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 184–198.
  • –––, 2022, “Cavendish, Philosophical Letters, and the Plenum,” in Cavendish: An Interdisciplinary Perspective, ed. Lisa Walters and Brandie Siegfried, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 98–111.
  • –––, forthcoming, “Cavendish and Strawson on Emergence, Mind, and Self,” Oxford Studies in Philosophy of Mind.
  • Detlefsen, Karen, 2006, “Atomism, Monism, and Causation in the Natural Philosophy of Margaret Cavendish,” in Daniel Garber and Steven Nadler (eds.), Oxford Studies in Early Modern Philosophy, 3: 199–240.
  • –––, 2007, “Reason and Freedom: Margaret Cavendish on the Order and Disorder of Nature,” Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie, 89: 157–191.
  • –––, 2009, “Margaret Cavendish on the Relationship Between God and World,” Philosophy Compass, 4: 421–438.
  • Hatfield, Gary, 1979, “Force (God) in Descartes’ Physics,” Studies in History and Philosophy of Science, 10: 113–140.
  • Hutton, Sarah, 1997a, “In Dialogue with Thomas Hobbes: Margaret Cavendish’s natural philosophy,” Women’s Writing, 4: 421–432.
  • –––, 1997b, “Cudworth, Boethius and the Scale of Nature,” in G.A.J. Rogers, J.M. Vienne, and Y.C. Zarka (eds.), The Cambridge Platonists in Philosophical Context, Boston: Kluwer Academic Publishers.
  • James, Susan, 1999, “The Philosophical Innovations of Margaret Cavendish,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 7: 219–244.
  • –––, 2003, “Introduction”, in Margaret Cavendish: Political Writings, ed. Susan James, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Jolley, Nicholas, 1984, Leibniz and Locke: A Study of the New Essays on Human Understanding, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Lascano, Marcy P., 2020, “Margaret Cavendish and Early Modern Scientific Experimentalism: ‘Boys that play with watery bubbles or fling dust into each other’s eyes, or make a hobbyhorse of snow’,” in Sharon Crasnow and Kristen Intemann (ed.), Routledge Handbook of Feminist Philosophy of Science, London and New York: Routledge, 28–40.
  • –––, 2021, “Cavendish and Hobbes on Causation,” in Marcus Adams (ed.), A Companion to Hobbes, Hoboken, NJ: Wiley-Blackwell.
  • –––, forthcoming, The Metaphysics of Margaret Cavendish and Anne Conway: Monism, Vitalism, and Self-Motion, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Lewis, Eric, 2001, “The Legacy of Margaret Cavendish,” Perspective on Science, 9: 341–365.
  • McGinn, Colin, 1999, The Mysterious Flame: Conscious Minds in a Material World, New York: Basic Books.
  • McGuire, Mary Ann, 1978, “Margaret Cavendish, Duchess of Newcastle, on the Nature and Status of Women,” International Journal of Women’s Studies, 1: 193–206.
  • McNulty, Michael, 2018, “Margaret cavendish on the order and infinitude of nature,” History of Philosophy Quarterly, 35: 219–239.
  • Michaelian, Kourken, 2009, “Margaret Cavendish’s Epistemology,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 17: 31–53.
  • O’Neill, Eileen, 1998, “Disappearing Ink: Early Modern Women Philosophers and Their Fate in History,” in Janet A. Kourany (ed.), Philosophy in a Feminist Voice, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • –––, 2001, “Introduction,” in Margaret Cavendish, Observations upon Experimental Philosophy, Eileen O’Neill (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, –xxxxvi.
  • Nagel, Thomas, 1974, “What is it Like to be a Bat?,” The Philosophical Review, 83: 435–450.
  • Peterman, Alison, 2017, “Empress vs. Spider-Man: Margaret Cavendish on pure and applied mathematics,” Synthese, 196: 3527–3549.
  • –––, 2019, “Cavendish on Motion and Mereology,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 57: 471–99.
  • Rée, Jonathan, 2002, “Women Philosophers and the Canon,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 10: 641–652.
  • Sarasohn, Lisa, 2010, The Natural Philosophy of Margaret Cavendish, Baltimore: The Johns Hopkins University Press.
  • Schiebinger, Londa, 1991, “Margaret Cavendish,” in A History of Women Philosophers, Mary Ellen Waithe (ed.), Boston: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1–20.
  • Searle, John, 1986, Minds, Brains and Science, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Shaheen, Jonathan, 2019, “Parts of Nature and Division in Margaret Cavendish’s Materialism,” Synthese, 196: 3551–3575.
  • Strawson, Galen, 2008, “Realistic Monism: Why Physicalism entails Panpsychism,” in Real Materialism and other essays, ed. Galen Strawson, Oxford University Press, 53–74.
  • Walters, Lisa, 2013, “Omitted Edition of Margaret Cavendish’s Philosophical and Physical Opinions (1663),” Notes and Queries, 60(4): 542–545.
  • Walters, Lisa, 2014, Margaret Cavendish: Gender, Science and Politics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Whitaker, Katie, 2002, Mad Madge: The Extraordinary Life of Margaret Cavendish, Duchess of Newcastle, the First Woman to Live by Her Pen, New York: Basic Books.
  • White, Graham, 2009, “Medieval Theories of Causation,” in The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2009 Edition), Edward Zalta (ed.), URL = <>.


I am inordinately grateful to Eileen O’Neill for her extensive comments on an earlier version of this paper.

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David Cunning <>

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