Notes to Mary Shepherd

1. ERCE (pp. 27–8) lists five theses to be proved against Hume four of which are claims about the cognitive faculties.

2. The argument as reconstucted in Atherton’s (1996) is apparently circular. Fantl (2016) says Shepherd’s argument begs the question; Paoletti (2011) says she does not offer to demonstrate CP.

3. ERCE (pp. 36–7) notes that proofs of CP offered by Locke and Clarke are circular; EASP (pp. 121–2) characterizes Shepherd’s doctrines as claims about human cognition by contrast with necessities binding on nature and God.

4. McRobert (2000: xiv) holds that Shepherd derives the contradiction from the supposed psychological fact that the idea of a cause is needed for the mind to determine that a thing begins to exist. On this interpretation, Shepherd means to say that causal necessity is an “objective feature” of objects of sense perception.

5. Fantl (2016: 94–5) holds that Shepherd individuates qualities as causal powers and has a bundle theory of objects.

6. Fantl (2016) considers Shepherd’s resources for proving versions of this claim of varying strength.

7. Thanks to Michael Bennet for raising this question.

8. McRobert (2000: xvii) suggests the circularity is avoided only if we grant that causal necessity is an objective truth about objects of sense perception; the present article maintains that Shepherd makes no such claim. No other interpretation of Shepherd’s response to the circularity threat has been offered to date.

Copyright © 2017 by
Martha Bolton <>

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