Mary Shepherd

First published Sun May 28, 2017; substantive revision Mon Nov 13, 2017

Mary Shepherd (1777–1847) is the author of several works advocating a systematic metaphysics and theory of knowledge which were highly regarded by her contemporaries. Born and raised a short distance from Edinburgh and well versed in the intellectual life of the city, she urges a philosophy adamantly opposed to main tenets of the Scottish school. She finds them unable to sustain scientific inquiry, everyday practical reasoning, and belief in an almighty deity. Her aim is to replace them with a metaphysics consisting of existential beliefs held for good reasons. An analysis of causality is primary in her theory. She contends that the relation between cause and effect is one of efficacy, necessity, and simultaneity. The first of her two books, Essay upon the Relation of Cause and Effect (Shepherd 1824; abbreviated ERCE), is chiefly concerned with deriving and developing this doctrine while pointing to errors in the reasoning of Hume and his followers on this subject. Her second volume (Shepherd 1827a) has two parts. The first is a long treatise Essay on the Academical or Skeptical Philosophy (abbreviated EASP) which uses causal reasoning to explain the origin and justification of existential beliefs with regard to the external world, ourselves, and God. The second consists of shorter essays said to be illustrative of doctrines contained in the first part of this volume and the earlier one published under her name. Her theory of knowledge is neither rationalist nor empiricist; it takes all knowledge to unify passively received sensations with principles drawn from the faculty of reason, so that knowledge of all sorts is at once felt and represented discursively. In this respect, her position is more like that of Kant than like those of her other early modern predecessors. But her metaphysics and theory of the justification of existential beliefs are distinctive of her philosophical system.

Shepherd’s wide social circle included men and women of science, literary figures and others of intellectual accomplishment, and she enjoyed discussing metaphysical topics. This may have helped to garner an audience for her work. Its merits were publicly acknowledged in several ways. There is good evidence that one of her monographs was used as a textbook at Cambridge. Her part of a sharp philosophical dispute was published in a monthly magazine. Her theory of mind and self are the subject of an entry in Robert Blakey’s multi-volume History of the Philosophy of Mind (1850). After her death and before its recent recovery, her philosophy dropped from view for reasons that are not entirely clear (Atherton 2005; Paoletti 2011).

1. Biography

In addition to a short biographical entry in the Oxford Dictionary of National Biography (Perkins 2004), the main source of information about Shepherd’s life is a family memoire written by her daughter and published for private use (Brandreath 1886). Shepherd was born in Barnbougle Castle on the Primrose family estate overlooking the Firth of Forth. She lived mainly there until her marriage in 1808. While her brothers were sent to university, she and her sisters were educated at home by private tutor. Her daughter reports that in addition to teaching them Latin, geography, mathematics, and history, he discussed many works on the foundation of the truth of things. His pupils were encouraged to pursue whatever subjects interested them. Mary is said to have written volumes of metaphysical essays many of them critical of Hume and the Unitarian doctrines of Joseph Priestly (Brandreath 1886: 28–9). In a letter to Charles Babbage, she recalls having had an interest in the reasoning used in proofs of mathematical theorems and exposing errors of reasoning in a wide range of authors (quoted in McRobert 2000: vi). Her published essays were written sometime later.

Shepherd’s dismay at the influence of Hume’s treatment of causality can be traced at least to a controversy in Edinburgh which began in 1802 when she was living nearby. The clergymen of the city opposed the appointment of an eminent mathematician to a chair at the University because of a passing favorable remark on Hume’s account of causality. They thought it encouraged atheism whereas the academic community insisted on the freedom of inquiry. With Hume back in public view, Thomas Brown published a small tract critical of some aspects of his doctrine but denying its supposed atheistic implication (Brown 1805). It was well received and Brown went on to write a full length book urging that causality implies nothing but the temporal succession and regular conjunction of sorts of events; it was first printed in 1818 and reprinted thereafter (Brown 1822). Shepherd mentions the Edinburgh incident and the still growing influence of Brown’s theory in the book she published in 1824. In her view, it is evidence of the public’s susceptibility to the pernicious influence of Hume on notions of causality. Both her books illustrate its ill effects by discussing the conclusions and theories of Thomas Lawrence, a controversial Lecturer in Physiology (Paoletti 2011: 49).

There is some evidence that Shepherd anonymously published a book critical of Brown in 1819, the year after his treatise on causality appeared. This is suggested by a note attached to a volume in the Cambridge University Library which is included in the facsimile reproduction of Shepherd’s philosophical works edited by Jennifer McRobert. This book has two parts: one compares the causal theories of Brown and Hume with observations “calculated to shew the inconsistency of these theories”; its treatment of causality is said to be inspired by recent developments in chemical science. The other, titled “New Theory of the Earth”, proposes to explain the origin of prominent features of the earth on the basis of motions due to gravitational force, various conflagrations and collisions. There may be a connection between the view of causality urged in this volume and the books published under her name. But the factual objections to Hume are tame in comparison with the logical critique and ambitious metaphysical and epistemic system in the later volumes. Although Shepherd’s authorship of the earlier book is probable, it is not entirely certain.

In the early 1820s, Shepherd accompanied her husband to Cambridge while he studied for a master’s degree, awarded in 1823. Although there seems to be no record of the people she conversed with there, it might well be that William Whewell, who held a university fellowship at this time, was among them. She also may have meet Charles Babbage there; he was a friend of the couple later on and both of them corresponded with him. If she met Whewell at this time, it would be notable for several reasons. As the memoire records, it was he who made one of Shepherd’s works a university text book. He was deeply interested in devising a workable and productive method of empirical inquiry, but it was not until 1860 that his theory of scientific induction was accomplished (Snyder 2012).

Even at the time Shepherd and her husband resided in Cambridge, Whewell was the leader of a group of four friends who were undertaking to reform the practice of the sciences. Taking Francis Bacon’s The Great Instauration (1620) as starting point, they vowed to work as philosophers and scientists to regularize the practice of science, expand it, and orient it to the improvement of human lives. Together with others, they had considerable success in this endeavor over the next four decades. Of the four friends, three proposed methods of induction for natural science, each of them opposed to that of the others. Whewell’s methodology, which is the most fully developed, is like Shepherd’s in being neither rationalist nor empiricist, but combining ideas drawn from the mind itself with empirical input. Whether or not Shepherd meet any one in this circle prior to publishing her first book, she shared with them a deep conviction that the current state of philosophy was inadequate to support scientific inquiry. She undertook to put causal reasoning in all areas of human endeavor including empirical research on firm metaphysical and epistemic foundations (also McRobert 2002 under Other Internet Resources).

Her daughter writes that Whewell was a frequent guest of the couple whose main residence was in London. He is listed as one of six friends who were particularly attuned to Shepherd’s passion for abstract metaphysical thinking. She also reports that he and Charles Lyle spoke of her mother as “an unanswerable logician” (Brandreath 1886: 29). Sometime after Mary Shepherd’s death, Whewell is said to have asked whether she had written essays that were unpublished and, if so, advised they be brought to light.

Shepherd’s two longer essays develop a doctrine of cause and effect and the beliefs it underwrites. The shorter essays collected in Shepherd’s second volume range over related specific topics including: Berkeley’s philosophy, the co-incidence of extension and color, the credibility of miracles, nature of final cause, and the reason of single erect vision. In addition to works mentioned above, there are three published works of Shepherd: critical remarks on the metaphysics of John Fearn, a retired naval officer (Shepherd 1832); a very effective reply to Fearn’s counter-critique of her metaphysics; and an article on the single and erect object of vision (Shepherd 1827b). In the present article, we will focus on her two main philosophical works but consider some directly relevant material from the shorter essays.

2. Doctrine of Cause and Effect

2.1 Metaphysics

Shepherd’s doctrines regarding causality are advertised as contrary to those of David Hume. They are often presented in connection with a theory of knowledge opposed to the radical empiricism and nominalism of her primary foil.[1] Where Hume holds that common causal beliefs are due to acquired habits of imagination rather than operations of reason, she urges they are caused by reason. Where Hume holds that abstract ideas are impossible, Shepherd insists that science and philosophical analysis are impossible without them. Like Hume, she often uses “reason” to refer to a cognitive faculty rather than a sort of justification of belief (Garrett 1997; Owen 1999). But for her, the faculty is the source of abstract ideas of cause, effect, and continued existence, among others. Human reason is naturally disposed to deploy these ideas when the youngest of children first begin to perceive by sense (EPEU: 314). Some readers extract the metaphysics from the attendant nativist theory of knowledge. But the texts offer no non-question begging argument for her central metaphysical doctrine. They assume the theory of causality they purport to prove. This appears to be damaging unless her epistemology is taken into account. As she sees it, the common convictions regarding cause and effect are products of a natural predisposition of human reason; this explains why we believe them. Their origin does not justify assent to them, but Shepherd undertakes to show that there is justification for it.

The primary tenet of her metaphysics is the causal principle: it is necessary that a thing that begins to exist has a cause (hereafter “CP”). The argument for this contentious claim begins with a clarification meant to avoid the merely semantic connection of “cause” and “effect”. To grasp the conditions in which something begins to exist, one needs to abstract from familiar things except with regard to the capacity for existence. With this understood, it is a contradiction to suppose that something begins to exist if nothing else exists because

this beginning to exist cannot appear but as a capacity some nature hath to alter the presupposed nonentity, and to act for itself, whilst itself is not in being. (ERCE: 36)

As I understand it: a beginning to exist is an act, or actualization, of a capacity; an act is a property of some object; an object cannot have a property if it does not exist; so nothing can begin to exist without something else that acts. Although this is valid, the first premise assumes what the argument is meant to prove by characterizing a beginning of existence as an act of an object other than it.[2]

All derivations of the contradiction found in the texts have premises formulated in the terminology of the theory of cause and effect Shepherd urges.[3] Most of them refer to things that begin to exist as “qualities” of objects (see the series of definitions, ERCE: 63–4). According to the list of anti-Humean definitions: “Necessary connexion of cause and effect is the obligation qualities have to inhere in their objects” (ERCE: 63). A cause is defined as

such an action of an object, as shall enable it, in conjunction with another, to form a new nature, capable of exhibiting qualities varying from those of either object in separation from the other. This is really to be a producer of new being. (ERCE: 63)

That is, causation is a complex metaphysical configuration comprising: (1) the antecedent existence of two or more objects which taken together ground the capacity for the existence of some quality Q when it does not yet exist and (2) a change in which the objects unite to form a different object which determines the existence of Q because Q necessarily belongs to it.

This model of causality is assumed in some way in every demonstration that it is necessary that a thing that begins to exist have a cause. Most of them presume that the idea of a thing not yet in existence is the idea of the capacity for its existence. This is not the bare logical possibility of something X, but the actual existence of two or more things with the potential to actualize X. Under this conception, it is a contradiction to suppose a thing that begins to exist has no cause, but the key conception is taken for granted. There is no effort to prove the highly contentions notion that a thing that beings to exist must be preceded by the existence of the capacity for its existence. So the conclusion that a cause is necessary would seem to be the natural product of nothing other than the human mind, a tautology framed from ideas all of which originate in the faculty of reason.[4] It is commonly believed to be a necessarily true of the real world but this remains to be justified.

According to Shepherd’s definition, causality is a compositional determination relation. The pre-existing entities which combine to form a cause are variously called “objects”, “natures”, “masses of qualities”, and “unknown circumstances in nature”, among other things. By “objects”, Shepherd means things in natural kinds, e.g., a fire, a log, and bread. In general, an object is a “mass of qualities” which is or may be perceived by sense (ERCE: 64). The object is “nothing distinct from its qualities” (ERCE: 161–2). “[I]n this union, Cause and Effect, are synchronous, and they are but different words for the same Essence” (ERCE: 57).[5] Regarded in this way, a quality belongs to an object as a part belongs to a whole, not that in which a predicate belongs to a subject. But although cause and effect are one essence, there is some difference between them: one is really productive of the other. The cause determines the qualities included in the mass. In effect, the ideas of cause and effect are two ways of representing the same thing which are not entirely without basis in the thing. With regard to the term “nature, it is sometimes used to stand for the unknown causes of the sensory appearances which come to exist when objects are perceived by sense.

The productive aspect of an object is called a “power”, defined as a productive principle, or “property which lies in the secret nature of objects” and determines the qualities which will be perceived if the object unites with various other objects and the natures that constitute a perceiver (ERCE: 64). Fantl (2016: 97) maintains that powers are basic in Shepherd’s metaphysics suggesting that objects are fundamentally constituted by activities, or forces of the sorts envisaged by Leibniz or Priestly.

Once an efficacious combination is formed it may unite with other objects to form compounds productive of newly existing qualities. The causes of most familiar phenomena are formed from a large number of pre-existing objects and other circumstances (e.g., time) all of which are required to produce the observed effect. But the objects from which a cause is formed need not have qualities similar to those of the newly constituted cause. None of the qualities going into the compound may be retained and it may join with others to form many different masses of qualities. Still compound natures such as plants, animals, and the sentient principle (or mind) are not destroyed by entering into a succession of mixtures.

Shepherd does not contend that every change has a cause. The metaphysical structure of a change and that of a cause are entirely different. A change takes place over time and the relation between its earlier and later stages is contingent. Shepherd argues that precisely because Hume supposes that a cause and its effect exist in succession, he precludes their having a necessary or efficacious connection (Bolton 2010: 244). For Shepherd, a change results in a cause if and only if it terminates in a composite efficacious nature that did not exist when the change began. So it might seem that her view cannot account for what Hume purports to explain—the transition involved in a change.

But it can offer a non-causal explanation of change: a change is the consequence of the qualities of several different objects persisting over some period of time. Qualities are simultaneous with their causes but they need not be instantaneous or short-lived. Motion is a quality. Several moving objects which continue to exist for some time may arrive at a mutual configuration that produces qualities which did not previously exist, e.g., several moving globs of paint and a canvas collide. The collision is explained by the paths of the moving objects prior to their union in an artistic composition. Shepherd contrasts the necessary connection of cause and effect with a sort of necessary connection between temporal antecedents and consequents (EASP: 131). The latter is the invariable sequence of successive effects produced by the same object meeting with several different objects in a regular order, e.g., when eating bread, one typically has successive sensations of yielding texture, taste, and fullness in the stomach. It is necessary that if a piece of bread mixes with the sensory organs in the usual order--hands, mouth and tongue, stomach—this series of sensations occurs (EASP: 125–30).

A principle of induction is deduced from CP: it is necessary that similar causes have similar effects (hereafter CPI). Suppose two individually different causes are alike. If their effects were different, they would not have a cause; this is impossible according to CP. Often the same point is put this way: a difference must have a cause. If the qualities of an object are different at one time than another, the difference must have a cause; for the same reason, if individually different objects differ in respect of the presence or absence of any quality, the difference must have a cause.

CP and CPI are used to argue that it is not possible that the course of nature should change as Hume supposes [6] The argument assumes that natural kinds of objects are defined and individuated by all the qualities that belong to the same mass, or same cause. Shepherd rebuts Hume’s contrary claim by refuting his examples. She allows the possibility that stuff that tastes like salt and has sensible qualities otherwise like those of snow might fall from the clouds, but CPI requires that the difference between them has a cause. Each is an efficacious compound different in kind from the other, and only one is properly called “snow” (ERCE: 69). Again, Hume supposes nature might alter the “secret causes” while keeping the sensible qualities the same, but this is impossible according to CPI. In general, no matter how unexpected the qualities collected in an object may be in the future, it cannot alter the way qualities are determined to exist.

2.2 Causal Belief and Sense Perception

On Shepherd’s theory, we perceive particular things by sense because they affect the sensory organs and thereby produce sensations that simultaneously begin to appear in consciousness. This prompts the mind to implement “latent reasoning”: this sensation began to exist; it must have a cause; so there is something that is its cause. Reason need not rehearse this argument, but it attaches to the sensation an idea that (purportedly) represents a particular thing that causes the sensation. It is believed to exist, but only its effect appears in consciousness. To be clear, the state in which a person perceives an object by sense comprises several things: (1) an object, or mass of qualities which can be perceived by sense, (2) the mixture of the object with the mind and sensory organs of a perceiver, (3) a sensation caused by this mixture which simultaneously begins to appear in awareness, (4) an idea produced by reason which (purportedly) represents the cause of the sensation and belief that the cause exists. That said, a mass of sensible qualities is known only as the cause of sensations which appear in consciousness. We are acquainted with nothing but the sensations and have only an idea that refers to something as its cause. So when sensible qualities are not perceived and considered in abstraction from their effects on our senses, they are “unknown powers or qualities” (ERCE: 46–7); “the positive nature and essence of unperceived beings cannot be known” (EASP: 243). In sum, an operation of reason prompted by a sensation that begins to exist in consciousness generates belief that the sensation is caused by something else.

In some circumstances, a person may form a reasonable belief that the exciting cause of the appearance of a certain sensation at one time is a certain object perceived by sense at a proximate time. The “exciting” cause is the component of the entire cause which is present just at the moment the effect occurs and absent whenever it does not occur; other requisites of the cause are relatively permanent conditions which may be known or unknown. A belief that such-and-such an object is the exciting cause of such-and-such effect arises from perception of similarities and differences among successive sensations. This may prompt another implicit rudimentary argument: this sensation has a cause; the cause is some entity (perhaps consisting of several objects) that was not present before the sensation appeared and was present at the moment it appeared; there is one and only one thing of which this is true; so it is the exciting cause of the sensation. Her example is finding that a view is present in consciousness when you open your eyes and absent when you close them. Because the position of the eyelids is the one and only candidate to be the exciting cause, you are likely to believe it is the active cause. Shepherd is well aware that such a belief might be mistaken. Still, she maintains that we form many beliefs in this simple way, and a great many of them turn out to be true. More exacting purposes demand beliefs that are formed with more care (see 5.1), but the basic reasoning is the same.

CPI licenses a different rudimentary argument. If a person believes that one particular thing caused another, e.g., the mixture of samples of blue and yellow pigment caused the quality green to begin to exist; the inductive principle underwrites the inference that any compound similar to the first must have a similar effect. To be sure, it is often very difficult to collect evidence that two particular things have similar natures, because natures do not appear in awareness and it is impossible to examine all the effects of two individuals in an effort to learn whether the unknown natures are the same. Yet Shepherd explains that, under favorable conditions, we may come to believe they are the same with a high degree of probability (see § 5.1). The inductive reasoning just described is contrasted with Hume’s explanation of causal inference in terms of the habitual association of ideas and their liveliness. It is also compared with views like that of Reid, followed by Brown, on which if we once perceive that a thing of one kind follows a thing of another kind, we immediately from the conclusive belief that all things of the first kind are followed by those of the second. As Shepherd puts it, we give undoubting assent to this law on the evidence of nothing but the law itself; yet it has reference to actual things which everyone agrees can only be known from experience. This is to believe without a reason to believe, according to Shepherd (ERCE: 136–45; EASP: 144–5). To her mind, a belief is irrational if not held for a reason.

The inductive principle applies to mathematics as well as physics. Shepherd takes arithmetical operations to be procedures for forming numbers out of given numbers; each different number determines somewhat different properties. Geometrical constructions are understood in the same way. A demonstration is made on a diagram constructed from lines drawn at various distances from each other. The properties of the particular construction are known by inspection. The move from a particular object to all things with similar constitutions is licensed by CPI; Shepherd calls this “reasoning on an experiment”. It is true that we are typically more certain of general theorems of mathematics than laws of physics. Shepherd explains that this is because we can often be more certain that two figures or numerical values have been formed in the same way because we construct them from known elements by known rules and procedures. There are many questions about the details of her theory of mathematical induction which have not, so far, been answered. To mention just one, it is not clear whether the method applies just to arithmetic and geometry or also the method of fluxions, and so on.[7]

It is notable that mathematical truths in fields to which CPI applies are not conditional propositions without existential import. The demonstration of such a truth must be based on a particular and observable instance. Although there are standard procedures for constructing different geometrical and arithmetical objects, the rules do not suffice to deduce the properties of the result. They can be known only from an actual implementation of the rules. The relational orderings of positions in space, time, and among the numbers inevitably affect the base cases of inductive conclusions. So Shepherd maintains that the general truths of natural science which require empirical evidence are necessary and the necessary truths of arithmetic and geometry are believed on the basis of experience. In this respect, Shepherd’s theory is like that of Kant, but they differ over the reality of the entities known.

3. Origin of Common Beliefs About Objects

3.1 Continued Existence Unperceived

The second of Shepherd’s books purports to show that causal reasoning is the source of common beliefs about the existence of the external world, the mind, and the self and to justify them. The threat of circular argument is acknowledged at the outset (EASP: xii). The earlier volume maintains that human beings naturally believe CP and CPI and apply them to things perceived to begin to exist. The later EASP uses these principles to generate and justify belief in the existence of objects external to the mind. The circle would be to use the causal principles to prove the existence of external objects and to take their existence to justify the assumption that CP has instances in the real world. Shepherd’s response to the threat is closely related to the justification for belief in the external world her system affords. In this section and the next, the various beliefs produced by reasoning based on CP or CPI are discussed. We postpone discussion of the circle and the issue of justification to section 5 because the origin of all beliefs discussed in EASP is said to be relevant to it.

Shepherd recognizes two basic cognitive faculties: sense, or the ability to have sensations of all varieties, and understanding, or the ability to reason from the occurrence of sensations. Whenever the mind produces an idea, there is a sensation of it. Consciousness is the genus of sensations; sensations are just entities of the sort that appear in consciousness (EASP: 135). Its species include sensations of sensible qualities, sensations of ideas of memory, ideas of imagination, ideas of reason, and so on. Properly speaking, sensations of ideas are of nothing but an idea and the idea refers to, or represents, something considered to be different from the sensation. They are not sensations of the thing ideas purport to represent. Sensations of the first sort, i.e. sensations of sensible qualities, are sensations caused by qualities such as motion and color with aid of the organs of sense. We follow Shepherd in this use of ‘sensation’. We also follow her in using ‘perception’ to mean the notice taken of sensations. But ‘sense perception’ refers to cognition of external objects by means of the senses.

In general, the common beliefs to be explained arise from perception of relations among the vast number of sensations that accumulate in the course of experience. The perception of recurring patterns of sensations stimulates implicit reasoning expressed by ideas that represent their causes as having continued, external, and independent existence. Belief that objects perceived by sense continue to exist when not perceived is the topic of this sub-section.

According to Shepherd, we have, at every moment, the unacquired, or native, idea of continued existence. The sensation (idea) of it attends all sensations of the sort introduced by action of the organs of sense (EASP: 13); I call these “sensory sensations”. When the idea of continued existence is formed, it represents the cause of the perceived constancy with which recurring patterns of sensory sensations appear and disappear. When you look at a house while walking by, a series of visual sensations appears and when you retrace your steps a similar series appears in reverse order. More generally, sensations of the motions of your limbs and sensory organs constantly appear in conjunction with trains of sensory sensations which vary with the location of your eyes, hands, and so on. Each different sensation has a different cause. But repeated perception of the constant conjunction of sensations of motions of the sensory organs and sensory sensations prompts reason to generate the idea of the continued existence of their causes in accord with the implicit argument: unless things are created purposely in order to be ready to appear, they must continue to exist ready to appear if suitably related to organs of sense (EASP: 13–14). If it were the case that the causes of sensory sensations arose and perished as the sensations do, then sensible objects, bodily organs, space, time, and everything else required for perception, would arise just when needed for perception and perish immediately afterward. The argument is meant to expose the utter absurdity of this.

The fact is, according to Shepherd, most people believe that their sensations have continued existence, even though they readily allow that pleasures, pains, and various other sensations cease to exist when they disappear from consciousness (EASP: 9). She denies that sensations that exist unperceived can be understood. It is rather imagination that associates sensations with ideas that represent objects perceived by sense as existing unperceived. The mind has no resources for thinking of such objects except under the form of their sensory appearances. Although the error in supposing sensations exist unperceived can be exposed, this hardly prevents our frequently falling into it. Yet this is not entirely unfortunate, as Shepherd sees it, because it is the means by which we acquire structural as well as existential knowledge of the external world (see § 5.2).

3.2 External Existence and the Distinction Between Internal and External

External existence contrasts with internal existence. Shepherd has a layered definition of this pair of notions. In the first instance, internal existence pertains to the capacity for sensation in general, that is the mind, or power of thought and feeling. External existence pertains to the exciting cause of any particular sensation (EASP: 40). In context of CP, nothing that satisfies one of these definitions can satisfy the other. A mixture of both is necessary for the existence of a sensation. Now sensations are nothing other than appearances in consciousness, realizations of the general capacity for sensations, i.e., the mind. With this in view, Shepherd advances the thick notion of internal existence: an entity is thickly internal just in case one and only individual can be conscious of it. A thing is thickly external, then, just in case it can be perceived by more than one human being. The thick distinction marks the difference between what is private and what is public.

The thick distinction divides the subjective and objective components of sense perception. As Shepherd notes, philosophers take very different views on this division, citing Malebranche, Leibniz, Reid, and Berkeley. She contends that we tend to adhere to the inner-outer distinction just described because it is produced by the natural mental activity of making causal inferences from the perception that sensations begin to appear in consciousness. In this sub-section, we consider the details of the origin of this inner-outer distinction and belief in the external existence of sensible objects.

In view of the fact that we cease to be conscious of anything in dreamless sleep, it is evident that all sensations begin and cease to exist. There must be some continually existing cause capable of renewing them as we believe. The present question is how the continued entity which enters into the causes of all one’s sensations, without exception, is to be conceived. The ears, nose, and other organs of sense are objects of perception which we believe to exist when unperceived. But they are not the continued cause that is wanted because sensations that occur in dreams have exciting causes which do not continue when these sensations cease to exist. The continually existing cause of all renewed sensations whatsoever must be a subject of change that pre-exists and is altered by whatever sensations appear in consciousness. The mind thus comes to be conceived as a general capacity for sensation external to all its sensations, independent of them, and ready to be altered by any exciting cause that mixes with it –a thinly internal existent. Shepherd observes that “I” always refers to something abstract.

As for the common belief that objects of sense perception have external existence, it is said to arise from little more than the implicit reasoning that refers sensations induced by the sensory system to objects that continue to exist. The addition is that the sensory organs are supposed to act mechanically, to have contact with objects with which they join in causing sensations. The mechanical character of the interaction of sensory organs and objects of sense perception is taken to imply that the objects can be perceived by conjunction with the sensory systems of more than one human being if more than one exists.

3.3 Independent Existence and the Objection from Dreams

The factors that make us believe in external existence of objects of perception are said to suffice for assent to their independence. Belief that objects are perceivable by more than one human being tends to produce belief that their existence is independent of any particular human being. A second source of belief in independence is that we infer that while objects exist unperceived they undergo change; a fire viewed at one time and again an hour later may have died down in the meantime. The most important source is that we perceive objects whose sensory appearance is very like that of ourselves. We suppose the appearances are caused by things like ourselves and infer that they are like us in having sensations and thoughts. Since their thoughts and sensations are not perceived by us, this leads to the belief that their existence is independent of ours. But although Shepherd clearly maintains that these arguments affect our credence, none of them is definitive proof that objects are independent of an individual mind.

The phenomena of dreams are sometimes raised as an objection to the common beliefs about the existence of sensible objects because we may believe that the illusions of a dream have continued, external, and independent existence. This is reason to doubt the existence of all perceptual objects unless we have better evidence for their reality than we have for that of the seeming objects of dreams. Shepherd dispatches the objection, but with a proviso. She maintains that the sensations that occur in dreams are just like those that occur in waking experience. But when dreaming, a person’s ability to amass a large number of sensations is limited. When awake, a person can discover that the seeming objects of dreams do not “fulfill their definitions” by moving the eyes, hands, and so on. We think of perceptual objects as belonging to various kinds to which we give names and definitions. Shepherd maintains that a general name such as “apple” is defined in terms of its sensible qualities--round, juicy, sweet smelling, etc.--and its effects when compounded with other sorts of objects-- providing nourishment if eaten, turning brown if exposed to air, and the like—and its capacity to be perceived by more than one human being; that is, the definition includes all the object’s sensible effects, qualities, and powers. If we dream of an apple, we wake up to find nothing that can be felt, tasted, or perceived to interact with other objects as things properly called “apple” do; this shows it wasn’t real. On the other hand, the more evidence we have that a purported object appears and behaves as apples do, the more probable the belief that the supposed apple exists in the world. Provided that we can detect the illusions of dreams on this basis, the fact that we dream is no reason to doubt beliefs about the existence of sensible objects in general.

Nevertheless, there is a remaining doubt about the independence of objects of perception from a perceiver. Shepherd claims this is the only possible doubt with regard to CPI: experience cannot show that there is no unperceivable dependence relation among all the masses of qualities an individual purportedly perceives (EASP: 117–8). If this is the case, then all of these masses have a bond of interdependence with the cause of one person’s dreams, causes which are internal to this person. So, the demise of this one individual will dissolve the universe. Causal reasoning is of no use against this possibility, because if it obtains, the independence of causes in general is compromised. Ignorance on this point is grounds to doubt that any object is independent of the existence of one individual; yet no one can apprehend that this is so. We confront a dilemma: either the universe is dependent on a single human mind or the universe contains something else and causal reasoning has scope in which to prove the existence of many minds, human beings, and other sensible objects. She claims that all human beings immediately reject the former, and have no second thoughts about it. She seems to regard it as an unfailing psychological pre-disposition.

The phenomenon of dreams is used to highlight the difference between her notion of the sensible world and George Berkeley’s. He defines a sensible thing as nothing but a collection of sensations. Shepherd complains that this definition is incomplete because it excludes properties of continued and external existence. This is why Berkeley’s doctrine is both unconvincing and difficult to refute according to her diagnosis. Atherton (1996) argues that she misunderstands Berkeley’s Idealism. The occurrence of dreams is overlooked by Reid and others who maintain that extension, motion, and other primary qualities are not sensations, but real qualities existing externally and independently. The fact that extension and motion appear just the same in dreams as in sense experience shows that they are sensations in experience, too. Motion and extension are capable of causing sensations to which we give the same names, but the causes of sensations cannot be sensations according to Shepherd.

4. Origin of Belief in the Continued Existence of the Mind and Self, and An Account of the Diachronic Identity of Self

Mind, as we saw, is the capacity for sensation in general. All sensations begin and cease to exist while mind is understood to be the continually existing cause that enables sensations to arise when mixed with various exciting causes. What is called “self” according to Shepherd is a particular mind that has the general capacity for sensations including those caused in part by organs of sense; a self is a mind united with a living body.

Shepherd starts by explicating the notion of self. She contends that whenever we are awake, we have sensations of our own existence, life, and the extension of the body; ideas of their causes are formed by the usual inference. Organs of sense have no special part in causing sensations of the sort just mentioned; rather the living body does. We consider this body (as it is unperceived) to be the source of pleasure and pain and to be bounded by the skin. What is called “self” in addition to the mind is contained within the skin. Shepherd concludes that the notion of self is “the notion of the conscious sensation of the extension of the body and of a sufficient cause for life and sensation in general” (EASP: 62). All the elements of what is called “self” are implied by this notion— general capacities for sensation and life (the mind and body) and the sensations of one’s own existence, life, and the extension of the body.

According to Shepherd, the idea of the continued existence of self has its origin in the perception that the sensation of life is interrupted by dreamless sleep and then resumed; we refer the renewal as effect to a cause that continues to exist. The cause is identified as the conjunction of the power to sustain life and the powers of memory and sensation. The power of memory is the ability to form ideas of memory. Ideas of memory are complex. On Shepherd’s analysis they contain: fainter sensations attended by the idea of the cause of their originals’ being remote, the perception of a lapse of time, and the perception of one’s own existence going on between the moment of original impression and the present faint sensations. This explanation is evidently so far incomplete. The main difficulty is to explain the perception of a lapse of time.

Shepherd subjects this perception to analysis: the fainter sensations are attended by the idea of the present moment and the past moment is only remembered in the present. She maintains that awareness of the present moment and memory of the past moment inspires reasoning to this effect: there must be a continued being in nature capable of uniting the two moments. We saw that time, as she understands it, is a continued existence comprising successive moments. So the perception of a lapse of time between a present and past sensation is the idea of the continued existence of time relative to which the present and remembered sensations are ordered.

Returning to an idea of memory, it contains: (1) the idea of a present sensation, (2) the idea of a fainter sensation that is now remembered, (3) the idea of time as a continued existence, and (4) the idea that the present sensation and the remembered sensation are ordered by virtue of being simultaneous with earlier and later moments of time. In addition, it contains (5) the perception of one’s own existence during the interval between the original perception and the present one. This is nothing other than perception of the continued existence of oneself, i.e., the conjunction of two capacities that constitute the self. Their continued existence is inferred from the necessity that these standing causes continue to exist when they are not conjoined with the active causes of particular sensations.

In sum, the origin of belief in the continued existence of self is causal reasoning which produces a conjunction of three ideas. These are the idea of the general capacity for sensations including those caused by use of the organs of sense, the idea of the capacity to sustain life, and the idea of the power to form ideas of memory. Accordingly, belief in the continued existence of self is just belief that the three capacities referred to by these ideas are continued. They are part of the cause of the sensation of one’s existing over time, but it is interrupted. According to Shepherd, the identity of self is constituted by nothing other than the continued existence of the union of the the three capacities (EASP: 154–4). There is no persisting particle, she observes.

On Shepherd’s theory, the human mind and body are different essences (EASP: 155–6). This is because the mind is the capacity for sensation in general and the body is the continually existing cause of sensations of extension and solidity in the mind. The former is the capacity for sensations of extension and inextension, solidity and lack of resistance to motion, whereas the latter is the exciting cause of just one member of each pair of mutually contrary sensations. So they are different essences. For this reason, it seems possible in the abstract that the mind and the body should exist separately, but Shepherd reports that the fact of the matter has not been settled. In practice, sensation is never known to take place without the essence that causes sensations of extension. Indeed, the living body, particularly the brain, seems to be integral to the cause of sensation in the species man. She urges that this does not preclude the probability of resurrection after death because there may be matter finer than that which composes the present human body which is capable of causing sensations when conjoined with the human mind (EASP: 157–9).

In a short essay on the mind’s capacity to form a design, Shepherd confronts the question how, if at all, the mind can cause motion in the body: how can a state of a conscious being—that of conceiving a design and willing to implement it—determine the motion of the body to this end? (Essay XIII, EPEU: 403–05). She explains that when a person forms a plan and decides to carry it out, the conscious state is united with whatever bodily qualities co-exist with it. The union begins a bodily motion directed to an end by the mind. The bodily part of the union is the cause of the beginning of motion; it is necessary that this cause be similar to whatever impulse causes other motions. Since we are not conscious of the cause, but only the design and volition, it is impossible for us to know its nature. Yet in this respect, the cause of voluntary motion is no more mysterious than any other cause. We are acquainted with the effects the living body has on our consciousness, but have no knowledge of its nature unperceived.

5. Justification

5.1 Belief in the Existence of Particular Things of Specific Kinds

Shepherd maintains that the evidence of the existence of sensations is immediate and incontrovertible; they are felt and their existence is nothing more than the feeling (EASP: 142). The conclusion of reasoning from the existence of sensations to that of some cause or other is equally certain. But inferences with regard to the existence of particular causes of specific kinds are liable to error both with regard to reasoning and lapse of memory. As a result, the evidence we have that a supposed object of a specific kind exists, e.g., an apple rather than a crab apple, consists of items of unequal evidential value.

Three sorts of evidence relevant to the existence of an apple are mentioned: perceptions of its several sensible qualities, perceptions of its effects in conjunction with objects of various sorts, and indications of the manner in which it was formed. The evidence we have that, say, a seeming particular thing is an apple might include perceptions of its round figure and pleasing taste, observations of its turning brown after exposure to air, and report of its having been picked from a tree. Let’s call this group of traits “T”. To evaluate this evidence, Shepherd invokes the notion of the “apparent cause”. The apparent cause in the case in question is an object of the kind apple. There is a certain regularity with which active causes that belong to the kind apple exhibit traits T. There may be one or more other kinds of objects that are found to have traits T with greater or less regularity. Although things in these other kinds satisfy part of the definition of the apparent cause, they do not satisfy the remainder.

Shepherd’s idea is that the evidence that the object in question is an apple should be weighed by the known regularity with which traits T belong to exciting causes that are apples. If the known regularity is unfailing, the evidence on hand makes it highly probable that the object in question is an apple and will behave in all circumstances as apples do. In case the known regularity of the union of T and an apple holds in some, but not all cases, the probability that the object is an apple conferred by the evidence should be proportioned to the ratio of the number of particular cases in which the regularity holds to the number of cases with traits T; this might involve ratios such as that between apples and pears in our area. Shepherd says we should be skeptical that the conjunction of T with apples holds in a particular case, but the degree of skepticism should be no greater than the irregularity of their conjunction. Yet it is possible that an apple might not exhibit some qualities in the definition of an apple because, although the difference would have a cause, the circumstances might indicate conjunction with a miraculous act intended for a certain end (EASP: 144–7).

On this theory, the evidence for one perceptual belief consists in part of other perceptual beliefs. For instance, the belief that a purported apple is a real apple may find evidential support from perceptual beliefs about what happens when it is exposed to air. It may happen that belief that one object exists supports believe that another does and it, in turn, supports believe that the first exists. For instance, the claim that there is a fire might be based on the observation that it was caused by steel striking flint; but then the external existence of the steel and flint might be confirmed by observing that their concussion caused fire. Shepherd notes that someone might think this is arguing in a circle. To put it differently, it might seem to us that every perceptual belief receives its evidential value from nothing but other perceptual beliefs. Shepherd sees it differently. Other perceptual beliefs are relevant only because we understand that if the actual cause of, say, a purported fire is the apparent cause, then it is necessary that the unknown cause at work in the purported case has all the qualities in the definition of fire. So CP and CPI are foundational in Shepherd’s theory of probable belief. Still, we just saw that the probability that the apparent cause of a given effect is the actual cause depends on other perceptual beliefs (ERCE: 124–5).

5.2 Knowledge of the Order and Proportions of Unknown Natures

Sensations are appearances; their causes are not, but because we are bound to think of them in the guise of sensations, philosophical analysis is needed to pry them apart. The former are inner and the latter outer. Objects of perception must remain unknown in the manner in which sensations are known. Because a sensation is essentially an appearance to consciousness, it cannot be like anything other than a sensation in essential respects. However, Shepherd insists that sensations have inessential properties that are shared by beings of other sorts, such as variety (EASP: 163–4). There must be as much variety among the causes of sensations as there is among the sensations; otherwise CPI would fail. So although sensations can be intrinsically like nothing but sensations, relations among sensations must have a likeness to relations among their causes.

The most interesting examples are collections of sensations each of which varies from all the others in the same respect, e.g., warmth, length, or duration. Sensations vary “in kind and degree”, as Shepherd puts it. All the sensations in the first collection just mentioned are alike in being warm, but differ in respect of degrees of warmth. It follows that their causes are alike in respect of some general property that admits of degrees and different in its degrees. The external gradable property cannot possibly be like a sensation, but it imparts an order among its grades which is like the order among their effects. As Shepherd says, the causes of sensations must have “the same proportions, in relation to each other among themselves, as the effects have to each other” (EASP: 28–9). So time, the continuously existent nature that has a part in causing sensations that arise successively, consists of positions with mutual relations proportional to the relations among the corresponding sensations. Time is, then, capable of being measured by the idea of a continued external object that undergoes changes of a sort deemed suitable to measure the changes in other externally existing things. The durations of the perceptions of, say, beats of a pendulum thus serve to measure the durations of the beats that cause them. The grades of difference between elements on the corresponding sides can be as small or large as observation and reason require. In addition to similarity, variety, and proportionality, and contrariety are mentioned as a relation common to sensations and their causes: the causes of sensations of motion and rest, solidity and lack of resistance to motion, extension and inextension, red and blue, different places, etc. must be related as contraries.

The isomorphism of sensory sensations as a whole and their respective external causes as a whole enables us to have a sort of inferential knowledge about sensible objects in addition to their existence. The order and comparison of sensations provides information about the external world in all those respects in which there is structural similarity between the two domains. Although there are in principle no limits to the abstract similarities that might be discovered by students of nature, Shepherd stresses similarities that are sufficiently close to being complete and exact that we need do little more than attend to relations exhibited by accumulated masses of sensations in order to comprehend them. This is the advantage of our natural tendency to associate objects of perception and the sensations under which we are bound to think of them. It obscures the metaphysically important distinction between inner and outer existence, but it facilitates descriptive knowledge of the external world. Shepherd illustrates this by an analogy with algebra. Just as algebraic signs stand for unknown quantities which can be “measured, valued, and reasoned upon by their signs”, so sensations are signs for their causes which exist under relations similar to those we observe, calculate, or demonstrate in the domain of sensations. As mentioned, we typically give sensations and their causes the same name. So we may speak, think, and reason about external objects as if they really existed under the forms in which they appear (EASP: 27–8, 47–9, 161–6). Shepherd finds it important to observe that no part of this arrangement is subject to skepticism: the relation between sensations and what they signify is assured by CP and CPI; relations among sensations are assured by observation and reasoning, and their interpretation is assured by the proportionality that, according to CPI, must hold among causes, considered as a whole, and the sensations they effect, considered as a whole.

5.3 Threat of Circularity

We said that Shepherd mentions at the beginning of her second book that there might seem to be circularity in her procedure (EASP: Preface). The earlier volume argues for the causal principles and maintains that they regulate all speculative and practical belief. The second essay uses these principles to explain the origin of belief in the existence of the external world, and then claims this belief is justified. This might seem to be circular, as if the assumption that the causal principles have instances in the world were used to prove the existence of the external world which was taken to prove the assumption. But Shepherd maintains her procedure is not circular. She explains that the “justness” of these beliefs could not be fully established before it was shown that all sensations whatsoever are believed to be successive effects of various causes:

the relation of cause and effect when fully known and established, affords the only method of proof in our power, for the knowledge of external existence. (EASP: xiv–xv)

This is the business of EASP, to show that belief of the causal principles generates a system of beliefs about the external world which is justified by merits conferred on the system as a whole. These are not, or need not be, merits in relation to truth. The text makes no attempt to provide a reason to think the causal principles which found the system are metaphysically necessary truths about what exists. We saw that she does not mean to say that God is bound by it. The veracity of God is not offered as warrant of the metaphysical truth of CP; indeed, the existence of God is proved by it (EASP: 150; EPEU: 348).

This is the justificatory argument as interpreted in this article.[8] We assume the causal principles are true of whatever suddenly appears to exist; to do otherwise would be to contradict what we are naturally inclined to believe. This is psychologically impossible but epistemically unwarranted. We need only this natural inclination and the series of sensations arising and perishing in consciousness to form beliefs with regard to the continued, external, and independent existence of objects perceived by sense. Causal reasoning provides an accessible reason to assent to these beliefs; so the system comprises existential beliefs that come up to the standard of rationality Shepherd endorses. In addition, causal reasoning about the existence of objects of various kinds provides opportunity to assemble evidence which makes it highly probable that human beings other than oneself exist and objects such as apples and fires exist. As it happens, the opportunity has been largely realized in our experience so far. This enables us to make reasonable predictions about the qualities that things of various kinds will exhibit on the basis of observing only a few of their qualities. This has the considerable merit of allowing us to plan and act with reasonable confidence. Causal inference also produces and provides reason for belief in an almighty deity and the comforts that brings. These advantages justify beliefs produced by the natural, practically unavoidable assumption of CP and CPI. These advantages are all the more striking in view of fact that Hume’s theory of belief in the external world has none of them and the epistemologies of Reid, Brown, and Stewart lack at least one of them.


Works by Mary Shepherd

  • [PWMS] 2000, Philosophical Writings of Mary Shepherd (facsimile reproductions), edited with Introduction by Jennifer McRobert, 2 vols. Bristol, England: Thoemmes Press.
  • [ERCE] 1824, Essay upon the Relation of Cause and Effect, in PWMS, v. 1.
  • [EPEU] 1827a, Essays on the Perception of an External Universe, and Other Subjects Connected with the Doctrine of Causation, in PWSMS, v. 2: 1–416.
  • [EASP] Essay on the Academical or Skeptical Philosophy, EPEU: 1–191.
  • Essays Containing Inquiries, EUPU: 193–416.
  • 1827b, “On the Causes of Simple and Erect Vision”, Philosophical Magazine and Annals of Philosophy, n.s. June, 406–416.
  • 1828, “Observations by Lady Mary Shepherd on ‘First Lines of the Human Mind”,in PWMS, v. 2: 624–627
  • 1832, “Lady Mary Shepherd’s Metaphysics”, Fraser’s Magazine for Town and Country, in PWMS, v. 1: 697–708.

Works by Other Authors

  • Atherton, Margaret, 1996, “Lady Mary Shepherd’s Case Against Berkeley”, British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 4(2): 348–366. doi:10.1080/09608789608570945
  • –––, 2005, “Reading Lady Mary Shepherd”, Harvard Philosophy Review, 13(2):73–85. doi:10.5840/harvardreview20051327
  • Blakey, Robert, 1850, History of the Philosophy of Mind, London: Longman, Brown, Green and Longmans.
  • Brandreath, Mary Elizabeth Shepherd, 1886, Some Family and Friendly Recollections of 70 Years, Westerham: Printed by C. Hooker.
  • Brown, Thomas, 1805, Observations on the Nature and Tendency of the Doctrine of Mr. Hume, etc., Edinburgh: Mundell and Son (2nd edn, 1806 in facsimile, Lewis White Beck (ed.). New York, Garland).
  • –––, 1822, Inquiry into the Relation of Cause and Effect, Andover: Flagg and Gould Printers.
  • Bolton, Martha Brandt, 2010, “Causality and Causal Induction: the Necessitarian Theory of Lady Mary Shepherd”, in Causation in Modern Philosophy, Keith Allen and Tom Stoneham (eds.), London: Routledge: 242–261.
  • Fantl, Jeremy, 2016, “Mary Shepherd on Causal Necessity”, Metaphysica, 17(1): 87–108.
  • McRobert, Jennifer, 2000, “Introduction”, in PWMS, v. 1: v–xxvi.
  • Garrett, Don, 1997, Cognition and Commitment in Hume’s Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Owen, David, 1999, Hume’s Reason, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/0199252602.001.0001
  • Paoletti, Christina, 2011, “Restoring Necessary Connections: Lady Mary Shepherd on Hume and the Early Nineteenth-Century Debate on Causality”, I Castelli di Yale, 11: 47–59.
  • Perkins, Mary Anne, 2004, “Shepherd, Lady Mary (1777–1847)”, Oxford Dictionary of National Biography, Oxford: Oxford University Press, online edition, Jan 2008, doi:10.1093/ref:odnb/58699 [accessed 10 May 2017]
  • Snyder, Laura J., 2012 “William Whewell”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2012 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <>

Other Internet Resources


The author thanks Jennifer McRobert for sharing some of her research on Shepherd and Antonia LoLordo for discussion of material in this article and comments on a draft of it.

Copyright © 2017 by
Martha Bolton <>

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