Max Stirner

First published Thu Jun 27, 2002; substantive revision Sun Oct 29, 2023

Max Stirner (1806–1856) is the author of Der Einzige und sein Eigenthum (1844). This book is usually known as The Ego and Its Own in English, but a more literal, and informative, translation would be The Unique Individual and their Property. Both the form and content of Stirner’s major work are disconcerting. He challenges his readers’ expectations about how political and philosophical argument should be conducted, and shakes their confidence in the moral and political superiority of contemporary civilisation. Stirner provides a sweeping attack on the modern world as increasingly dominated by “religious” modes of thought and oppressive social institutions, together with a much briefer sketch of a radical “egoistic” alternative in which individual autonomy might flourish. The historical impact of The Ego and Its Own is difficult to assess, but Stirner’s work can be said: to have had an immediate and destructive impact on the left-Hegelian movement; to have played an important role in the intellectual development of Karl Marx (1818–1883); and to have subsequently influenced the political tradition of individualist anarchism.

1. Stirner’s Life and Work

Stirner was born Johann Caspar Schmidt on 25 October 1806, the only child of lower middle class Lutheran parents living in Bayreuth. “Stirner” was originally a nickname, resulting from a large forehead, exaggerated by the way he pushed back his hair, and only later — in the form of “Max Stirner” — adopted as a literary pseudonym and his preferred name. His father had died when Stirner was only six months old, and he was brought up by his mother (who subsequently remarried) and then later, when his mother moved from Bayreuth, by an aunt who looked after him in order that he could continue his schooling at the renowned local Gymnasium. Stirner subsequently pursued his undergraduate studies, with little academic distinction, at the universities of Berlin, Erlangen, and Königsberg. In Berlin, he is known to have attended three lecture-series given by G.W.F. Hegel (1770–1831): on the philosophy of religion; on the history of philosophy; and on the philosophy of “subjective spirit” (which concerns individual psychology, including thinking and the will).

Towards the end of his university career, Stirner devoted much of his time to “family affairs”, possibly a euphemism for his mother’s deteriorating mental health. In 1832, he returned with his mother to Berlin, and sought, with qualified success, to train as a teacher. (Stirner’s mother was committed to a mental home in 1837 and she would eventually outlive him by three years.) A period of private study and irregular work followed, including eighteenth months working unpaid as an Latin teacher. During this time he married Agnes Butz (1815–1838), a member of his landlady’s family. In August 1838, Agnes died giving birth to a still-born child. Edgar Bauer (1820–1886) would later maintain that Stirner had once told him that, having caught sight of his first wife naked, he was unable to touch her again.

Between 1839 and 1844 Stirner maintained something of a double life in Berlin. He obtained a position at a well-regarded private girls’ school, and spent the next five years teaching history and literature, establishing a reputation as a polite and reliable teacher in the process. Away from his teaching post, however, Stirner began to frequent the more avant-garde of Berlin’s intellectual haunts. He used the reading room of the novelist Willibald Alexis (1798–1871), spent afternoons at the Café Stehely, and from 1841 onwards was a regular visitor to Hippel’s wine bar on the Friedrichstrasse. The last of these was the main meeting place of “the free”, an increasingly bohemian group of teachers, students, officers, and journalists, under the loose intellectual leadership of the left-Hegelian Bruno Bauer (1809–1882). The latter had recently been dismissed from his teaching post at the University of Bonn, following an official inquiry into the orthodoxy of his writings on the New Testament. This unconventional group included Marie Dähnhardt (1818–1902) who became Stirner’s second wife (and the dedicatee of The Ego and Its Own). In this bohemian environment, and despite his calm and unassuming personal appearance, Stirner gained a reputation for his hostility to religion, intolerance of moderation, and ability to provoke fierce argument.

Stirner’s earliest published writings date from this time in Berlin. In addition to some short and unremarkable pieces of journalism for the Rheinische Zeitung and the Leipziger Allgemeine Zeitung, these writings include a knowing review of Bruno Bauer’s anonymous and parodic attack on Hegel in The Trumpet of the Last Judgement (1842), and an article on pedagogy entitled “The False Principle of Our Education” (1842). The latter, in particular, adumbrates some of the themes of Stirner’s own later work; for example, contrasting the training of individuals to an alien calling, on the one hand, with the cultivation of the predisposition to become “sovereign characters”, on the other. During this period, Stirner is said to have occasionally alluded to a book that he was working on, but few of his associates took its existence seriously. The impact of The Ego and Its Own on these left-Hegelian circles was considerable as well as unexpected. Stirner had begun serious work on the book in early 1843 and finished it in the middle of 1844. The Ego and Its Own was published by the Leipzig bookseller Otto Wigand (1795–1870) in an edition of a thousand copies. Although dated 1845 the book was widely available by November of the previous year.

Measured by the reaction that it produced, The Ego and Its Own might be described as a critical success. The book was widely reviewed, and attracted attention from well-known figures such as Bettina von Arnim (1785–1859), the doyenne of the Berlin literati, and Kuno Fischer (1824–1907), later a distinguished neo-Kantian historian of philosophy. The book also generated responses from many of its left-Hegelian targets; Bruno Bauer, Ludwig Feuerbach (1804–1872), Moses Hess (1812–1875), Arnold Ruge (1802–1880), and others, all ventured into print in order to defend their own views against Stirner’s polemic. (Stirner replied to some of these left-Hegelian rejoinders in an article entitled “Stirner’s Critics” [1845].)

However, The Ego and Its Own was neither a popular nor a financial success. Stirner had left his teaching post shortly before the book was published, and by 1846 he was reduced to advertising in the Vossische Zeitung for a loan. By then, Stirner had also squandered much of his second wife’s inheritance (losing money on a failed dairy business), and she left him towards the end of the same year. Many years later Marie Dähnhardt was traced to England by Stirner’s loyal biographer, the poet and novelist John Henry Mackay (1864–1933). She refused to meet Mackay in person but wrote to him characterising Stirner as a very sly man whom she had neither respected nor loved, and describing their relationship together as more of a cohabitation than a marriage.

From 1847, Stirner’s life was characterised by social isolation and financial precariousness. He remained detached from contemporary events — for example, he seems to have largely ignored the revolutions of 1848 — and his daily life was dominated by domestic routine and economic hardship. Stirner continued to write intermittently, but commentators have generally found his later work to be of little independent interest; that is, of little interest apart from its disputed potential to illuminate The Ego and Its Own. He translated into German some of the economic writings of Jean-Baptiste Say (1767–1832) and Adam Smith (1723–1790), and may have written a series of short journalistic pieces for the Journal des oesterreichischen Lloyd. In 1852, he published a History of Reaction in two parts; a work consisting mainly of excerpts from other authors — including Edmund Burke (1729–1797) and Auguste Comte (1898–1857) — excerpts which are not always easily distinguished from his own occasional commentary. Its intellectual purpose remains uncertain, although there are some continuities with Stirner’s critical account of revolution in The Ego and Its Own (Stepelevich 2021: 161–169). Stirner’s main strategy for economic survival in this period seems to have involved repeatedly changing addresses in order to evade his creditors, although not quickly enough to avoid two brief periods in a debtors’ prison in 1853 and 1854.

In May 1856, still living in reduced circumstances in Berlin, Stirner fell into a “nervous fever”, seemingly after being stung in the neck by an insect. Following a brief remission, he died on 25 June (aged 49 years and 8 months). His death went largely unnoticed by the outside world.

It might look as if there is a stark contrast between the often melodramatic and provocative tone of Stirner’s best-known work, on the one hand, and the more mundane, sometimes poignant, events of his own solitary life, on the other. However, commentators often strive to link his life and philosophical views more closely. John Henry Mackay, for example, emphasizes the “ataraxic”dimension of The Ego and Its Own, and portrays Stirner’s life as an authentic embodiment of the emotional detachment that the egoist must cultivate in order to avoid being enslaved by their own passions and commitments. Even the pathos of Stirner’s death is said to reflect the egoist’s refusal to love life, or fear death, excessively (Mackay 1914: 212). Such claims are not without interest, but the lack of direct evidence regarding Stirner’s own interior life makes them difficult to evaluate and endorse.

2. The Ego and Its Own

2.1 Form and Structure

Modern readers hoping to understand The Ego and Its Own are confronted by several obstacles, not least the form, structure, and central arguments, of Stirner’s book.

Much of Stirner’s prose — crowded with aphorisms, emphases, and hyperbole — appears calculated to disconcert. Most striking, perhaps, is his use of word play. Rather than reach a conclusion through the conventional use of argument, Stirner often approaches a claim that he wishes to endorse by exploiting words with related etymologies or formal similarities. For example, he associates words for property (such as “Eigentum”) with words connoting distinctive individual characteristics (such as “Eigenheit”) in order to promote the claim that property is expressive of selfhood. (Stirner’s account of egoistic property — see 2.4 below — gives this otherwise orthodox-looking Hegelian claim a distinctive twist.)

This rejection of conventional forms of intellectual discussion is linked to Stirner’s substantive views about language and rationality. His distinctive style reflects a conviction that both language and rationality are human products which have come to constrain and oppress their creators. Stirner maintains that accepted meanings and traditional standards of argumentation are underpinned by a conception of truth as a privileged realm beyond individual control. As a result, individuals who accept this conception are abandoning a potential area of creative self-expression in favour of embracing a subordinate role as servants of truth. In stark contrast, Stirner insists that the only legitimate restriction on the form of our language, or on the structure of our arguments, is that they should serve our individual ends. It is the frequent failure of conventional meanings and received forms of argument to satisfy his interpretation of this criterion which underpins the remorselessly idiosyncratic form of Stirner’s prose.

The Ego and Its Own has an intelligible, but scarcely transparent, structure. It is organised around a tripartite account of human experience, which is first introduced in a description of the stages of an individual life. The first stage in this developmental narrative is the realistic one of childhood, in which children are constrained by material and natural forces such as their parents. Liberation from these constraints is achieved with what Stirner calls the self-discovery of mind, as children find the means to outwit those extrenal forces in their own determination and cunning. The resulting idealistic stage of youth, however, contains new internal sources of constraint, as individuals once more become enslaved, this time to the spiritual forces of conscience and reason. Only with the adulthood of egoism do individuals escape both material (external) and spiritual (internal) constraints, learning to value their personal satisfaction above all other considerations.

Stirner portrays this dialectic of individual growth as an analogue of historical development, and it is a tripartite account of the latter which structures the remainder of the book. Human history is reduced to three successive epochs of: realism (the ancient, or pre-Christian, world); idealism (the modern, or Christian, world); and egoism (the future world). Part One of The Ego and Its Own is devoted to the first two of those historical epochs, providing a negative critique of the past. And Part Two is concerned with the third of these epochs, providing a positive account of the future.

In both individual and historical forms, the second stage of this tripartite developmental narrative is presented as a negation of the first, and the third stage, in turn, as the negation of that negation. The triadic structure of this narrative has been read as confirming Stirner’s Hegelian formation and commitments (Stepelevich: 1985), but can also be seen as embodying a self-conscious parody of Hegelianism. In this context, Stirner has plausibly been understood as offering both a provocation and a knowing attempt at humour, utilising a dialectical structure in order to advance his own anti-Hegelian position (De Ridder: 2008). There is little doubt about the provocation, but assessing Stirner’s seriousness is a harder task.

2.2 The Ancient and Modern Worlds

Part One of The Ego and Its Own is backward-looking and negative. It is backward-looking in that it is concerned with the ancient and modern worlds rather than with the future. And it is negative in that its primary aim is to demonstrate the failure of modernity to escape from the very religious modes of thought which it claims to have outgrown. The bulk of Stirner’s genealogical account is devoted to the modern epoch, and the ancient world is only discussed insofar as it contributes to the genesis of modernity. In both cases, however, the majority of his examples are taken from the cultural and intellectual spheres. Cumulatively these examples are meant, not only to undermine historical narratives which portray the modern development of humankind as the progressive realisation of freedom, but also to support an account of individuals in the modern world as increasingly oppressed by the spiritual. For Stirner, the subordination of the individual to spirit — in any of its guises — counts as a problematic form of religious servitude.

Stirner’s account of the historical development of modernity largely revolves around a single event, the Reformation. He attempts to show that, from the perspective of the individual, the movement from Catholic to Protestant hegemony is not a liberating one, but instead constitutes both an extension and intensification of the domination of spirit. The Reformation extends, rather than contracts, the sphere of religious control over the individual because it refuses to recognise the distinction between the spiritual and the sensuous. Rather than preventing priests from marrying, for example, Protestantism makes marriage religious, thereby extending the sphere of the spiritual to include the sensuous. The Reformation also intensifies, rather than relaxes, the bond between individuals and religion. The more inward faith of Protestantism, for example, establishes a perpetual internal conflict between natural impulses and religious conscience. In a typically vivid and combative metaphor, Stirner describes this internal conflict in the individual — in which natural impulses battle with religious conscience — as analogous to the struggle between the populace and the secret police in the contemporary body politic.

Stirner’s claim that the modern world reproduces, rather than abolishes, religious modes of thought provides the opportunity for a sustained attack on the writings of his left-Hegelian contemporaries. Ludwig Feuerbach, in particular, is singled out for failing to overcome the subordination of the individual to spirit.

The centrality of the critique of Feuerbach to Stirner’s project is clear from the form of The Ego and Its Own which embodies a structural parody of Feuerbach’s best-known work. Where the two halves of Feuerbach’s Das Wesen des Christentums had been entitled God and Man — with the first attacked and the second celebrated — the two corresponding parts of Stirner’s opus are named Man and I. More substantively, Stirner seeks to challenge the contemporary verdict of progressives concerning Feuerbach’s achievement. Stirner maintains that the contemporary celebration of Feuerbach for having completed the critique of religion, is not merely mistaken but nearer the opposite of the truth. Far from undermining religion, the Feuerbachian problematic is said to reproduce and amplify its central features.

For Feuerbach, the primary error of Christianity is that it takes human predicates and projects them into another world as if they constitute an independent being. He sees religious belief as a necessary step in the progress of humankind to self-understanding. More precisely, it is through transformative criticism — recovering the correct relation of subject and predicate from its inversion in Christianity — that we first come to understand what human nature is. Moreover, Feuerbach maintains that, once liberated from their otherworldly form, these essential human characteristics — and especially perhaps our love for others — would quickly come to form the basis of the unalienated social and political life of the future. This emancipatory ambition also helps to clarify Feuerbach’s insistence that he should be seen as a friend, and not an enemy, of religion; in particular, he sought not to destroy Christianity, but to liberate its content from otherworldly forms. This claim is also at the heart of his distinctive — and perhaps idiosyncratic — denial that he was an atheist. Feuerbach maintains that true atheism requires the rejection not only of God as subject, but also of those predicates — love, wisdom, justice, and so on — traditionally associated with divinity.

Stirner might be said to pick up this — perhaps idiosyncratic — characterisation of “true atheism” and run with it. Stirner maintains that religion, properly understood, is characterised by the subordination of the individual to “spirit” in any of its guises. Consequently, the rejection of God as a transcendental subject leaves the essential character and failing of religion intact. Feuerbach’s perfectionist problematic, Stirner remarks, might have altered “the tinsel” (the divine subject) but it leaves “the main thing” (the divine predicates) unchanged (56). (Page references in parenthesis are to the 1995 Cambridge edition of The Ego and Its Own cited in the Bibliography below.) The sacred is allowed to remain, if not as God, then as “Man with a capital M” in Byington’s inspired English rendering of Stirner’s “Der Mensch”. In short, rather than describing human nature as it is, Feuerbach is said to have deified a prescriptive account of what being human involves. As a result, the real kernel of religion, the positing of an “essence over me” (46), has been left intact. Indeed, Stirner suggests that Feuerbach’s achievement was to have effected a “change of masters” (55) which actually made the tyranny of the divine over the individual even more complete. More complete because it extends and intensifies domination. It extends domination because this new deity is no longer the preserve of the faithful, but can possess everyone, believers and unbelievers alike. And it intensifies domination because the scrutiny of our own conscience is much harder to evade than that of a transcendental subject that a flutters “over our heads as a dove” (86).

Stirner extends this critique to the work of all the left-Hegelians, including those with whom he had associated in Berlin. Individual left-Hegelians disagree about the content of human nature. Thus for “political liberals” like Arnold Ruge human nature is identified with citizenship, for “social liberals” like Moses Hess human nature is identified with labour, and for “humane liberals” like Bruno Bauer human nature is identified with critical activity. However, notwithstanding those differences, all these left-hegelians reproduce the basic Feuerbachian error: separating the individual from their human essence, and then setting that essence above the individual as something to be striven for. In contrast, Stirner maintains that because it has no universal or prescriptive content, human nature cannot ground any claim about how we ought to live. His own intellectual project—which he describes as an attempt to rehabilitate the prosaic and mortal self, the “un-man”(124) for whom the notion of a calling is alien—is intended as a radical break with the work of these contemporaries.

It might seem obvious that Stirner subscribes to a resolutely anti-perfectionist position here. However, this reading has been challenged. Stirner certainly rejects what might be called “essentialist perfectionism”; that is, those ethical theories which value certain characteristics of the individual precisely because they realise some aspect of human nature. However, he himself continues to embrace a character ideal, a picture of a self-ruling individual whose perfection is valuable apart from any happiness or pleasure that it might bring. The Stirnerian egoist must not only avoid submission to external powers, but must also cultivate a kind of emotional detachment towards their own thoughts and feelings, ensuring that the latter do not subjugate the egoist, or make the egoist an instrument of their own realisation. In short, the suggestion here is that an “anti-essentialist perfectionism” survives in this ideal of character, in Stirner’s celebration of the “un-man” and the egoist (Leopold 2019).

2.3 The Egoistic Future

Part Two of The Ego and Its Own is forward-looking and positive. It is forward-looking in that it is concerned with the egoistic future rather than with the ancient or modern worlds. And it is positive in that it aims to establish the possibility that Stirner’s contemporaries can be liberated from the tyranny of religion.

Stirner’s account of the developing historical relationship between the individual and society is advanced in a series of parallels which are designed to portray egoism as the embodiment of a more advanced civilisation. At one point, he takes the early modern idea of a social contract, in which progress traditionally consists of a move from an atomistic state of nature to a communal civil society, and neatly inverts it. It is membership of society, and not individual isolation, Stirner suggests, which is humankind’s “state of nature” (271); that is, an early and problematic stage of development whose inadequacies are, in due course, outgrown. Elsewhere, he describes the developing relationship between the individual and society as analogous to that between a mother and her child. As the individual (the child) develops a mature preference for a less suffocating environment, they must throw off the claims of society (the mother) which seeks to maintain them in a subordinate position. In both cases, Stirner draws the lesson that the individual must move from social to egoistic relationships in order to escape subjection.

What is meant by “egoism”, however, is not always clear. Stirner is occasionally portrayed as a psychological egoist, that is, as a proponent of the descriptive claim that all (intentional) actions are motivated by a concern for the self-interest of the agent. However, this characterisation of Stirner’s position can be questioned. Not least, The Ego and Its Own is structured around the opposition between egoistic and non-egoistic modes of experience. Indeed, he appears to hold that non-egoistic modes of experience have predominated historically (in the epochs of realism and idealism). Moreover, at one point, Stirner appears explicitly to consider adopting the explanatory stance of psychological egoism only to reject it. In a discussion of a young woman who sacrifices her love for another in order to respect the wishes of her family, Stirner remarks that an observer might be tempted to maintain that selfishness has still prevailed in this case since the woman clearly preferred the wishes of her family to the attractions of her suitor. However, Stirner rejects this hypothetical explanation, insisting that, provided “the pliable girl were conscious of having left her self-will unsatisfied and humbly subjected herself to a higher power” (197), we should see her actions as governed by piety rather than egoism.

It would also be a mistake to think of Stirner as advocating a normative proposition about the value of self-interested action as ordinarily understood. Stirnerian egoism needs to be distinguished from an individual’s pursuit of conventional self-interest. In The Ego and Its Own, Stirner discusses the important example of an avaricious individual who sacrifices everything in pursuit of material riches. Such an individual is clearly conventionally self-interested (they act only to enrich themselves) but it is an egoism which Stirner rejects as one-sided and narrow. Stirner’s reason for rejecting this form of egoism is instructive. He suggests that the avaricious individual has become enslaved to a single end, and that enslavement is incompatible with egoism properly understood.

Stirnerian egoism is then perhaps best thought of, not in terms of the pursuit of conventional self-interest, but rather as a variety of individual self-rule or autonomy. Egoism properly understood is to be identified with what Stirner calls “ownness [Eigenheit]”, a type of autonomy which is incompatible with any suspension, whether voluntary or forced, of individual judgement. “I am my own”, Stirner writes, “only when I am master of myself, instead of being mastered … by anything else” (153). As previously noted, this Stirnerian ideal of self-rule has external and internal dimensions, requiring not only that we avoid subordinating ourselves (externally) to others, but also that we escape (internally) being “dragged along” (56) by our own appetites. In short, Stirner not only rejects the legitimacy of any subordination to the will of another but also recommends that individuals cultivate an ideal of emotional detachment towards their own appetites and projects.

Judged against this account of egoism, characterisations of Stirner as a “nihilist”—in the sense that he rejects all normative judgement—would also appear to be mistaken. The popular but doubtful description of Stirner as a “nihilist” is encouraged by his explicit rejection of morality. Morality, on Stirner’s account, involves the positing of obligations to behave in certain fixed ways towards others. As a result, he rejects morality as incompatible with egoism properly understood. However, this rejection of morality is not grounded in the rejection of values as such, but in the affirmation of what might be called the non-moral good of autonomy. That is, Stirner allows that there are actions and desires which, although not moral in his sense (because they do not involve obligations to others), are nonetheless to be assessed positively. Stirner is clearly committed to the non-nihilistic view that certain kinds of character and modes of behaviour (namely autonomous individuals and actions) are to be valued above all others. His conception of morality is, in this respect, a narrow one, and his rejection of the legitimacy of moral claims is not to be confused with a denial of the propriety of all normative or ethical judgement. There is, as a result, no inconsistency in Stirner’s frequent use of an explicitly evaluative vocabulary, as when, for example, he praises the egoist for having the “courage” (265) to lie, or condemns the “weakness” (197) of the individual who succumbs to pressure from their family.

Two features of Stirner’s position emerge as fundamental. First, he values “ownness” not as one good amongst many, but as the most important good, a good which trumps all others. Second, he adopts an account of self-rule which is incompatible with the existence of any legitimate obligations to others, even those which an individual has voluntarily undertaken; thereby rejecting perhaps the most familiar (contractual) way of reconciling individual autonomy with the existence of binding obligations. In short, Stirner appears to value individual self-rule above all else, and he interprets that individual self-rule in a stringent and idiosyncratic manner.

2.4 Some Consequences of Egoism

The consequences of Stirner’s position look extreme and far-reaching. As the example of morality already suggests, egoists are likely to find themselves in conflict with some cherished social institutions and practices. Stirner consistently associates (non-egoistic) society with relationships of “belonging”, which he treats as involving the subjugation of individuals. For example, he maintains that “the forming of family ties binds a man” (102). Stirner never seriously considers the possibility that belonging might, at least potentially or in some cases, have more positive associations; for example, of being at home or of feeling secure. Confronted with the conflict between egoism and “society”, Stirner is not prompted to re-examine his commitment to, or understanding of, self-rule, but instead confidently denies the legitimacy of those conventional institutions and practices. Two examples of this radical response may noted here.

On Stirner’s account, there is a necessary antipathy between the egoistic individual and the state. This inevitable hostility is based on the conflict between Stirner’s conception of autonomy and any obligation to obey the law. “Own will and the state”, he writes, “are powers in deadly hostility, between which no ‘perpetual peace’ is possible” (175). Since self-rule is incompatible with, and valued more highly than, any obligation to obey the law, Stirner rejects the legitimacy of political obligation. Note that this rejection stands irrespective of the foundation of that political obligation, and whatever the form of the state. “Every state”, Stirner insists, “is a despotism, be the despot one or many” (175). Even in the hypothetical case of a direct democracy in which a collective decision had been made unanimously, Stirner denies that the egoist would be bound by the result. To be bound today by “my will of yesterday”, he maintains, would be to turn my “creature”, that is “a particular expression of will”, into my “commander”; it would be to freeze my will, and Stirner denies that “because I was a fool yesterday I must remain such” (175).

Promise-keeping is another early victim of this commitment to, and understanding of, self-rule. Stirner associates the institution of promising with illegitimate constraint, since the requirement that duly made promises be kept is incompatible with his understanding of individual autonomy. Stirner rejects any general obligation to keep promises as just another attempt to bind the individual. The egoist, he suggests, must embrace the heroism of the lie, and be willing to break even his own word “in order to determine himself instead of being determined” (210). Note that Stirner’s enthusiasm for lying excludes those who break their word in the service of some larger goal — as Luther, for example, became unfaithful to his monastic vows for God’s sake — and is reserved only for those individuals who are willing to break their word for their own sake.

As well as a negative account of the institutions and practices that egoists must reject as incompatible with autonomy, The Ego and Its Own also contains some positive suggestions about the possible shape of egoistic relationships which do not conflict with individual self-rule. In particular, Stirner provides a brief sketch of what he calls the “union of egoists [Verein von Egoisten]” (161).

The egoistic future is said to consist not of wholly isolated individuals but rather in relationships of “uniting”, that is, in impermanent connections between individuals who themselves remain independent and self-determining. The central feature of the resulting “union of egoists” is that it does not involve the subordination of the individual. The union is “a son and co-worker” (273) of autonomy, a constantly shifting alliance which enables individuals to unite without loss of sovereignty, without swearing allegiance to anyone else’s “flag” (210). This union of egoists constitutes a purely instrumental association whose good is solely the advantage that the individuals concerned may derive for the pursuit of their individual goals; there are no shared final ends and the association is not valued in itself. In his reply to “Stirner’s Critics”, he imagines two pleasingly familiar street scenes to illustrate this model of egoistic union: in the first, children happen upon each other and spontaneously engage in the “comradeship of play [Spielkameradschaft]”; and, in the second, Moses Hess (one of the critics in question) bumps into friends before all decide to adjourn for a drink, not out of loyalty, but in the expectation of pleasure (Stirner 1914: 295–6).

Stirner sometimes seems torn as how best to elucidate this basic account of egoistic social relations. At least, in The Ego and Its Own, his elaboration of egoistic relations can appear to equivocate between: on the one hand, downplaying the social and psychological impact of a shift to egoistic relationships, and on the other hand, acknowledging and defending the dramatic and perturbing consequences of such a move.

In the first, and less predominant, of these moods, Stirner strives to moderate the suggestion that his views might have radical and unforeseen consequences. More precisely, he suggests that certain familiar and worthwhile relationships — such as “love” — can continue into the egoistic future. This suggestion is presumably aimed at making that egoistic future appear less disruptive and more attractive, not least to those attached to these familiar and worthwhile relationships.

That said, it is far from certain that all of the relevant relationships would survive intact from their reincarnation in egoistic form. Consider, for example, Stirner’s contrast between two different kinds of love: the “bad case” where “ownness” is sacrificed, and the good case of egoistic love in which self-rule is retained. Egoistic love allows the individual to deny themself something in order to enhance the pleasure of another, but only because their own pleasure is enhanced as a result. The object of egoistic love, in other words, remains the individual themself. The egoist will not sacrifice their autonomy and interests to another, but rather loves only as long as “love makes me happy” (258). At one point, Stirner characterises this relationship as one in which the individual “enjoys” the other (258). The description is a revealing one, since enjoying another person and loving them would appear to be rather different matters. Loving another person in the conventional (and non-egoistic) sense might be thought to include the desire to promote the welfare of that person, even when it is not in our interests, or when it conflicts with our own wants and happiness. In this respect, it stands at some distance from Stirner’s account of egoistic love. The point here is not a terminological one—Stirner rightly cares little whether we call egoistic love “love” and “hence stick to the old sound” (261) or whether we invent a new vocabulary—but rather that a world without this experience would be an unfamiliar and impoverished one. Stirner has not obviously succeeded in establishing that this particular familiar and worthwhile relationship would survive reestablishment on egoistic premises. (For a more positive verdict, see Cleary 2015.)

In the second, and more predominant, of these moods, Stirner celebrates the radical and unfamiliar consequences of adopting an egoistic order. Indeed, in places, he seems to revel in the clam that his views have startling consequences from which few of his readers will take any solace. This is one of the sources of the melodramatic and provocative tone that permeates many parts of The Ego and Its Own.

Stirner describes the appropriate relation between the egoist and their objects — which include, of course, other persons as well as things — as a property relation. The egoist properly stands in a relation of “ownership” to the wider world. This notion of “egoistic property” is not to be confused with more familiar juridical concepts of ownership (such as private property or collective ownership). These more familiar forms of property rest on notions of right, and involve claims to exclusivity or constraints on use, which Stirner rejects. Egoistic property is rather constituted by the “unlimited dominion” (223) of individuals over the world, by which Stirner appears to mean that there are no moral constraints on how an individual might relate to these persons and things. Stirner sometimes describes the resulting association between people as involving relationships “of utility, of use” (263). The egoist, he suggests, views others as “nothing but—my food, even as I am fed upon and turned to use by you” (263). Stirner embraces the stark consequences of this rejection of any general obligation towards others, insisting, for example, that the egoist does not renounce “even the power over life and death” (282). Over the course of the book, Stirner variously declines to condemn the officer’s widow who strangles her child (281), the man who treats his sister “as wife also” (45), and the murderer who no longer fears his act as a “wrong” (169). In a world in which “we owe each other nothing” (263), it seems that acts of infanticide, incest, and murder, might all turn out to be justified.

At one point, Stirner acknowledges that few readers of The Ego and Its Own will draw any comfort from this vision of an egoistic future, but insists that the welfare of this audience is not of any interest to him. Indeed, Stirner suggests that, if he had been motivated by a concern for others, then he would have had to conceal rather than propagate his ideas. As it is, Stirner maintains that even if he had believed that these ideas would lead to the “bloodiest wars and the fall of many generations” (263) he would still have disseminated them.

3. Stirner’s Influence

At the time of his death, Stirner’s brief period of notoriety was long over, his book had been out of print for several years, and there was little sign that his life or work might have any longer term impact.

However, in the years since, The Ego and Its Own has been translated into at least eight languages, and appeared in over one hundred editions. Stirner and his work have been associated with a huge variety of causes, including many of which he would have been unaware. Stirner has been variously characterised as: a left-Hegelian; a petit-bourgeois ideologue; a solipsist; a nihilist; the first poststructuralist; an existentialist; an individualist anarchist; a proto right libertarian; a fascist; and as simply insane (Blumenfeld 2018: 5–10). Interest in the connections between Stirner and other thinkers — both philosophical affinity and historical influence — are also strikingly varied. For example, at the beginning of the twentieth century, Stirner was frequently portrayed as a precursor of Friedrich Nietzsche (1844–1900), as having anticipated, if not influenced — it is far from certain that Nietzsche had read any Stirner — both the style and substance of Nietzsche’s work (Carus 1914: 74–99). In the 1960s and early 1970s, Stirner was rediscovered as a forerunner of existentialism, whose anti-essentialist concept of the self as a ‘creative nothing’ was portrayed as having affinities with the notion of human nature employed by Jean-Paul Sartre (1905–1980) (Paterson 1971). More recently, Stirner has been identified as a nascent poststructuralist; linked not least with Gilles Deleuze (1925–1995), who also rejects the idea of a universal human nature, employs a genealogical critique of humanist discourses of power and identity, and opposes various forms of state-centric thought (Newman 2009, and Feiten 2019). These parallels can be plausible and interesting, although the sceptic might wonder whether they don’t track intellectual fashion as much as they illuminate aspects of Stirner’s own thought.

Stirner’s most significant historical influence is perhaps threefold.

First, The Ego and Its Own had a destructive impact on the confidence and coherence of Left-Hegelianism. Stirner’s insistence that his radical Hegelian contemporaries had failed to break with religious modes of thought prompted most of the leading left-Hegelians to defend their own work in public against this attack. In perhaps the most important of these replies, Feuerbach — who appeared defensive and irritated (he suspected Stirner of trying to make his name at Feuerbach’s own expense) — was widely seen as struggling to maintain a besieged and outdated position. Bruno Bauer also offered a critical response, seeking to defend his own philosophy of self-consciousness against what he saw as Stirner’s inadequate form of subjectivity (Moggach and de Ridder, 2013). Stirner replied directly to three of these left-Hegelian reviews — the defence of Bauer’s “humane liberalism” by “Szeliga” (the pseudonym of Franz Zychlinski (1816–1900)); the defence of socialism by Moses Hess; and the defence of Feuerbach by Feuerbach himself — in an article entitled “Stirner’s Critics” (1845). In this confident rejoinder, Stirner reiterated some of the central themes of The Ego and Its Own and clarified the character of his own commitment to egoism. Stirner may also have provided a final reply to contemporary critics in a pseudonymous article entitled “The Philosophical Reactionaries”, in which the author responds to a young Kuno Fischer. (The caution is needed since the identification of “G. Edward” as Max Stirner is plausible but not incontrovertible.)

Second, Stirner’s work played a related and significant role in the evolution of the thought of Karl Marx. The latter was a contemporary associate of Bauer and his entourage, and was mentioned indirectly in a footnote in The Ego and Its Own. (Stirner’s footnote treats Marx as a minor, if radical, Feuerbachian.) Between 1845 and 1847, Marx collaborated with Friedrich Engels (1820–1895) on a group of manuscripts now usually called The German Ideology, which included a fierce and sustained attack on their erstwhile philosophical contemporaries. Most of these texts were not published at the time, and it was 1932 before this critical engagement with the work of Bauer, Feuerbach, and Stirner, appeared fully in print. The account of Stirner contained in the so-called The German Ideology takes up over three hundred pages of the published text — abridged editions have been known to omit much of this dense but fascinating material — and, although Marx is remorselessly critical of Stirner’s position, it scarcely follows that The Ego and Its Own was without influence on the former’s ideas. Not least, Stirner’s book appears to have been decisive: in motivating Marx’s break with the work of Feuerbach (whose considerable influence on many of Marx’s earlier writings is readily apparent); in making Marx reconsider the role that concepts of human nature should play in social and political philosophy; and in forcing Marx to think much more clearly about whether, and in what ways, communism should be individualistic.

Third, and finally, Stirner’s best-known work later became one of the founding texts of the political tradition of individualist anarchism. The affinity between Stirner and the anarchist tradition lies in his endorsement of the claim that the state is an illegitimate institution. His elaboration of this claim is an interesting and distinctive one (Leopold 2006). For Stirner, a state can never be legitimate, since there is a necessary conflict between individual self-rule and the obligation to obey the law (which stirner equates with the legitimacy of the state). Given that individual self-rule trumps any competing consideration, Stirner concludes that the demands of the state are not binding on the individual. However, he does not think that individuals have, as a result, any general obligation to oppose and attempt to eliminate the state (insofar as this is within their power). Rather the individual should decide in each particular case whether or not to go along with the state’s demands. Only in cases where there is a conflict between the autonomy of the egoist and the demands of the state, does Stirner recommend seeking to evade the requirements of law. That said, whilst individuals have no duty to overthrow the state, Stirner does think that the state will eventually collapse as a result of the wider spread of egoism. The cumulative effect of a growing egoistic disrespect for law, he suggests, would be to “scuttle” the “ship of state” (54). Anarchists influenced by Stirner’s individualism and his suspicion of the state can be found in many countries. In Great Britain, for example, his ideas influenced Dora Marsden (1882–1960), and her journals The New Freewoman and The Egoist. In America, James L Walker (1845–1904), author of The Philosophy of Egoism was interested in, and influenced by, Stirner’s thought, although his best-known anarchist admirers in America were in the circle around Benjamin R. Tucker (1854–1939) and the remarkable journal Liberty (founded in 1881). (For a defence of the claim that Stirner, Marsden, Tucker, and others share a theoretical framework, see Welsh 2010.) However close the connections here, it has often been individualist anarchists who have proved most effective at keeping Stirner’s ideas available, producing and distributing many of the editions and translations of his work.

Stirner is unlikely to have regretted these various disputes about the nature and influence of The Ego and Its Own. In considering some diverse interpretative accounts of the Bible, Stirner declines to adjudicate between the judgement of the child who plays with the book, the Inca emperor Atahualpa (c.1502–1533) who threw it away when it failed to speak to him, the priest who praises it as the word of God, and the critic who dissects it as a purely human invention. The plurality of interpretations of his own work might similarly have amused Stirner and encouraged him in his view that there could be no legitimate constraints on the meaning of a text. Stirner certainly appears relaxed about the proper interpretation of his own work. He insists that he wrote only to procure an existence in the world for his thoughts, adding that what subsequently happened to those ideas “is your affair and does not trouble me” (263).


Works by Stirner

  • Der Einzige und sein Eigentum, Stuttgart: Philipp Reclam, 1972. (A modern edition of Stirner’s best-known work.)
  • Max Stirner’s Kleinere Schriften und seine Entgegnungen auf die Kritik seines Werkes “Der Einzige und sein Eigentum”. Aus den Jahren 1842–1848, edited by J.H. Mackay, second revised edition, Berlin: Bernhard Zack, 1914. (An extensive collection of Stirner’s lesser writings.)
  • Parerga Kritiken Repliken, edited by Bernd A. Laska, Nürnberg: LSR, 1986. (A modern selection of Stirner’s lesser writings.)

Works by Stirner in English Translation

  • The False Principle of Our Education, edited by James J. Martin, Colorado Springs: Ralph Myles, 1967. (An 1842 article on pedagogy.)
  • “Art and Religion”, Lawrence S. Stepelevich (edited), The Young Hegelians. An Anthology, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1983, 327–334. (An 1842 article discussing Hegelian accounts of its titular subjects.)
  • “On B. Bauer’s Trumpet of the Last Judgement”, translated and introduced by Lawrence S. Stepelevich, in Stepelevich 2021: 188–197. (An 1842 review of Bruno Bauer’s pamphlet.)
  • “The Free Ones”, translated and introduced by Lawrence S. Stepelevich, in Stepelevich 2021: 169–174. (An 1842 article on the eponymous Berlin group.)
  • “The Mysteries of Paris by Eugène Sue”, translated and introduced by Lawrence S. Stepelevich, in Stepelevich 2021: 174–188. (An 1844 review of Sue’s novel.)
  • The Ego and Its Own, edited and introduced by David Leopold, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995. (A thoroughly-annotated English edition of Stirner’s best-known work, first published in 1844, as translated by Steven T. Byington in 1907.)
  • The Unique and Its Property, a new translation, with introduction, by Wolfi Landstreicher, n.p.: Underworld Amusements, 2017. (A modern translation of Stirner’s best-known work.)
  • “Stirner’s Critics”, The Philosophical Forum, 8 (1978): 66–80. (A partial translation of Stirner’s 1845 response to critics, covering only his reply to Feuerbach.)
  • Stirner’s Critics, translated by Wolfi Landstreicher, introduced by Jason McQuinn, Berkeley: LBC Books, 2012. (A complete translation of this important text from 1845.)
  • “The Philosophical Reactionaries: ‘The Modern Sophists’ by Kuno Fisher”, translated and introduced by Widukind De Ridder, in Newman (ed.) 2011: 89–109. (A late text from 1847 which is cautiously, and not uncontroversially, attributed to Stirner.)

Secondary Literature

  • Blake, Trevor, 2016, Max Stirner Bibliography. One Hundred Years of Criticism, Portland: OVO. (Updates appearing in the periodical Der Geist. The Journal of Egoism from 1845 to 1945.)
  • Blumenfeld, Jacob, 2018, All Things are Nothing to Me. The Unique Philosophy of Max Stirner, Washington: Zero Books.
  • Brobjer, Thomas H., 2003, “A Possible Solution to the Stirner-Nietzsche Question”, Journal of Nietzsche Studies, 25: 109–114.
  • Carroll, John, 1974, Break-Out from the Crystal Palace. The Anarcho-Psychological Critique: Stirner, Nietzsche, Dostoevsky, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.
  • Carus, Paul, 1914, Nietzsche and Other Exponents of Individualism, Chicago: Open Court.
  • Clark, John P, 1976, Max Stirner’s Egoism, London: Freedom Press.
  • Cleary, Skye, 2015, “Max Stirner and Loving Egoistically”, Existentialism and Romantic Love, New York: Palgrave, 21–44.
  • De Ridder, Widukind, 2008, “Max Stirner, Hegel, and the Young Hegelians: A Reassessment”, History of European Ideas, 34(3): 285–297.
  • Feiten, Elmo, 2013, “Would the Real Max Stirner Please Stand Up?”, Anarchist Developments in Cultural Studies, 22(1): 117–137.
  • –––, 2019, “Deleuze and Stirner: Ties, Tensions, and Rifts”, Chantelle Gray Van Heerden and Aragorn Eloff (edited), Deleuze and Anarchism, Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.
  • Glassford, John, 1999, “Did Friedrich Nietzsche Plagiarise from Max Stirner?”, Journal of Nietzsche Studies, 18: 73–79.
  • Helms, Hans G., 1966, Die Ideologie der anonymen Gesellschaft. Max Stirner ‘Einziger’ und der Fortschritt des demokratischen Selbstbewußtseins vom Vormärz bis zur Bundesrepublik, Köln: Du Mont Schauberg. (Contains an excellent bibliography.)
  • Jenkins, John, 2009, “Max Stirner’s Egoism”, Heythrop Journal, 50(2): 243–256.
  • –––, 2014, “Max Stirner’s Ontology”, International Journal of Philosophical Studies, 22(1): 3–26.
  • Koch, Andrew M., 1997, “Max Stirner: The Last Hegelian or the First Poststructuralist”, Anarchist Studies, 5: 95–108.
  • Laska, Bernd A., 1996, Ein dauerhafter Dissident. 150 Jahre Stirners ‘Einziger’. Eine kurze Wirkungsgeschichte, Nürnberg: LSR-Verlag.
  • Lobkowicz, Nicholas, 1969, “Karl Marx and Max Stirner”, Frederick J. Adelmann (edited), Demythologising Marxism, The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 64–95.
  • Leopold, David, 1995, “Introduction”, Max Stirner, The Ego and Its Own, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. xi-xxxii.
  • –––, 2006, “The State and I: Max Stirner’s Anarchism”, Douglas Moggach (ed.), The New Hegelians. Politics and Philosophy in the Hegelian School, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 176–199.
  • –––, 2011, “A Solitary Life”, in S. Newman (ed.), Max Stirner, London: Palgrave Macmillan, 21–42.
  • –––, 2019, “The Non-Essentialist Perfectionism of Max Stirner”, in Michael Quante, Douglas Moggach, and Nadine Mooren (eds.), Perfectionismus der Autonomie, Munich: Wilhelm Fink, 269–289.
  • Löwith, Karl, 1941, From Hegel to Nietzsche. The Revolution in Nineteenth Century Thought, London: Constable; first published in German in 1941.
  • Mackay, John Henry, 1914, Max Stirner. Sein Leben und sein Werk, Berlin, second edition.
  • Martin, James J., 1953, Men Against the State. The Expositors of individualist Anarchism in America, 1827–1908, DeKalb, Illinois: Adrian Allen.
  • Maruhn, Jürgen, 1982, Die Kritik an der Stirnerschen Ideologie im Werk von Karl Marx und Friedrich Engels, Frankfurt: R.G. Fischer.
  • Marx, Karl and Friedrich Engels, 1846, The German Ideology, in Marx-Engels Collected Works (Volume 5), London: Lawrence and Wishart, 1976.
  • Moggach, Douglas, and Widukind De Ridder, 2013 “Hegelianism in Restoration Prussia, 1841–1848: Humanism and ‘Anti-Humanism’ in Young Hegelian Thought”, Lisa Herzog (ed.), Hegel’s Thought in Europe, London: Palgrave Macmillan, chapter 4.
  • Newman, Saul, 2009, “Empiricism, Pluralism, and Politics in Deleuze and Stirner”, Idealistic Studies, 33(1): 9–24.
  • ––– (ed.), 2011, Max Stirner, London: Palgrave Macmillan.
  • –––, 2019, “‘Ownness Created a New Freedom’: Max Stirner’s Alternative Concept of Liberty”, Critical Review of International Social and Political Philosophy, 22(2): 155–75.
  • Paterson, R.W.K., 1971, The Nihilistic Egoist: Max Stirner, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Schiereck, Larry Alan, 2018, Max Stirner’s Egoism and Nihilism, n.p.: Underworld Amusements.
  • Stepelevich, Lawrence S., 1978, “Max Stirner and Ludwig Feuerbach”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 39: 451–463.
  • –––, 1985, “Max Stirner as Hegelian”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 46: 597–614.
  • –––, 2021, Max Stirner on the Path of Doubt, Lanham, MD: Lexington Books.
  • Thomas, Paul, 1980, Karl Marx and the Anarchists, London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, chapter 3.
  • Tucker, Benjamin R., 2002, Instead of a Book. By a Man Too Busy to Write One. A Fragmentary Exposition of Philosophical Anarchism, culled from the writings of Benj. R. Tucker, New York: Haskell House.
  • Welsh, John F., 2010, Max Stirner’s Dialectical Egoism: A New Interpretation, Lanham, MD: Lexington Books.
  • Whyman, Tom, 2022, “Egoism and Class Consciousness, or: Why Marx and Engels Wrote So Much About Stirner”, Hegel Bulletin, first online 18 July 2022. doi:10.1017/hgl.2022.11
  • Wood, A., 2014, “Marx on Equality,” in Chapter 11 of A. Wood, The Free Development of Each, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 265–267.

Other Internet Resources

Copyright © 2023 by
David Leopold <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free