First published Tue Oct 3, 2017

Anarchism is a political theory, which is skeptical of the justification of authority and power, especially political power. Anarchism is usually grounded in moral claims about the importance of individual liberty. Anarchists also offer a positive theory of human flourishing, based upon an ideal of non-coercive consensus building. Anarchism has inspired practical efforts at establishing utopian communities, radical and revolutionary political agendas, and various forms of direct action. This entry primarily describes “philosophical anarchism”: it focuses on anarchism as a theoretical idea and not as a form of political activism. While philosophical anarchism describes a skeptical theory of political legitimation, anarchism is also a concept that has been employed in philosophical and literary theory to describe a sort of anti-foundationalism. Philosophical anarchism can mean either a theory of political life that is skeptical of attempts to justify state authority or a philosophical theory that is skeptical of the attempt to assert firm foundations for knowledge.

1. Varieties of Anarchism

There are various forms of anarchism. Uniting this variety is the general critique of centralized, hierarchical power and authority. Given that authority, centralization, and hierarchy show up in various ways and in different discourses, institutions, and practices, it is not surprising that the anarchist critique has been applied in diverse ways.

1.1 Political Anarchism

Anarchism is primarily understood as a skeptical theory of political legitimation. The term anarchism is derived from the negation of the Greek term arché, which means first principle, foundation, or ruling power. Anarchy is thus rule by no one or non-rule. Some argue that non-ruling occurs when there is rule by all—with consensus or unanimity providing an optimistic goal (see Depuis-Déri 2010).

Political anarchists focus their critique on state power, viewing centralized, monopolistic coercive power as illegitimate. Anarchists thus criticize “the state”. Bakunin provides a paradigm historical example, saying:

If there is a State, there must be domination of one class by another and, as a result, slavery; the State without slavery is unthinkable—and this is why we are the enemies of the State. (Bakunin 1873 [1990: 178])

A more recent example comes from Gerard Casey who writes, “states are criminal organizations. All states, not just the obviously totalitarian or repressive ones” (Casey 2012: 1).

Such sweeping generalizations are difficult to support. Thus anarchism as political philosophy faces the challenge of specificity. States have been organized in various ways. Political power is not monolithic. Sovereignty is a complicated matter that includes divisions and distributions of power (see Fiala 2015). Moreover, the historical and ideological context of a given anarchist’s critique makes a difference in the content of the political anarchist’s critique. Bakunin was responding primarily to a Marxist and Hegelian view of the state, offering his critique from within the global socialist movement; Casey is writing in the Twenty-First Century in the era of liberalism and globalization, offering his critique from within the movement of contemporary libertarianism. Some anarchists engage in broad generalizations, aiming for a total critique of political power. Others will present a localized critique of a given political entity. An ongoing challenge for those who would seek to understand anarchism is to realize how historically and ideologically diverse approaches fit under the general anarchist umbrella. We look at political anarchism in detail below.

1.2 Religious Anarchism

The anarchist critique has been extended toward the rejection of non-political centralization and authority. Bakunin extended his critique to include religion, arguing against both God and the State. Bakunin rejected God as the absolute master, saying famously, “if God really existed, it would be necessary to abolish him” (Bakunin 1882 [1970: 28]).

There are, however, religious versions of anarchism, which critique political authority from a standpoint that takes religion seriously. Rapp (2012) has shown how anarchism can be found in Taoism. And Ramnath (2011) has identified anarchist threads in Islamic Sufism, in Hindu bhakti movements, in Sikhism’s anti-caste efforts, and in Buddhism. We consider anarchism in connection with Gandhi below. But we focus here on Christian anarchism.

Christian anarchist theology views the kingdom of God as lying beyond any human principle of structure or order. Christian anarchists offer an anti-clerical critique of ecclesiastical and political power. Tolstoy provides an influential example. Tolstoy claims that Christians have a duty not to obey political power and to refuse to swear allegiance to political authority (see Tolstoy 1894). Tolstoy was also a pacifist. Christian anarcho-pacifism views the state as immoral and unsupportable because of its connection with military power (see Christoyannopoulos 2011). But there are also non-pacifist Christian anarchists. Berdyaev, for example, builds upon Tolstoy and in his own interpretation of Christian theology. Berdyaev concludes: “The Kingdom of God is anarchy” (Berdyaev 1940 [1944: 148]).

Christian anarchists have gone so far as to found separatist communities where they live apart from the structures of the state. Notable examples include New England transcendentalists such as William Garrison and Adin Ballou. These transcendentalists had an influence on Tolstoy (see Perry 1973 [1995]).

Other notable Christians with anarchist sympathies include Peter Maurin and Dorothy Day of the Catholic Worker movement. In more recent years, Christian anarchism has been defended by Jacques Ellul who links Christian anarchism to a broad social critique. In addition to being pacifistic, Ellul says, Christian anarchism should also be “antinationalist, anticapitalist, moral, and antidemocratic” (Ellul 1988 [1991: 13]). The Christian anarchist ought to be committed to “a true overturning of authorities of all kinds” (Ellul 1988 [1991: 14]). When asked whether a Christian anarchist should vote, Ellul says no. He states, “anarchy first implies conscientious objection” (Ellul 1988 [1991: 15]).

1.3 Theoretical Anarchism

Anarchist rejection of authority has application in epistemology and in philosophical and literary theory. One significant usage of the term shows up in American pragmatism. William James described his pragmatist philosophical theory as a kind of anarchism: “A radical pragmatist is a happy-go-lucky anarchistic sort of creature” (James 1907 [1981: 116]). James had anarchist sympathies, connected to a general critique of systematic philosophy (see Fiala 2013b). Pragmatism, like other anti-systematic and post-Hegelian philosophies, gives up on the search for an arché or foundation.

Anarchism thus shows up as a general critique of prevailing methods. An influential example is found in the work of Paul Feyerabend, whose Against Method provides an example of “theoretical anarchism” in epistemology and philosophy of science (Feyerabend 1975 [1993]). Feyerabend explains:

Science is an essentially anarchic enterprise: theoretical anarchism is more humanitarian and more likely to encourage progress than its law-and-order alternatives. (Feyerabend 1975 [1993: 9])

His point is that science ought not be constrained by hierarchically imposed principles and strict rule following.

Post-structuralism and trends in post-modernism and Continental philosophy can also be anarchistic (see May 1994). So-called “post-anarchism” is a decentered and free-flowing discourse that deconstructs power, questions essentialism, and undermines systems of authority. Following upon the deconstructive and critical work of authors such as Derrida, Deleuze, Foucault, and others, this critique of the arché goes all the way down. If there is no arché or foundation, then we are left with a proliferation of possibilities. Emerging trends in globalization, cyber-space, and post-humanism make the anarchist critique of “the state” more complicated, since anarchism’s traditional celebration of liberty and autonomy can be critically scrutinized and deconstructed (see Newman 2016).

Traditional anarchists were primarily interested in sustained and focused political activism that led toward the abolition of the state. The difference between free-flowing post-anarchism and traditional anarchism can be seen in the realm of morality. Anarchism has traditionally been critical of centralized moral authority—but this critique was often based upon fundamental principles and traditional values, such as autonomy or liberty. But post-structuralism—along with critiques articulated by some feminists, critical race theorists, and critics of Eurocentrism—calls these values and principles into question.

1.4 Applied Anarchisms

The broad critical framework provided by the anarchist critique of authority provides a useful theory or methodology for social critique. In more recent iterations, anarchism has been used to critique gender hierarchies, racial hierarchies, and the like—also including a critique of human domination over nature. Thus anarchism also includes, to name a few varieties: anarcha-feminism or feminist anarchism (see Kornegger 1975), queer anarchism or anarchist queer theory (see Daring et al. 2010), green anarchism or eco-anarchism also associated with anarchist social ecology (see Bookchin 1971 [1986]), and even anarcho-veganism or “veganarchism” (see Nocella, White, & Cudworth 2015). In the anarcho-vegan literature we find the following description of a broad and inclusive anarchism:

Anarchism is a socio-political theory which opposes all systems of domination and oppression such as racism, ableism, sexism, anti-LGBTTQIA, ageism, sizeism, government, competition, capitalism, colonialism, imperialism and punitive justice, and promotes direct democracy, collaboration, interdependence, mutual aid, diversity, peace, transformative justice and equity. (Nocella et al. 2015: 7)

A thorough-going anarchism would thus offer a critique of anything and everything that smacks of hierarchy, domination, centralization, and unjustified authority.

Anarchists who share these various commitments often act upon their critique of authority by engaging in nonconformist practices (free love, nudism, gender disruption, and so on) or by forming intentional communities that live “off the grid” and outside of the norms of mainstream culture. In extreme forms this becomes anarcho-primitivism or anti-civilizational anarchism (see Zerzan 2008, 2010; Jensen 2006). Alternative anarchist societies have existed in religious communes in post-Reformation Europe and in the early United States, in Nineteenth Century American utopian communities, the hippy communes of the Twentieth Century, anarchist squats, temporary autonomous zones (see Bey 1985), and occasional gatherings of like-minded people.

Given this sort of antinomianism and non-conformism it is easy to see that anarchism also often includes a radical critique of traditional ethical norms and principles. Thus radical ethical anarchism can be contrasted with what we might call bourgeois anarchism (with radical anarchism seeking to disrupt traditional social norms and bourgeois anarchism seeking freedom from the state that does not seek such disruption). And although some argue that anarchists are deeply ethical—committed to liberty and solidarity—others will argue that anarchists are moral nihilists who reject morality entirely or who at least reject the idea that there could be a single source of moral authority (see essays in Franks & Wilson 2010).

2. Anarchism in Political Philosophy

Anarchism in political philosophy maintains that there is no legitimate political or governmental authority. In political philosophy anarchy is an important topic for consideration—even for those who are not anarchists—as the a-political background condition against which various forms of political organization are arrayed, compared, and justified. Anarchy is often viewed by non-anarchists as the unhappy or unstable condition in which there is no legitimate authority. Anarchism as a philosophical idea is not necessarily connected to practical activism. There are political anarchists who take action in order to destroy what they see as illegitimate states. The popular imagination often views anarchists as bomb-throwing nihilists. But philosophical anarchism is a theoretical standpoint. In order to decide who (and whether) one should act upon anarchist insight, we require a further theory of political action, obligation, and obedience grounded in further ethical reflection. Simmons explains that philosophical anarchists “do not take the illegitimacy of states to entail a strong moral imperative to oppose or eliminate states” (Simmons 2001: 104). Some anarchists remain obedient to ruling authorities; others revolt or resist in various ways. The question of action depends upon a theory of what sort of political obligation follows from our philosophical, moral, political, religious, and aesthetic commitments.

2.1 Anarchism in the History of Political Philosophy

There is a long history of political anarchism. In the ancient world, anarchism of a sort can be found in the ideas of the Epicureans and Cynics. Kropotkin makes this point in his 1910 encyclopedia article. Although they did not employ the term anarchism, the Epicureans and Cynics avoided political activity, advising retreat from political life in pursuit of tranquility (ataraxia) and self-control (autarkeai). The Cynics are also known for advocating cosmopolitanism: living without allegiance to any particular state or legal system, while associating with human beings based upon moral principle outside of traditional state structures. Diogenes the Cynic had little respect for political or religious authority. One of his guiding ideas was to “deface the currency”. This meant not only devaluing or destroying monetary currency but also a general rejection of the norms of civilized society (see Marshall 2010: 69). Diogenes often mocked political authorities and failed to offer signs of respect. While Diogenes actively disrespected established norms, Epicurus counseled retreat. He advised living unnoticed and avoiding political life (under the phrase me politeuesthai—which can be understood as an anti-political admonition).

The assumption that anarchy would be unhappy or unstable leads to justifications of political power. In Hobbes’ famous phrase, in the stateless—anarchic—condition of “the state nature” human life would be solitary, poor, nasty, brutish and short. Hobbes’ social contract—as well as other versions of the social contract theory as found for example in Locke or Rousseau—are attempts to explain how and why the political state emerges from out of the anarchic state of nature.

Anarchists respond by claiming that the state tends to produce its own sort of unhappiness: as oppressive, violent, corrupt, and inimical to liberty. Discussions about the social contract thus revolve around the question of whether the state is better than anarchy—or whether states and state-like entities naturally and inevitably emerge from out of the original condition of anarchy. One version of this argument about the inevitable emergence of states (by way of something like an “invisible hand”) is found in Nozick’s influential Anarchy, State, Utopia (1974). While Nozick and other political philosophers take anarchy seriously as a starting point, anarchists will argue that invisible hand arguments of this sort ignore the historical actuality of states, which develop out of a long history of domination, inequality, and oppression. Murray Rothbard has argued against Nozick and social contract theory, saying, “no existing state has been immaculately conceived” (Rothbard 1977: 46). Different versions of the social contract theory, such as we find in John Rawls’s work, view the contract situation as a heuristic device allowing us to consider justice from under “the veil of ignorance”. But anarchists will argue that the idea of the original position does not necessarily lead to the justification of the state—especially given background knowledge about the tendency of states to be oppressive. Crispin Sartwell concludes:

Even accepting more or less all of the assumptions Rawls packs into the original position, it is not clear that the contractors would not choose anarchy. (Sartwell 2008: 83)

The author of the present essay has described anarchism that results from a critique of the social contract tradition as “liberal social contract anarchism” (Fiala 2013a).

An important historical touchstone is William Godwin. Unlike Locke and Hobbes who turned to the social contract to lead us out of the anarchic state of nature, Godwin argued that the resulting governmental power was not necessarily better than anarchy. Locke, of course, allows for revolution when the state becomes despotic. Godwin builds upon that insight. He explained, “we must not hastily conclude that the mischiefs of anarchy are worse than those which government is qualified to produce” (Godwin 1793: bk VII, chap. V, p. 736). He claimed,

It is earnestly to be desired that each man should be wise enough to govern himself, without the intervention of any compulsory restraint; and, since government, even in its best state, is an evil, the object principally to be aimed at is that we should have as little of it as the general peace of human society will permit. (Godwin 1793: bk III, chap. VII, p. 185–6)

Like Rousseau, who praised the noble savage, who was free from social chains until forced into society, Godwin imagined original anarchy developing into the political state, which tended on his view to become despotic. Once the state comes into being, Godwin suggests that despotism is the primary problem since “despotism is as perennial as anarchy is transitory” (Godwin 1793: bk VII, chap. V, p. 736).

Anarchism is often taken to mean that individuals ought to be left alone without any unifying principle or governing power. In some cases anarchism is related to libertarianism (or what is sometimes called “anarcho-capitalism”). But non-rule may also occur when there is unanimity or consensus—and hence no need for external authority or a governing structure of command and obedience. If there were unanimity among individuals, there would be no need for “ruling”, authority, or government. The ideas of unanimity and consensus are associated with the positive conception of anarchism as a voluntary association of autonomous human beings, which promotes communal values. One version of the anarchist ideal imagines the devolution of centralized political authority, leaving us with communes whose organizational structure is open-ended and consensual.

Given this emphasis on communal organization it is not surprising that political anarchism has a close historical association with communism, despite the connection mentioned above with free market capitalism. Authors such as Bakunin, Kropotkin, and Goldman developed their anarchism as a response to Marx and Marxism. One of the first authors to explicitly affirm anarchism, Pierre Proudhon, defended a kind of “communism”, which he understood as being grounded in decentralized associations, communes, and mutual-aid societies. Proudhon thought that private property created despotism. He argued that liberty required anarchy, concluding,

The government of man by man (under whatever name it be disguised) is oppression. Society finds its highest perfection in the union of order with anarchy. (Proudhon 1840 [1876: 286])

Following Proudhon, Bakunin, Kropotkin, and the other so-called “classical anarchists”, anarchism comes to be seen as a focal point for political philosophy and activism.

Let’s turn to a conceptual analysis of different arguments made in defense of anarchism.

2.2 Absolute, Deontological, and a priori Anarchism

Anarchists often make categorical claims to the effect that no state is legitimate or that there can no such thing as a justifiable political state. As an absolute or a priori claim, anarchism holds that all states always and everywhere are illegitimate and unjust. The term “a priori anarchism” is found in Simmons 2001; but it is employed already by Kropotkin in his influential 1910 article on anarchism, where he claims that anarchists are not utopians who argue against the state in a priori fashion (Kropotkin 1927 [2002: 285]). Despite Kropotkin’s claim, some anarchists do offer a priori arguments against the state. This sort of claim rests upon an account of the justification of authority that is usually grounded in some form of deontological moral claim about the importance of individual liberty and a logical claim about the nature of state authority.

One typical and well-known example of this argument is found in the work of Robert Paul Wolff. Wolff indicates that legitimate authority rests upon a claim about the right to command obedience (Wolff 1970). Correlative to this is a duty to obey: one has a duty to obey legitimate authority. As Wolff explains, by appealing to ideas found in Kant and Rousseau, the duty to obey is linked to notions about autonomy, responsibility, and rationality. But for Wolff and other anarchists, the problem is that the state does not have legitimate authority. As Wolff says of the anarchist, “he will never view the commands of the state as legitimate, as having a binding moral force” (Wolff 1970: 16). The categorical nature of this claim indicates a version of absolute anarchism. If the state’s commands are never legitimate and create no moral duty of obedience, then there can never be a legitimate state. Wolff imagines that there could be a legitimate state grounded in “unanimous direct democracy”—but he indicates that unanimous direct democracy would be “so restricted in its application that it offers no serious hope of ever being embodied in an actual state” (Wolff 1970: 55). Wolff concludes:

If all men have a continuing obligation to achieve the highest degree of autonomy possible, then there would appear to be no state whose subjects have a moral obligation to obey its commands. Hence, the concept of a de jure legitimate state would appear to be vacuous, and philosophical anarchism would seem to be the only reasonable political belief for an enlightened man. (Wolff 1970: 17)

As Wolff puts it here, there appears to be “no state” that is legitimate. This claim is stated in absolute and a priori fashion, a point made by Reiman in his critique of Wolff (Reiman 1972). Wolff does not deny, by the way, that there are de facto legitimate states: governments often do have the approval and support of the people they govern. But this approval and support is merely conventional and not grounded in a moral duty; and approval and support are manufactured and manipulated by the coercive power and propaganda and ideology of the state.

We noted here that Wolff’s anarchism is connected to Kant. But Kant is no anarchist: he defended the idea of enlightened republican government in which autonomy would be preserved. Rousseau may be closer to espousing anarchism in some of his remarks—although these are far from systematic (see McLaughlin 2007). Some authors view Rousseau as espousing something close to “a posteriori philosophical anarchism” (see Bertram 2010 [2017])—which we will define in the next section. Among classical political philosophers, we might also consider Locke in connection with “libertarian anarchism” (see Varden 2015) or Locke as offering a theory “on the edge of anarchism”, as Simmons has put it (Simmons 1993). But despite his strong defense of individual rights, the stringent way he describes voluntary consent, and his advocacy of revolution, Locke believes that states can be defended based upon the social contract theory.

Leaving the canonical authors of Western political philosophy aside, the most likely place to find deontological and a priori anarchism is among the Christian anarchists. Of course, most Christians are not anarchists. But those Christians who espouse anarchism usually do so with the absolute, deontological, and a priori claims of the sort made by Tolstoy, Berdyaev, and Ellul—as noted above.

2.3 Contingent, Consequentialist, and a posteriori Anarchism

A less stringent form of anarchism will argue that states could be justified in theory—even though, in practice, no state or very few states are actually legitimate. Contingent anarchism will hold that states in the present configuration of things fail to live up to the standards of their own justification. This is an a posteriori argument (see Simmons 2001) based both in a theoretical account of the justification of the state (for example, the social contract theory of liberal-democratic theory) and in an empirical account of how and why concrete states fail to be justified based upon this theory. The author of the present article has offered a version of this argument based upon the social contract theory, holding that the liberal-democratic social contract theory provides the best theory of the justification of the state, while arguing that very few states actually live up to the promise of the social contract theory (Fiala 2013a).

One version of the contingent anarchist argument focuses on the question of the burden of proof for accounts that would justify political authority. This approach has been articulated by Noam Chomsky, who explains:

[This] is what I have always understood to be the essence of anarchism: the conviction that the burden of proof has to be placed on authority, and that it should be dismantled if that burden cannot be met. Sometimes the burden can be met. (Chomsky 2005: 178)

Chomsky accepts legitimate authority based in ordinary experience: for example, when a grandfather prevents a child from darting out into the street. But state authority is a much more complicated affair. Political relationships are attenuated; there is the likelihood of corruption and self-interest infecting political reality; there are levels and degrees of mediation, which alienate us from the source of political authority; and the rational autonomy of adults is important and fundamental. By focusing on the burden of proof, Chomsky acknowledges that there may be ways to meet the burden of proof for the justification of the state. But he points out that there is a prima facie argument against the state—which is based in a complex historical and empirical account of the role of power, economics, and historical inertia in creating political institutions. He explains:

Such institutions face a heavy burden of proof: it must be shown that under existing conditions, perhaps because of some overriding consideration of deprivation or threat, some form of authority, hierarchy, and domination is justified, despite the prima facie case against it—a burden that can rarely be met. (Chomsky 2005: 174)

Chomsky does not deny that the burden of proof could be met. Rather, his point is that there is a prima facie case against the state, since the burden of proof for the justification of the state is rarely met.

Contingent anarchism is based in consequentialist reasoning, focused on details of historical actuality. Consequentialist anarchism will appeal to utilitarian considerations, arguing that states generally fail to deliver in terms of promoting the happiness of the greater number of people—and more strongly that state power tends to produce unhappiness. The actuality of inequality, classism, elitism, racism, sexism, and other forms of oppression can be used to support an anarchist argument, holding that even thought a few people benefit from state power, a larger majority suffers under it.

There is a significant difference between anarchism that is offered in pursuit of utilitarianism’s greater happiness ideal and anarchism that is offered in defense of the minority against the tyranny of the majority. As we shall see in the next section, individualist anarchists are primarily concerned with the tendency of utilitarian politics to sacrifice the rights of individuals in the name of the greater good.

Before turning to that conception of anarchism, let’s note two classical authors who offer insight into utilitarian anarchism. Godwin articulated a form of anarchism that is connected to a utilitarian concern. Godwin’s general moral thought is utilitarian in basic conception, even though he also argues based upon fundamental principles such as the importance of liberty. But Godwin’s arguments are a posteriori, based upon generalizations from history and with an eye toward the future development of happiness and liberty. He writes:

Above all we should not forget, that government is an evil, an usurpation upon the private judgment and individual conscience of mankind; and that, however we may be obliged to admit it as a necessary evil for the present. (Godwin 1793: bk V, ch. I, p. 380)

This claim is similar to Chomsky’s insofar as it recognizes the complicated nature of the historical dialectic. The goal of political development should be in a direction that goes beyond the state (and toward the development of individual reason and morality). But in our present condition, some form of government may be “a necessary evil”, which we ought to strive to overcome. The point here is that our judgments about the justification of the state are contingent: they depend upon present circumstances and our current form of development. And while states may be necessary features of the current human world, as human beings develop further, it is possible that the state might outlive its usefulness.

We should note that utilitarian arguments are often used to support state structures in the name of the greater good. Utilitarian anarchists will argue that states fail to do this. But utilitarian conclusions are not usually based upon a fundamental appeal to moral principles such as liberty or the rights of the individual. Thus Bentham described claims about human rights as “anarchical fallacies” because they tended to lead toward anarchy, which he rejected. Bentham described the difference between a moderate utilitarian effort at reform and the anarchist’s revolutionary doctrine of human rights, saying that

the anarchist setting up his will and fancy for a law before which all mankind are called upon to bow down at the first word—the anarchist, trampling on truth and decency, denies the validity of the law in question,—denies the existence of it in the character of a law, and calls upon all mankind to rise up in a mass, and resist the execution of it. (Bentham 1843: 498)

More principled deontological anarchism will maintain that states violate fundamental rights and so are not justified. But utilitarian anarchism will not primarily be worried about the violation of a few people’s rights (although that is obviously a relevant consideration). Rather, the complaint for a utilitarian anarchist is that state structures tend to produce disadvantages for the greater number of people. Furthermore what Oren Ben-Dor calls “utilitarian-based anarchism” is based upon the idea that there is no a priori justification of the state (Ben-Dor 2000: 101–2). For the utilitarian, this all depends upon the circumstances and conditions. Ben-Dor calls this anarchism because it rejects any a priori notion of state justification. In other words, the utilitarian anarchist does not presume that states are justifiable; rather a utilitarian anarchist will hold that the burden of proof rests upon the defender of states to show that state authority is justifiable on utilitarian grounds, by bringing in historical and empirical data about human nature, human flourishing, and successful social organization.

2.4 Individualism, Libertarianism, and Socialist Anarchism

Forms of anarchism also differ in terms of the content of the theory, the focal point of the anarchist critique, and the imagined practical impact of anarchism. Socialist forms of anarchism include communist anarchism associated with Kropotkin and communitarian anarchism (see Clark 2013). The socialist approach focuses on the development of social and communal groups, which are supposed to thrive outside of hierarchical and centralized political structures. Individualist forms of anarchism include some forms of libertarianism or anarcho-capitalism as well as egoistically oriented antinomianism and non-conformism. The individualistic focus rejects group identity and ideas about social/communal good, while remaining firmly rooted in moral claims about the autonomy of the individual (see Casey 2012).

Individualistic anarchism is historically associated with ideas found in Stirner who said, “every state is a despotism” (Stirner 1844 [1995: 175]). He argued that there was no duty to obey the state and the law because the law and the state impair self-development and self-will. The state seeks to tame our desires and along with the church it undermines self-enjoyment and the development of unique individuality. Stirner is even critical of social organizations and political parties. While not denying that an individual could affiliate with such organizations, he maintains that the individual retains rights and identity against the party or social organization: he embraces the party; but he ought not allow himself to be “embraced and taken up by the party” (Stirner 1844 [1995: 211]). Individualist anarchism has often been attributed to a variety of thinkers including Josiah Warren, Benjamin Tucker, and Thoreau.

Individualist anarchism also seems to have something in common with egoism of the sort associated with Ayn Rand. But Rand dismissed anarchism as “a naïve floating abstraction” that could not exist in reality; and she argued that governments properly existed to defend people’s rights (Rand 1964). A more robust sort of pro-capitalist anarchism has been defended by Murray Rothbard, who rejects “left-wing anarchism” of the sort he associates with communism, while applauding the individualist anarchism of Tucker (Rothbard 2008). Rothbard continues to explain that since anarchism has usually been considered as being primarily a left-wing communist phenomenon, libertarianism should be distinguished from anarchism by calling it “non-archism” (Rothbard 2008). A related term has been employed in the literature, “min-archism”, which has been used to describe the minimal state that libertarians allow (see Machan 2002). Libertarians are still individualists, who emphasize the importance of individual liberty, even though they disagree with full-blown anarchists about the degree to which state power can be justified.

In some cases, individualistic anarchism is merely a matter of “lifestyle” (criticized in Bookchin 1995), which focuses on dress, behavior, and other individualistic choices and preferences. Bookchin and other critics of lifestyle individualism will argue that mere non-conformism does very little to change the status quo and overturn structures of domination and authority. But defenders of lifestyle non-conformism will argue that there is value in opting out of cultural norms and demonstrating contempt for conformity through individual lifestyle choices.

A more robust form of individualist anarchism will focus on key values such as autonomy and self-determination, asserting the primacy of the individual over and against social groups. Individualist anarchists can admit that collective action is important and that voluntary cooperation among individuals can result in beneficial and autonomy preserving community. Remaining disputes will consider whether what results from individual cooperation is a form of capitalism or a form of social sharing or communism. Libertarian anarchists or anarcho-capitalists will defend free market ideas based upon individual choices in trading and producing goods for market.

On the other hand, socialist or communistically oriented anarchism will focus more on a sharing economy. This could be a large form of mutualism or something local and concrete like the sharing of family life or the traditional potlatch. But these ideas remain anarchist to the extent that they want to avoid centralized control and the development of hierarchical structures of domination. Unlike state-centered communism of the sort developed by Marxists, anarchist communism advocates decentralization. The motto of this approach comes from Kropotkin: “all for all”. In The Conquest of Bread (1892) Kropotkin criticizes monopolistic centralization that prevents people from gaining access to socially generated wealth. The solution is “all for all”: “What we proclaim is the Right to Well-Being: Well-Being for All!” (Kropotkin 1892 [1995: 20]). The communist idea that all humans should enjoy the fruits of the collective human product shares something with the Marxist idea of “to each according to his need”. But Kropotkin argues for the need to evolve beyond centralized communist control—what he criticizes as mere “collectivism”—and toward anarchist communism:

Anarchy leads to communism, and communism to anarchy, both alike being expressions of the predominant tendency in modern societies, the pursuit of equality. (Kropotkin 1892 [1995: 31])

Kropotkin argues that the communal impulse already exists and that the advances in social wealth made possible by the development of individualistic capitalism make it likely that we will develop in the direction of communal sharing. He argues that the tendency of history is away from centralized power and toward equality and liberty—and toward the abolition of the state. Kropotkin’s communist anarchism is based upon some historical and empirical claims: about whether things can actually be arranged more satisfactorily without state intervention; and about whether states really do personify injustice and oppression. Libertarianism and anarcho-capitalism also think that the free market will work to adequately maximize human well-being and help individuals to realize their own autonomy. But for the socialist and communist anarchists, the question of individual self-realization is less important than the idea of social development. Kropotkin’s “all for all” indicates a moral and ontological focus that is different from what we find among the individualists.

Socialist and communally focused forms of anarchism emphasize the importance of social groups. For example, families can be viewed as anarchic structures of social cooperation and solidarity. A social anarchist would be critical of hierarchical and domineering forms of family organization (for example, patriarchal family structure). But social anarchists will emphasize the point that human identity and flourishing occur within extended social structures—so long as it remains a free and self-determining community.

The tension between individualist and socialist anarchism comes to a head when considering the question of the degree to which an individual ought to be subordinated to the community. One problem for so-called “communitarian” theories of social and political life is that they can result in the submergence of individuals into the communal identity. Individualists will want to struggle against this assault upon autonomy and individual identity. Communalists may respond, as Clark does, by claiming that the ideal of a genuine community of autonomous individuals remains a hoped for dream of an “impossible community” (Clark 2013). On the other hand communally focused theorists will point out that individual human beings cannot exist outside of communal structures: we are social animals who flourish and survive in communities. Thus radical individualism also remains a dream—and as more politically oriented anarchists will point out, individualism undermines the possibility of organized political action, which implies that individualist anarchists will be unable to successfully resist political structures of domination.

3. Anarchism and Political Activity

Anarchism forces us to re-evaluate political activity. Ancient Greek philosophers such as Aristotle and Plato held that human beings flourished within just political communities and that there was a virtue in serving the polis. Modern political philosophy tended to hold, as well, that political action—including obedience to the law and the ideal of a rule of law—was noble and enlightened. In Hegelian political philosophy, these ideas combine in a way that celebrates citizenship and service to the state. And in contemporary liberal political philosophy, it is often presumed that obedience to the law is required as a prima facie duty (see Reiman 1972; Gans 1992). Anarchists, of course, call this all into question.

The crucial question for anarchists is thus whether one ought to disengage from political life, whether one ought to submit to political authority and obey the law, or whether one ought to engage in active efforts to actively abolish the state. Those who opt to work actively for the abolition of the state often understand this as a form of “direct action” or “propaganda of the deed”. The idea of direct action is often viewed as typical of anarchists, who believe that something ought to be done to actively abolish the state including: graffiti, street theater, organized occupations, boycotts, and even violence. There are disputes among anarchists about what ought to be done, with an important dividing line occurring with regard to the question of violence and criminal behavior.

Before turning to that discussion, let’s note one further important theoretical distinction with regard to the question of taking action, connected to the typology offered above: whether action should be justified in consequentialist or non-consequentialist terms. Franks has argued that anarchist direct action ought to exemplify a unity of means and ends (Franks 2003). On this view, if liberation and autonomy are what anarchists are pursuing, then the methods used to obtain these goods must be liberationist and celebrate autonomy—and embody this within direct action. Franks argues that the idea that “the end justifies the means” is more typical of state-centered movements, such as Bolshevism—and of right-wing movements. While some may think that anarchists are willing to engage in action “by any means necessary”, that phraseology and the crass consequentialism underlying it is more typical of radical movements which are not anarchist. Coercive imposition of the anarchist ideal re-inscribes the problem of domination, hierarchy, centralization, and monopolistic power that the anarchist was originally opposed to.

3.1 Nonviolence, Violence, and Criminality

One significant philosophical and ethical problem for politically engaged anarchists is the question of how to avoid ongoing cycles of power and violence that are likely to erupt in the absence of centralized political power. One suggestion, mentioned above, is that anarchists will often want to emphasize the unity of means and ends. This idea shows why there is some substantial overlap and conjunction between anarchism and pacifism. Pacifist typically emphasize the unity of means and ends. But not all pacifists are anarchists. However, we mentioned above that there is a connection between anarchism and Christian pacifism, as found in Tolstoy, for example. Gandhi was influenced by Tolstoy and the anarchists. Although Gandhi is better known as an anti-colonial activist, Marshall includes Gandhi among the anarchists (Marshall 2010: chapter 26). It is possible to reconstruct anti-colonial movements and arguments about self-determination and home rule as a kind of anarchism (aimed at destroying colonial power and imperial states). Gandhi noted that there were many anarchists working in India in his time. In saying this, Gandhi uses the term anarchism to characterize bomb-throwing advocates of violence. He says: “I myself am an anarchist, but of another type” (Gandhi 1916 [1956: 134]). Gandhian anarchism, if there is such a thing, embraces nonviolence. In general nonviolent resistance as developed in the Tolstoy-Gandhi-King tradition fits with an approach that turns away from political power and views the state as a purveyor of war and an impediment to equality and human development.

Objecting to this anarcho-pacifist approach are more militant activists who advocate direct action that can include sabotage and other forms of political violence including terrorism. Emma Goldman explains, for example, that anti-capitalist sabotage undermines the idea of private possession. While the legal system considers this to be criminal, Goldman contends it is not. She explains,

it is ethical in the best sense, since it helps society to get rid of its worst foe, the most detrimental factor of social life. Sabotage is mainly concerned with obstructing, by every possible method, the regular process of production, thereby demonstrating the determination of the workers to give according to what they receive, and no more. (Goldman 1913 [1998: 94])

Goldman struggled with the question of violence through the course of her career. Early on she was a more vocal proponent of revolutionary violence. She began to rethink this later. Nonetheless, like other anarchists of her generation, she attributed violence to the state, which she opposed. She writes:

I believe that Anarchism is the only philosophy of peace, the only theory of the social relationship that values human life above everything else. I know that some Anarchists have committed acts of violence, but it is the terrible economic inequality and great political injustice that prompt such acts, not Anarchism. Every institution today rests on violence; our very atmosphere is saturated with it. (Goldman 1913 [1998: 59])

Goldman views anarchist violence as merely reactive. In response to state violence, the anarchists often argued that they were merely using violence in self-defense. Another defender of violence is Malatesta who wrote that the revolution against the violence of the ruling class must be violent. He explained:

I think that a regime which is born of violence and which continues to exist by violence cannot be overthrown except by a corresponding and proportionate violence. (Malatesta 1925 [2015: 48])

Like Goldman, Malatesta warned against violence becoming an end in itself and giving way to brutality and ferocity for its own sake. He also described anarchists as preachers of love and advocates of peace. He said,

what distinguishes the anarchists from all others is in fact their horror of violence, their desire and intention to eliminate physical violence from human relations. (Malatesta 1924 [2015: 46])

But despite this rejection of violence, Malatesta advocates violence as a necessary evil.

Anarchist violence appears as the violence of an individual against the state. It is easy to see why such violence would be characterized as terroristic and criminal. For an individual to declare war against the state and take action to disrupt the state is criminal. And thus anarchists have also been interested in a critique of crime and criminality—arguing that it is the law and the legal system that creates and produces crime and criminality. This critique was advanced by Kropotkin as early as the 1870s, when he called prisons “schools for crime”. Similar ideas are found in Foucault and in more recent criticisms of mass incarceration. Contemporary anarchists will argue that mass incarceration is an example of state power run amok.

3.2 Disobedience, Revolution, and Reform

The question of violence leads us to a further issue: the question of obedience, disobedience, resistance, and political obligation. Much could be said here about the nature of political obligation and obedience: including whether obedience is merely pragmatic and strategic or based upon notions about loyalty and claims about identification with the nation and its laws. But it is clear that anarchists have no principled reason for political obedience. If the anarchist views the state as illegitimate, then obedience and participation are merely a matter of choice, preference, and pragmatism—and not a matter of loyalty or duty.

Christian anarchists will look, for example, to the case of Jesus and his idea of rendering unto Caesar what is due to Caesar (Matthew 22:150–22). The anarchist interpretation of this passage claims that this is an indication both of Jesus’s disaffection with the state and with his grudging acquiescence to political authority. Christoyannopoulos argues, “Jesus’ political subversion is carried out through submission rather than revolt” (Christoyannopoulos 2010: 156). The crucifixion, on this interpretation, is a subversive event, which “unmasks” political power as “demonic” and illegitimate. Jesus does not recognize the ultimate moral and religious authority of Caesar or Pilate. But he goes along with the political regime. Thus some anarchists may simply be compliant and submissive.

But politically motivated anarchists encourage resistance to state power, including strategic and principled disobedience. Such disobedience could involve symbolic actions—graffiti and the like—or acts of civil resistance, protests, tax resistance and so on—up to an possibly including sabotage, property crime, and outright violence. Again, there is overlap with the discussion of violence here, but let’s set that question aside and focus on the notion of civil disobedience.

One important example is found in Thoreau, who famously explained his act of disobedience by tax resistance as follows:

In fact, I quietly declare war with the State, after my fashion, though I will still make what use and get what advantage of her I can, as is usual in such cases. (Thoreau 1849 [1937: 687])

Thoreau’s disobedience is principled. He recognizes that a declaration of war against the state is a criminal act. He willingly goes to jail. But he also admits that he will cooperate with the state in other cases—since there is something advantageous about cooperation. This indicates the complexity of the question of cooperation, protest, and disobedience. Thoreau’s essay, “Civil Disobedience” (1849), is often viewed as an anarchist manifesto. Kropotkin discussed him as an anarchist (Kropotkin 1927 [2002]). And Tolstoy admired his act of civil disobedience—as did Gandhi.

Anarchists continue to discuss strategies and tactics of disobedience. One problem throughout this discussion is the degree to which disobedience is effective. If there were to be successful anarchist campaigns of disobedience they would have to be organized and widespread. Whether such campaigns would actually work to disassemble the state apparatus remains an open question.

Until their dreamed-of revolution comes, anarchist must consider the degree to which cooperation with the state involves “selling out” to the political status quo. Perhaps there are reforms and short-term gains that can be obtained through traditional political means: voting, lobbying legislators, etc. But anarchists have often held to an all-or-nothing kind of approach to political participation. We noted above that the Christian anarchist Jacques Ellul has said that he does not vote because anarchy implies conscientious objection. But herein lies a strategic conundrum. If progressively minded anarchists opt out of the political system, this means that less enlightened policies will prevail. By not voting or otherwise engaging in ordinary politics, the anarchist ends up with a system that he or she will be even less happy with than if he or she had actively participated in the system.

This is, really, a problem of revolution versus reform. The revolutionary wants revolution now, believing that it will occur by way of direct action of various sorts. Perhaps the revolutionary is also thinking that the psychological, cultural, and spiritual evolution toward revolutionary consciousness can only occur when direct action is taken: in order for anarchism to emerge, the anarchist may think, one ought to behave and think like an anarchist. But without a concerted and nation-wide revolution, revolutionary action begins to look like mere selfishness, Epicurean opting out, or what Bookchin criticized as “lifestyle anarchism”. Meanwhile those reform-minded folks who work within the system of political power and legality can end up supporting a system that they have doubts about. This philosophical problem of reform vs. revolution exists for all radical political agendas. But the problem is especially acute for anarchists, since anarchism is often an all-or-none proposition: if the state is justified then gradualism and reformism make sense; but if no state can be justified, then what is sometimes called “reformist anarchism” is a non-starter (see L. Davis 2012).

3.3. Utopian Communities and Non-Revolutionary Anarchism

Many anarchists are revolutionaries who want change to be created through direct action. But given our preceding discussion of violence, disobedience, and the potential for success of revolutionary activity, the question arises about opting-out of political life. The Epicureans and Cynics pointed in this direction. The history of anarchism is replete with efforts to construct anarchist communes that are independent and separated from the rest of state centered political life.

We might pick up the history here with the Christian anarchists and pacifists of the Reformation: the Mennonites, for example; or the Quakers who refused to doff their hats for political authorities and who sought a refuge in Pennsylvania. Indeed, there is an anarchist thread to the colonization of North America, as those who were disgruntled with European political and religious hierarchy left for the “new world” or were forced out by the European authorities. In the Seventeenth Century, Anne Hutchinson was cast out of the Massachusetts Bay Colony and forced to found a new community, when she concluded that the idea of government was flawed. Hutchinson is considered as one of the first anarchists of North America (see Stringham 2007). Separatist communities were founded by the New England abolitionists and transcendentalists, by Josiah Warren, and by others.

Anarchist communes were formed in Europe during the Nineteenth Century and in Spain during the 1930s. There have been ongoing movements and organizations of indigenous peoples and others who inhabit the margins of mainstream political life. In the 1960s and 70s, anarchist separatism was reiterated in the Hippy communes and attempts to live off the grid and get back to nature. Alternative communes, squats, and spontaneous gatherings continue to occur.

Separatist communities have to consider: the degree to which they give up on anarchist direct action against dominant political forces, the extent to which they have to accommodate themselves to political reality, and the risk that customary hierarchies will be reinstated within the commune. For the revolutionary anarchist, separatism is a strategy of avoidance that impedes political action. Separatist communes must often obey the rules of the dominant political organization in order to trade and get connected to the rest of the world. Finally, a complaint made about separatist communes is that they can end up being structured by sexist, classist, and other hierarchical organizing principles. One might argue that until the dominant culture is revolutionized, separatism will only be a pale reflection of the anarchist ideal. And yet, on the other hand, advocates of separatism will argue that the best way for anarchist ideals to take hold is to demonstrate that they work and to provide an inspiration and experimental proving ground for anarchism.

If revolutionary activity is taken off the table, then anarchists are left with various forms of gradualism and reformism. One way this might occur is through the creation of “temporary autonomous zones” such as those described by Bey. Along these lines David Graeber provides a description of the cultural and spiritual work that would be required in order to prepare the way for anarchist revolution. Graeber says that this would require “liberation in the imaginary”, by which he means that through activism, utopian communities, and the like there can be a gradual change in the way political power is imagined and understood (Graeber 2004). Revolutionary anarchists will respond to this by arguing that liberation in the imaginary is simply imaginary liberation: without actual change in the status quo, oppression and inequality continue to be a problem.

4. Objections and Replies

Let’s conclude by considering some standard objections to anarchism and typical replies.

4.1 Anarchism is Nihilistic and Destructive

Objection: This objection holds that anarchism is merely another name for chaos and for a rejection of order. This objection holds that anarchists are violent and destructive and that they are intent on destroying everything, including morality itself.

Reply: This objection does not seem to recognize that anarchists come in many varieties. Many anarchists are also pacifists—and so do not advocate violent revolution. Many other anarchists are firmly committed to moral principles such as autonomy, liberty, solidarity, and equality. Some anarchists do take their critique of arché in a nihilistic direction that denies ethical principles. But one can be committed to anarchism, while advocating for caring communities. Indeed, many of the main authors in the anarchist tradition believed that the state and the other hierarchical and authoritarian structures of contemporary society prevented human flourishing.

4.2 Anarchy Will Always Evolve Back into the State

Objection: This objection holds that anarchism is inherently unstable. Hobbes and other early modern social contract theories maintain that the state emerges as a necessary response to natural anarchy which keeps order and protects our interests. A different theory comes from Nozick, who argues that the “night-watchman state” would emerge out of anarchy by an invisible hand process: as people will exercise their liberty and purchase protection from a protection agency, which would eventually evolve into something like a minimal state.

Reply: Anarchists may argue that the state of nature is simply not a state of war and so that Hobbes’s description is false. Some anarcho-primitivists will argue that things were much better for human beings in the original state of nature in small communities living close to the land. Other anarchists might argue that the disadvantages of state organizations—the creation of hierarchies, monopolies, inequalities, and the like—simply outweigh the benefits of state structures; and that rational agents would choose to remain in anarchy rather than allow the state to evolve. Some anarchists may argue that each time a state emerges, it would have to be destroyed. But others will argue that education and human development (including technological development) would prevent the reemergence of the state.

4.3 Anarchism is Utopian

Objection: This objection holds that there simply is no way to destroy or deconstruct the state. So exercises in anarchist political theory are fruitless. It would be better, from this point of view to focus on critiques of hierarchy, inequality, and threats to liberty from within liberal or libertarian political theory—and to engage in reforms that occur within the status quo and mainstream political organization.

Reply: Ideal theory is always in opposition to non-ideal theory. But utopian speculation can be useful for clarifying values. Thus philosophical anarchism may be a useful exercise that helps us understand our values and commitment, even though political anarchism has no hope of succeeding. Furthermore, there are examples of successful anarchist communities on a small local scale (for example, in the separatist communities discussed above). These concrete examples can be viewed as experiments in anarchist theory and practice.

4.4 Anarchism is Incoherent

Objection: This objection holds that a political theory that abolishes political structures makes no sense. A related concern arises when anarchism is taken to be a critique of authority in every case and in all senses. If anarchists deny then that there can be any arché whatsoever, then the claim contradicts itself: we would have a ruling theory that states that there is no ruling theory. This sort of criticism is related to standard criticisms of relativism and nihilism. Related to this is a more concrete and mundane objection that holds that there can be no anarchist movement or collective action, since anarchism is constitutionally opposed to the idea of a movement or collective (since under anarchism there can be no authoritative ruler or set of rules).

Reply: This objection only holds if anarchism is taken to be an all-or-nothing theory of the absolutist variety. Political anarchists do not necessarily agree with the skeptical post-foundationalist critique which holds that there can be no ruling principle or authority whatsoever. Rather, political anarchists hold that there are legitimate authorities but that political power quickly loses its authoritativeness and legitimacy. Furthermore, anarchists tend to advocate for a principle and procedure for organization based upon voluntarism and mutual aid, as well as unanimity and/or consensus. From this point of view anarchist communities can work very well, provided that they avoid coercive authority. To support this point anarchists will point to historical examples of successful anarchist communes. They will also point to ordinary human relations—in families and civil society relationship—which operate quite well apart form coercive and hierarchical political authority

4.5 Philosophical Anarchism is “Toothless”

Objection: One objection to philosophical anarchism of the sort discussed throughout this essay is that it remains merely theoretical. Some political anarchists have little patience for abstract discourses that do not engage in direct action. One worry about philosophical anarchism is that in failing to act—and in failing to take responsibility for the actions that ought to follow from thought—philosophical anarchism remains a bourgeois convenience that actually serves the status quo. Thus when philosophical anarchists remain uncommitted in terms of the concrete questions raised by anarchism—whether they should obey the law, whether they should vote, and so on—they tend to support the interests of defenders of the status quo.

Reply: In response to this objection, one might defend the importance of philosophical reflection. It is important to be clear about principles and ideas before taking action. And with anarchism the stakes are quite high. The puzzles created by philosophical anarchism are profound. They lead us to question traditional notions of sovereignty, political obligation, and so on. They lead us to wonder about cultural and ethical conventions, including also our first principles regarding the theory and organization of social life. Given the difficulty of resolving many of these questions, the philosophical anarchist may hold that caution is in order. Moreover, the philosophical anarchist might also defend the importance of wonder. The anarchist critique gives us reason to wonder about much that we take for granted. Wonder may not change the world in immediate ways or lead to direct action. But wonder is an important step in the direction of thoughtful, ethical action.


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