John M. E. McTaggart
John McTaggart Ellis McTaggart, henceforth simply “McTaggart”, was one of the most important systematic metaphysicians of the early 20th century. His greatest work is The Nature of Existence, the first volume of which was published in 1921 while the second volume was published posthumously in 1927 with C.D. Broad as the editor of the manuscript. In addition, he authored many important articles on metaphysics, including his famous “The Unreality of Time” in 1908, some of which are collected in his Philosophical Studies (1934).
McTaggart was also a dedicated interpreter and champion of Hegel, and in addition to many articles on the Hegelian philosophy, he published the following books: Studies in the Hegelian Dialectic (1896, 2nd edition printed in 1922), which contains a painstaking discussion of the nature of the dialectic as well as the results achieved by its means, many of which are conclusions that McTaggart continued to argue for throughout his career, including among them that time is unreal, that existence exhausts reality, that modal notions cannot be applied to reality as a whole, and that absolute reality contains imperfections; Studies in Hegelian Cosmology (1901, 2nd edition printed in 1918), in which cosmology is understood as the discipline that applies a priori conclusions to those entities and features that we are acquainted with via experience, such as selves, the universe, and good and evil, and in which topics ranging from the ethical status of punishment and the nature of sin to whether the absolute is a person, whether human beings are immortal, or whether Hegel is a Christian are discussed in great detail; and A Commentary on Hegel’s Logic (1910), which consists of a critical commentary on the alleged logical connections between various categories by which experience must be organized and the various transitions that lead one from Hegel’s category of Being to the category of Absolute Idea.
The extent to which McTaggart’s interpretations of Hegel are correct is not a matter on which I am competent to determine. For what it is worth, McTaggart’s work on Hegel does not appear to be highly regarded by contemporary scholars of Hegel, insofar as this is reflected in the paucity of references to McTaggart’s interpretations. In what follows, I will spend little time on those works of McTaggart that occupy themselves with the Hegelian philosophy. This is unfortunate, since this might give the impression that grappling with Hegel’s philosophy was merely a side project for McTaggart rather than a task of much importance for his philosophical development. In his Commentary on Hegel’s Logic, McTaggart tells us that the exposition of Hegel’s philosophy has been the chief object of his life for the last twenty-one years (Commentary on Hegel’s Logic, 311). McTaggart’s Hegelianism was also important for the development of other philosophers such as Bertrand Russell, whose early work was inspired by the idealism defended by McTaggart in his Studies of the Hegelian Dialectic. However, it is worth noting that McTaggart himself later abandoned the dialectical method that he took to be central to Hegel’s own metaphysics.
The plan for this article is as follows. Section 1 will provide biographical information about McTaggart. I will then begin to discuss the central themes of McTaggart’s philosophy. Section 2 focuses on McTaggart’s views on the methods of metaphysics. Section 3 discusses McTaggart’s famous argument for the unreality of time. Section 4 will focus on McTaggart’s philosophy of religion, which was a kind of atheistic mysticism. Section 5 will focus on McTaggart’s ontological idealism, which is a view akin to the idealism of Leibniz and Berkeley. Section 6 will focus on McTaggart’s position on what was perhaps the central metaphysical debate of his period, namely, the issue of monism vs. pluralism as well as the concordant issue of the reality of relations. Section 7 will be devoted to a smorgasbord of topics of interest to contemporary metaphysicians, including McTaggart’s views on parts and wholes, the distinction between existence and reality, and questions about essentialism.
Section 8 will be the final part of this article, and will focus on McTaggart’s views on ethics. I will discuss McTaggart’s views on the nature of intrinsic value, focusing on the questions of to what ontological category the bearers of intrinsic value belong and what kinds of features determine the intrinsic value of these entities. I will also discuss McTaggart’s views on love, the emotion that he accords the highest place in his ethical system.
- 1. Biographical Sketch of McTaggart
- 2. McTaggart’s Method of Metaphysics
- 3. The Unreality of Time
- 4. McTaggart’s Philosophy of Religion
- 5. McTaggart’s Ontological Idealism
- 6. McTaggart’s Metaphysical Pluralism
- 7. Other Interesting Metaphysical Views
- 9. Ethics
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Biographical Sketch of McTaggart
John McTaggart Ellis McTaggart was born on the third of September, 1866, in Norfolk Square in London, to Francis Ellis and Susan McTaggart (Rochelle 1991, 16). He was named at birth “John McTaggart Ellis”, but took on the second iteration of “McTaggart” after his great-uncle, also named “John McTaggart”, died without descendents and willed his money to Francis Ellis on the condition that his family assumed the surname “McTaggart”. And so John McTaggart Ellis became John McTaggart Ellis McTaggart. (At Cambridge, he was sometimes referred to as “McT”.)
He began preparatory school at Weybridge, but because of his frequent advocacy of atheism he was removed, and transplanted to Caterham. There he became notorious for refusing to play football, preferring rather to lie in the middle of the field (Levy 1981, 101). He began to study Immanuel Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason around this time (Rochelle 1991, 20). He moved from Caterham to Clifton College as a boarding student in 1882. He cherished his memories of Clifton College, despite the perhaps not infrequent bullying he encountered there.
He began his study of philosophy at Trinity College in Cambridge in 1885 (Rochelle 1991, 42). In 1886 he joined the influential secret discussion group, the Cambridge Apostles (Rochelle 1991, 45; Levy 1981, 103). At this time, A.N. Whitehead was already a member of the group, and G. E. Moore and Bertrand Russell would soon join in the early 1890s. McTaggart graduated in 1888 (Rochelle 1991, 57). He was elected a Prize Fellow of Trinity College in 1891 on the basis of his dissertation on Hegel’s dialectic, which was later recast as his Studies in the Hegelian Dialectic. In 1897 he was made a lecturer in Moral Sciences (Philosophy) at Trinity College, and he held this post until he retired in 1923 at the age of 56 (Geach 1979, 14). He died unexpectedly two years later, in 1925.
Inspired by the work of F.H. Bradley, he published a pamphlet “The Further Determination of the Absolute” in 1893. (This pamphlet is reprinted in his Philosophical Studies.) There he argued that there are three stages to demonstrating the “idealist’s philosophy”. First, prove that the world is not exclusively matter, next prove that it is exclusively spiritual, and finally determine the nature of spirituality. He argues that it follows from Hegel’s dialectic that the universe is timeless, and that both knowledge and desire are mere appearance. The true reality that gives rise to these appearances consists in finite spirits perceiving and loving one another. The production of “The Further Determination of the Absolute” was an emotional experience as well for McTaggart. He wrote in a letter that “It was like turning one’s heart inside out” (Dickinson 1931, 37).
Throughout his life, he defended the claim that ultimate reality consists of loving spirits. He did not live to see his final defense in print. He died in 1925, at the age of 58, two years before the second volume of the Nature of Existence was published in 1927 under the editorial care of C.D. Broad.
F.H. Bradley was an important influence on McTaggart. McTaggart thought that Bradley was “the greatest of living philosophers” and once told G.E. Moore that when Bradley walked in, “he felt as if a Platonic Idea had entered the room”. McTaggart also greatly admired Spinoza, enough to have a quotation from Spinoza engraved on his tombstone. But McTaggart’s philosophical views were distinctively his own.
In turn, McTaggart was influential in the intellectual development of G.E. Moore. McTaggart was Moore’s youngest philosophy teacher at Cambridge. According to Paul Levy what influenced Moore most was McTaggart’s “constant insistence on clearness, on asking the question ‘what does this mean’” (Levy 1981, 60). Moore read and commented on early drafts of both McTaggart’s Some Dogmas of Religion, published first in 1906, and the first volume of the Nature of Existence.
Bertrand Russell, whose early work was deeply influenced by McTaggart, claims that McTaggart was very shy. In his autobiography, Russell writes:
… McTaggart was even shyer than I was. I heard a knock on my door one day… a very gentle knock. I said “come in” but nothing happened. I said “come in” louder. The door opened, and I saw McTaggart on the mat. He was already a president of the union, and about to become a fellow, and I was inspired and in awe on account of his metaphysical reputation, but he was too shy to come in, and I was too shy to ask him in. I cannot remember how many minutes this situation lasted, but somehow or other he was at last in the room. (Russell 1951, 88)
Russell also tells us later in his autobiography that he wondered if he would ever do as good as work as McTaggart (Russell 1951, 200).
C.D. Broad described McTaggart, who was his director of studies at Cambridge (Redpath 1997, 571), thusly:
Take an eighteenth-century English Whig. Let him be a mystic. Endow him with the logical subtlety of the great schoolmen and their belief in the powers of human reason, with the business capacities of a successful lawyer, and with the lucidity of the best type of French mathematician. Inspire him (Heaven knows how) in early youth with a passion for Hegel. Then subject him to the teaching of Sidgwick and the continual influence of Moore and Russell. Set him to expound Hegel. What will be the result? Hegel himself could not have answered this question a priori, but the course of the world history has solved it ambulando by producing McTaggart. (C.D. Broad, 1927, pp.312-313, quoted in Keeling 1929.)
He was on most accounts an unusual fellow, with a big head and a crab-like walk (Rochelle 1991, 97). Peter Geach (1971, 10) reports that, “To the end of his days he walked down corridors with a curious shuffle, back to the wall, as if expecting a sudden kick from behind.” Unlike F.H. Bradley, whose feline-directed nocturnal activities were not so benign, McTaggart saluted cats whenever he met them (Dickinson 1931, 68; Rochelle 1991, 97). (F.H. Bradley preferred to shoot cats; see the entry on F. H. Bradley.) His preferred method of transportation was a tricycle, a fact which led a Cambridge paper to publish the following poem about him:
Philosopher, your head is all askew; your gait is not majestic in the least;
you ride three wheels, where other men ride two; Philosopher, you are a funny beast.
McTaggart was delighted by this poem.
2. McTaggart’s Method of Metaphysics
Although McTaggart’s early forays in metaphysics employed a “Hegelian” dialectical method, McTaggart’s most well-known works proceed in a fashion that would be familiar to some contemporary analytic metaphysicians.
McTaggart conducts metaphysics almost entirely from the armchair. In the first chapter of Some Dogmas of Religion, McTaggart characterizes metaphysics as the systematic study of the ultimate nature of reality. He then argues that the empirical sciences, such as physics, cannot replace metaphysical inquiry. The argument is roughly as follows. First, the claim that some empirical science such as physics provides knowledge of ultimate reality is not itself a claim of physics, but rather a metaphysical claim made about physics. And as such the evaluation of this claim goes beyond the province of physics. Second, McTaggart claims that metaphysical materialists, dualists, Berkeleyian idealists, and Hegelians all accept the same system of scientific propositions, whilst differing amongst themselves on the issue of how these propositions are to be interpreted. McTaggart concludes from this claim that there are metaphysical issues remaining even after we have settled on our best scientific theory.
A similar conclusion is defended in chapter 3 of the first volume of The Nature of Existence. McTaggart there raises the following worries about using ‘inductive methods’ to arrive at metaphysical results. First, McTaggart claims that the rationality of using induction in general is questionable. According to McTaggart, we need an argument for the rationality of induction, and such an argument will not be an inductive argument. Second, McTaggart raises two specific worries about using inductive arguments to derive metaphysical claims about reality as a whole. The first specific worry is that, since there is only one entity that is reality as a whole, we cannot use an inductive argument to determine the features of this entity. (McTaggart appears to conceive of inductive arguments as exemplifying the pattern there are many As and each observed A is F, so every A is F.) The second worry is that, since there are infinitely many existing entities (a claim for which McTaggart will argue for later in the Nature of Existence), and we observe only finitely many of them, any inductive argument moving from claims about the features of what we observe to the features of existent entities in general will be dubious.
Perhaps McTaggart’s skepticism about the usefulness of empirical inquiry for metaphysical investigations is why his twentieth-century works are almost entirely devoid of commentary on the revolutions occurring in fundamental physics. (Einstein is mentioned exactly once in both volumes of The Nature of Existence, briefly and in passing in section 369 of the second volume.) Unlike some of his near-contemporaries, such as A.N. Whitehead and Bertrand Russell, McTaggart proceeds as if he were blithely unaware of the potential for interplay between physics and philosophy.
McTaggart by and large proceeds deductively by appealing to propositions he holds to be synthetic a priori and then deriving further claims from them. McTaggart does allow that experience has a role to play in metaphysical inquiry, albeit a limited one. McTaggart’s The Nature of Existence explicitly appeals to two empirical claims, first that something exists and second that what exists is differentiated, i.e., has proper parts. McTaggart holds that only the former claim is knowable only by experience; the latter claim is derivable, he claims, from the synthetic a priori position that everything has proper parts. This latter claim will be further discussed in sections 6 and 8 of this article.
Moreover, McTaggart grants that the data provided by sense-perception are prima facie true. That is, if we seem to perceive P, then unless there are compelling a priori reasons or reasons deriving from other perceptions to believe ~P, we should believe P. This principle does real work in McTaggart’s system. We apparently perceive that objects are ordered in time: some events occur before others, whilst others are simultaneous. McTaggart holds that there is a powerful a priori argument that nothing is actually in time. (McTaggart’s argument will be discussed in section 6 of this article.) But there is no powerful argument that the objects that are apparently ordered by temporal relations are not ordered by some other (non-temporal) relation. Perception teaches us both that objects are in time and that they are ordered by some relation. Only the former is called into question by McTaggart’s argument against the reality of time. In this way, McTaggart arrives at the question: what is the nature of the ordering relation that, in conjunction with other facts, gives rise to the appearance that the objects which it orders are in time?
Were McTaggart alive today, his (perhaps excessive) apriorism would probably put off many of his analytic colleagues. But all of them would appreciate his strong desire to make his arguments as clear and as rigorous as he could make them. G.E. Moore, who imbibed this philosophical value during his time at Cambridge, had this to say:
How clear he was, compared to the majority of philosophers. And what immense pains he took to get clear, even if he did not always succeed. … I think it can fairly be said that what McTaggart was mainly engaged with was trying to find a precise meaning for Hegel’s obscure utterances, and he did succeed in finding many things precise enough to be discussed: his own lectures were eminently clear. … But certainly Hegel never meant anything that precise! After these two years in which I was obliged to read Hegel, I never thought it worth while to read him again; but McTaggart’s own published works I thought it worthwhile to study carefully…. (Moore 1942, 18–19)
Whatever may be thought of these and other conclusions of McTaggart’s, and of the validity of his arguments for them, there can, I think, be no question that in respect of ingenuity and subtlety, and above all, perhaps in respect of the clearness of his thought, he was a philosopher of the very first rank. … Nor was it only that McTaggart was naturally clear-headed in a very unusual degree: he spared no pains in trying to get clearer and clearer about all matters which seemed to him to be fundamental. Perhaps the most valuable lesson which his pupils learnt from him was the importance and difficulty of trying to get quite clear as to what you hold, and of distinguishing between the good and bad reasons for holding it. (Moore 1925, 271)
3. The Unreality of Time
McTaggart is most famous for arguing that time is unreal. He was attracted to this conclusion early in his career, perhaps as a result of his mystical experiences. In June of 1889, McTaggart wrote in a letter to Roger Fry that he had some ideas about the elimination of time (1991, 59). His 1896 book Studies in the Hegelian Dialectic contains an argument for the unreality of time in sections 141–142, but this argument is very unlike the ones that succeed it. In 1908, he published “The Unreality of Time” in Mind. This argument was later reincarnated in the second volume of the Nature of Existence.
McTaggart distinguished two ways of ordering events or positions in time. First, they might be ordered by the relation of earlier than. This ordering gives us a series, which McTaggart calls the B-series. A second ordering is imposed by designating some moment within the B-series as the present moment. This second ordering gives us a series that McTaggart calls the A-series. According to McTaggart, in order for time to be real both series must exist, although McTaggart holds that, in some sense, the A-series is more fundamental than the B-series.
Although there are various ways to reconstruct McTaggart’s argument, for our purposes it will suffice to consider the following one:
- Time is real only if real change occurs.
- Real change occurs only if the A-series exists.
- The A-series does not exist.
Therefore, time is not real.
McTaggart has comparatively little to say in support of premise (1). (We find McTaggart accepting premise (1) in as early a work as his Studies in the Hegelian Dialectic, section 144.) Roughly, McTaggart’s rationale for premise (2) is that the contents of positions are events. There is real change only if events change, and the only way an event can change is by first being future, then present, and then past, i.e., by changing positions in the A-series. According to McTaggart, an event enjoying qualitative variation across its temporal axis, such as a poker that begins hot and later cools, does not constitute an example of real change, since it is always the case that the earlier part of this event is hotter than the later part of this event. For this reason, McTaggart rejects the account of change offered by Bertrand Russell in his Principles of Mathematics (section 442), according to which something changes just in case a proposition true of it at one time is not true of it when evaluated at a later time. (With respect to any proposition P, if P has some truth-value when evaluated at a time, it is always the case that P has that truth-value when evaluated at that time.)
In general, McTaggart believes that facts about positions in B-series are ‘fixed’ in the sense that they are always true no matter which time is present. The only thing left to change then is which events are actually present. So if there is no A-series, if nothing is truly ever present, past or future, then there is no change.
McTaggart argues for premise (3) by attempting to demonstrate that the existence of the A-series would generate a contradiction. According to McTaggart, being present, being past, and being future are incompatible determinations. But everything in time must have each of them. How best to reconstruct the rationale for this premise is highly contentious. The intuitive picture seems to be this. Consider an event that from our perspective is past. Perhaps it is the event of McTaggart first considering the unreality of time. From the perspective of that event, it is present (and we are future). However, the ordering generated by the A-series is supposed to be an objective ordering: an A-series is not thereby generated simply by one’s arbitrary choice of a point of time as the present. Since the respective situations are symmetrical, there is no reason to prefer one perspective over the other. If we take both perspectives as being correct, then we must say of some event (and every event by parity of reasoning) that it is past, present, and future. So instead we should say that neither perspective is correct, and that the A-series does not exist.
Although time is unreal, our perception of temporal order is not wholly delusory, for there is a real relation that really orders apparently temporal events in the way that they appear to be ordered in the B-series. This relation itself generates a series, which McTaggart calls the C-series. (For this reason, McTaggart describes his denial of the reality of time as Hegelian rather than Kantian, since (on McTaggart’s interpretation) although both thinkers denied the reality of time, only Hegel thought that there was an underlying reality to which the apparent reality of time corresponded.) Were there to be an A-series, the conjunction of it with the C-series would yield a B-series.
McTaggart entertained several theories about the nature of the C-series. One theory that he did not seriously argue against is the view that the C-relation is a primitive transitive, asymmetric relation for which nothing positive may be said concerning it. I will briefly discuss a theory that he entertains in his article “The Relation of Time to Eternity”, which was re-published in Mind in 1909 but was written at least two years before. (This article is also reprinted in Philosophical Studies.)
In this article, McTaggart distinguishes three meanings of the term “eternity”: the sense in which time might be eternal in that it is infinitely extended, the sense in which propositions (conceived as abstract objects) are eternally or timelessly true, and the sense of eternity that pertains to existent things that are not temporally located. An example of a putatively eternal being in this sense is a God conceived as existing outside of time. McTaggart focuses on the third sense of “eternal”, which is the sense in which, given the unreality of time, every existent is eternal.
Although the eternal is timeless, some temporal metaphors might more aptly characterize the eternal than others. Some theists describe the life of the divine being as one that is ‘eternally present’, an expression that on its face is explicitly contradictory. Yet describing the divine life as eternally present seems more apt than describing it as eternally past. McTaggart cites several considerations that favor metaphorically describing the eternal as present. First, the present changes only by ceasing to be present and the eternal never changes. The constancy of the eternal is like that of the present while it continues to be present. Second, many hold that the present enjoys more reality than the past or the future, and many also hold that eternal things enjoy more reality than that which is in time. So the present is more like the eternal than is the past, at least in this respect. Third, the role of the eternal in our emotional lives seems similar to the role of the present. McTaggart claims that one who loves an eternal God experiences an emotion relevantly like one who loves a presently existing thing, and not at all alike the emotion of one who loves something that is merely past or yet to be. Finally, neither past things nor future things have causal efficacy, but arguably both present and eternal things do.
Although these considerations favor metaphorically describing the eternal as present, they are not decisive. McTaggart argues that there is some reason to favor instead metaphorically describing the eternal as future. Suppose that time is unreal, but there is a real ordering corresponding to the apparent temporal ordering. In other words, suppose that there is a C-series. One theory of the C-series is that it is an adequacy series. The things ordered by the C-series are representations of how reality actually is, and the relation that generates the C-series is x is less adequate than y. On this view, states that appear to be present more accurately represent reality than states that appear to be past, but both in turn are less accurate representations than states that appear to be future. The terminal end of the C-series consists in maximally adequate, i.e., true representations of how reality is. Reality is timeless. So the final stage of a series of representations that gives rise to the appearance of a temporal order is a stage that represents reality as being timeless. For this reason, McTaggart holds that it is appropriate to describe the eternal as being future.
In chapters 44–50 of the second volume of the Nature of Existence, McTaggart reassesses and rejects the theory that the C-series is generated by the relation of being less adequate than. He ultimately settles on the view that the C-series is an “inclusion series”, one in which each element in the series has as a proper part its predecessor in the C-series. The elements of the inclusion series are misperceptions of reality, but they are not ordered merely by the relation x is less accurate than y. Strictly, McTaggart distinguishes many C-series, one for which each perceiver, but argues that they are commensurable. The illusion of time is somehow generated by facts about the parthood relations obtaining between mistaken perceptions, but how exactly this illusion is generated is a question McTaggart admits to not having an answer.
According to McTaggart, although time is unreal, temporal judgments can be well or ill-founded in the sense that, given how things actually are, some judgments about time and temporal ordering capture real facts about the underlying reality that gives rise to the appearance of time. So, for example, reality is such that it is better to say that World War I took place after the American civil war than it is to say that the American civil war took place after World War I. Although both judgments are false, the former judgment at least correctly orders some events in a real series, whereas the latter does not.
4. McTaggart’s Philosophy of Religion
Although McTaggart was an atheist from a very early age, he was certainly a religious person, at least on his own definition of “religion”. In chapter 1 of Some Dogmas of Religion, McTaggart defined “religion” as “an emotion that rests on a conviction of harmony between ourselves and the universe at large.” According to McTaggart, a necessary condition on judging that there is harmony between the universe at large and ourselves is that one judge that the universe is good on the whole (Some Dogmas of Religion, section 11).
In an earlier pamphlet, titled “Dare to Be Wise” (reprinted in his Philosophical Studies), McTaggart defined “pessimism” as the view that the universe as a whole is more bad than good, and “optimism” as the view that the universe as a whole is more good than bad. According to McTaggart, whether optimism is true is one of the central religious questions. Probably no philosophical belief was more important to McTaggart than optimism. McTaggart defended optimism very early in his career, in a pamphlet published in 1893 titled “On the Furthermore determination of the Absolute” (reprinted in his Philosophical Studies), and the second volume of the Nature of Existence concludes with a full-throttled argument for optimism.
However, McTaggart denied that the truth of optimism required the truth of theism. As noted earlier, McTaggart was throughout his adult life an unwavering atheist. In chapter VI of Some Dogmas of Religion, McTaggart defines “God” as “a being who is personal, supreme, and good.” Although McTaggart’s definition requires that God be a person in the philosophical sense, it neither requires that God be omnipotent nor requires that God be omnibenevolent. It merely requires that God be more powerful than any created thing and that God be more good than evil. McTaggart held that the three most popular arguments for the existence of God, which he took to be the cosmological argument, the argument from design, and the argument from goodness, cannot prove the existence of an omnipotent God. McTaggart also raises worries in this chapter about the coherence of the notion of omnipotence by calling attention to various paradoxes and puzzles surrounding the notion. It should be noted that McTaggart’s conception of omnipotence is very strong: for one to be omnipotent in his sense one must be able to perform impossible tasks.
Some Dogmas of Religion does not contain a direct argument for the non-existence of God, but rather contains rebuttals of arguments for the existence of God. The Nature of Existence does contain a direct argument for atheism, which appears in chapter 43 of volume II. This argument is roughly as follows. At this point in the book, McTaggart believes that he has established that the universe consists of some number of immaterial spirits, each of which is a primary part of the universe. Roughly, to say that the xs form primary parts of y is to say that the way of carving up y into the xs is a privileged or fundamental way of carving up y. For an intuitive example, consider a sphere whose top half is blue and whose bottom half is red. Perhaps the sphere has infinitely many arbitrary undetached parts, but the way of carving the sphere into the top and the bottom half is a privileged way of carving it. McTaggart then argues that, if there is a God, then it is either identical with the sum of all that exists, or is the creator of all that is distinct from God, or is the mere guider and shaper of all that is distinct from God. God cannot be the sum of all that exists, since then God would be a person who is composed of other persons. But according to McTaggart, no person can have as a part another person.
Second, God cannot be the creator of all else that exists. According to McTaggart, that would make God more fundamental than any of the other selves that are primary parts of the universe. But all selves are equally fundamental. McTaggart has a second argument for the conclusion that God cannot be the creator of everything else that exists. According to McTaggart, nothing is truly in time. Since time is unreal, there can be no creation. However, even if time is unreal, McTaggart believes that we can truly say of two things that there is a causal relation between them. But, if time is unreal, this relation must be symmetric; in order to distinguish the cause from the effect, McTaggart holds that we must appeal to temporal asymmetries, none of which exist. Since creation is an asymmetric causal relation, and there are no such relations if time is unreal, there is no creation, and hence God cannot be identified with the creator of everything that is not identical with God. For similar reasons, McTaggart held that there cannot be a being who is the shaper and guider of everything that is not him.
McTaggart was a mystic. McTaggart held that there are two essential characteristics of mysticism. (These two characteristics are articulated in his article “Mysticism”, which is reprinted in Philosophical Studies.) First, mysticism requires the recognition of a unity of the universe that is greater than that recognized by ordinary experience or by science. The universe might be highly unified without it being the case that the apparently numerically distinct parts of the universe are actually identical. According to McTaggart, Hegel believed in a mystic unity although he did not believe that this unity amounted to numerical identity. On McTaggart’s interpretation, Hegel identified God as a community of finite spirits. McTaggart’s own view was substantially the same, although he did not label the community of spirits “God”.
A second essential characteristic of mysticism is the view that it is possible to be conscious of this unity in a way different from that of ordinary discursive thought. We can be conscious of abstract truths or of spiritual reality directly in a matter akin to sense perception. McTaggart calls this consciousness “mystic intuition”, and that of which it is a recognition “mystic unity”. Mystic unity is more fundamental than mystic intuition. The existence of mystic intuition implies the existence of mystic unity, but the clearly the converse does not hold. The universe might be highly unified without anyone recognizing that it is so.
From a very early age, McTaggart had what he took to be mystical experiences. These experiences presented the world as being fundamentally unified by the relation of love. Reality as it appeared to him in these experiences consisted fundamentally of immaterial spirits who stand in the relation of love to one another. These experiences provided him with great comfort, but he believed that the fact that he had them did not provide others with a reason to believe in the unity he took them to reveal. Philosophical argument was needed to supply others with a reason.
In general, McTaggart held that religious (or metaphysical) beliefs cannot rest merely on the unfounded convictions of believers, or on the claim that most people believe it, or on that we must believe it in order to be happy, or that we should believe it on faith (Some Dogmas of Religion, section 31). With respect to matters of metaphysics, we need arguments. According to McTaggart, we also need the courage to search for the truth and to follow the arguments were they lead, even when are unhappy with where they lead. Since experience cannot correct the beliefs of metaphysicians, if a lack of courage leads them astray, nothing will lead them back to the truth. We do not want to be driven to false comfort.
Although McTaggart denied the reality of time, he did in a sense defend the immortality of the self. Since some judgments about time can be well-founded even though false, it might be that judgments about whether we will enjoy life again after our deaths are well-founded. McTaggart held that they were, and moreover defended the view that each of us existed prior to our births as well.
5. McTaggart’s Ontological Idealism
McTaggart endorsed both ontological idealism and epistemological realism. Epistemological realism, as loosely formulated by McTaggart, is the view that knowledge is true (justified) belief, and that truth consists in correspondence with reality. Ontological idealism is the view that the sum total of all that exists consists in persons. According to McTaggart, although reality is composed of persons, it does not follow that nothing is real unless it can be known by some person.
McTaggart’s version of ontological idealism was inspired by his reading of Hegel. In one of his earlier writings, “The Further Determination of the Absolute” (reprinted in his Philosophical Studies), McTaggart tells us that Hegel’s view of the absolute spirit is that it is made of finite individuals, each of which is individuated by how it is related to the others, and each of which perceives that every other self is of the same nature as itself.
McTaggart more or less interpreted Hegel as holding McTaggart’s own view, which is that reality consists of a series of either finitely many or infinitely many persons. Reality is composed of persons and their states, which are parts of them. Each person is perceived by some person or persons, and a person perceives another person either by perceiving the whole person or by perceiving some part of the person. Since, on McTaggart’s view, persons have their perceptions (and other mental states) as proper parts, one way to perceive a person is by perceiving a perception of that person. Because McTaggart allows that x might perceive a perception of y without y’s perception being also a perception of x, McTaggart distinguishes between perceiving a perception (or, more generally, any mental state) and having that perception (or, more generally, having that mental state).
Although selves have proper parts, McTaggart denies that any two selves can ever share a proper part. Nor is it possible that one self is a proper part of another. Further, no experience or mental state in general can occur without it being a part of some self. McTaggart claims that these are ultimate synthetic a priori truths.
Although persons have proper parts, the property of being a person (which McTaggart calls personality) is a simple, unanalyzable quality. Although the self is, in a sense, a bundle of mental states, not every bundle of mental states is a self. We are acquainted with the property personality, and contra Hume, Bradley, and perhaps Bertrand Russell, each of us is acquainted with something that has this property, namely oneself.
On McTaggart’s view, our perceptions are grossly mistaken about how things are. It is not clear whether McTaggart holds that our perceptions are grossly mistaken about what there is. When a misperception represents the world as containing material objects, are there some objects such that we misperceive them as being material?
In the second volume of the Nature of Existence, McTaggart endorsed the view that we never directly perceive material objects, but rather infer material objects from what we directly perceive. So, on McTaggart’s view, strictly speaking perception never represents objects as being material objects. Perception, however, does represent the existence of sense-data. But McTaggart also denies that anything is a sense-datum. However, apparent perceptions of sense-data are really perceptions of something, namely persons, parts of persons, or sums of person-parts. So my perceptions do succeed in correctly representing the existence of something other than myself, although my perceptions grossly misrepresent the nature of what is perceived.
Why do we misperceive our perceptions of persons or their parts as being perceptions of sense-data? Unlike the case of material objects, when we perceive something as a sense-datum, our perception itself (rather than a judgment we are led to by the perception) is mistaken. McTaggart hypothesizes that, if there is a single cause of this widespread error, it must be connected with the fact that we misperceive a C-series as an A-series. This hypothesis is somewhat supported by the fact that whenever we perceive some object, we always perceive that object as being in time. So the appearance of time is systematically connected with every appearance of something else, and is possibly responsible for radically distorting how that something else appears.
McTaggart’s argument for ontological idealism resists easy summary. In outline, the main moves are as follows. McTaggart first argues that every substance is gunky, that is, every substance is such that it has a proper part that is also a substance. So for each substance, there is an infinite series of substances that are parts of it (Nature of Existence I, chapter XXII). McTaggart holds that a priori reflection reveals that every substance is necessarily gunky, although there might be respects in which some substance is simple. (Were there to be persisting material atoms, there might be entities that lack spatial parts, but they would nonetheless have temporal parts.)
Second, according to McTaggart, for each substance, there must be a sufficient description of that substance (Nature of Existence I, section 105). A substance is described by mentioning its qualities. An exclusive description of a substance is a description that applies only to that substance. A sufficient description of a substance is an exclusive description that mentions only qualities that make no reference to other substances (Nature of Existence I, sections 101–102).
Third, given that each substance must have a sufficient description, the gunkyness of substances implies a contradiction if substances are either material objects or sense-data. McTaggart holds that the gunkyness of substances and the requirement that every substance have sufficient description result in a contradiction unless the following requirement is satisfied: that the universe divides itself into a set of entities – call them primary parts – whose sufficient descriptions imply sufficient descriptions of every set of parts of the universe onto infinity. In order for the sufficient descriptions of primary parts to imply the sufficient descriptions of all others, there must exist a relation of ‘determining correspondence’ such that all other objects are individuated by standing in the transitive closure of that relation to the primary parts, which in turn are individuated independently of standing in any relation of determining correspondence.
If material objects or sensa are part of reality, either there is no relation suitable to be a relation of determining correspondence or there are no objects suitable to serve as primary parts of the universe because they could not be individuated prior to standing in such a relation. One of McTaggart’s arguments for this conclusion has as a premise that objects with spatial properties, such as material objects, always have their natures in virtue of the natures of their parts. But in this case, unless some material objects are such that at each level of their decomposition into proper parts, new qualities sufficient to describe them uniquely are present, no material object could serve as a primary part of the universe. McTaggart then argues that no such qualitative variation is to be found in the actual world.
However, if the primary parts of reality are persons and the relation of determining correspondence is the relation of perception, then McTaggart holds that every substance can have a sufficient description even though every substance is gunky. Since it is possible that every spiritual substance be both gunky and have a sufficient description, idealism is a live option. That it is possible does not show conclusively that it is actual, but according to McTaggart, absent any better hypothesis, it is the one that is reasonable to accept. McTaggart holds that we can conceive of nothing that is not a material object, a sense-datum, or something spiritual, and since the first two kinds of objects are metaphysically impossible, the hypothesis of idealism is the only conceivable hypothesis left standing.
6. McTaggart’s Metaphysical Pluralism
McTaggart, unlike many of the idealists that were his contemporaries, was a friend of the reality of relations and a kind of metaphysical pluralist.
McTaggart’s realism about relations seems to be a relatively mild realism: he believes in the existence of relations, and grants that statements attributing relations to things might be true to the fullest degree, but it is not clear the extent to which he believed that facts about the obtainings of relations were metaphysically basic. It is true that the notion of perception, which is on the face of it a relational notion, plays a fundamental role in his idealistic system. Recall that McTaggart held that reality consists of immaterial selves that are unified by perceiving each other. What is not clear is whether McTaggart believed that whenever some x perceives some y, it is virtue of the intrinsic qualities of x and y. (In one sense of the term “intrinsic relation”, perception would be an intrinsic relation if this claim were true.)
McTaggart believed that the most extreme kind of monism, namely the doctrine that there is exactly one thing, is incoherent. For if there were exactly one thing, it could have no attributes or features, and hence, on McTaggart’s view, would really be nothing. For this reason, McTaggart held that we must not think of ‘the absolute spirit’ as an undifferentiated unity. In McTaggart’s early paper, “The Further Determination of the Absolute”, McTaggart argues that if the absolute has features, then it must have parts standing in relations to one another.
McTaggart also rejected the less radical version of monism that holds that there is only one substance. In first volume of the Nature of Existence, sections 65 and 73, McTaggart defined “substance” as that which has features without being a feature. In his later article, “an Ontological Idealism”, he defines “substance” as that which has features without being a feature or having a feature as a part. The reason for the revision is that at this point in McTaggart’s career, he accepted the existence of facts construed as complexes of particulars and properties. Facts satisfy the older definition of “substance” but not the newer one. McTaggart argues that we perceive that there are many substances, but also holds that it is a priori that, if there is one substance, then there are many, since it is a priori that every substance has infinitely many parts. McTaggart also rejected solipsism understood as the view that reality consists of a single person, which although infinitely divided is such that nothing exists that is not a part of him. Solipsism thus understood is strictly compatible with the existence of a plurality of substances; however, McTaggart held that solipsism was ruled out by the requirement that there be a relation of determining correspondence.
Interestingly, although McTaggart holds that some pantheistic philosophers of the east held the view that there is exactly one substance, McTaggart denies that Spinoza held this view, and moreover does not attribute the view to his contemporaries, such as F.H. Bradley. His pluralism consists in the fact that individual selves are the fundamental units of being in his theory: from facts about the selves, all else follows. He is clearly a monist in the sense that he believed that all substances are immaterial substances.
7. Other Interesting Metaphysical Views
McTaggart was a systematic metaphysician and so did what systematic metaphysicians do: on his way to defending one metaphysical view, he ended up defending several. We will briefly discuss some of the interesting positions he advocated.
Hyper-essentialism. McTaggart endorsed a radical form of essentialism. Any individual substance save reality as a whole has all of its features essentially. In several places, McTaggart seems to assert that it is meaningless to ascribe modal features to reality as a whole. See, for example, Studies in the Hegelian Dialectic, section 47, and remarks made in his “The Further Determination of the Absolute”. This view is motivated by the thought that, although a substance is distinct from its nature understood as the sum of its qualities, it nonetheless is individuated by its nature and so must have it essentially. (See the first volume of the Nature of Existence, sections 109–113). McTaggart calls the relation between the parts of a substances’ nature extrinsic determination, since, given the existence of that substance, all of those properties that are parts of that subject’s nature must exist and so in that sense determine each other.
McTaggart seems to have flirted with a kind of counterpart theory as a way to soothe intuitions that substances might have had different properties than the ones that they in fact have. After considering the consequences of his view for the modal profile of ordinary objects, such as the mountain Snowdon, he writes:
A mountain which differed from the actual Snowdon only in being a foot shorter, and in whatever was implied by that, would resemble it so closely in every characteristic that we are interested in that we should certainly give it the name Snowdon. (The Nature of Existence, vol. I, 117)
Although the actual Snowdon couldn’t have been shorter, there could have been a mountain sufficiently like it to warrant us giving it the name “Snowdon.”
Reality and Existence. McTaggart distinguished between reality and existence, both of which he held to be simple and undefinable qualities. According to McTaggart, the concept of being is the same as the concept of reality, and so it is a tautology to say whatever is, is real. Reality is a monadic property, and does not come in degrees. Existence is not to be identified with the conjunctive property of being real and being spatiotemporal, for McTaggart held that no existent is spatiotemporal. Moreover, reality is not to be identified with existence, since it is conceptually possible that something might be real without existing.
That said, everything that is real might also exist. The first portion of McTaggart’s the Nature of Existence is devoted to showing that either reality and existence are in fact coextensive, or, failing this, that can learn everything important about what is real by studying what exists. As part of the project of showing this, McTaggart argues against the reality of some putative entities that might be taken to be real but non-existent. For example, McTaggart argues that there is no reason to believe propositions (construed as abstract objects). According to McTaggart, truth is a relation not between a proposition and a fact but rather between a belief and a fact, whereas falsity is a relation between a belief and all the facts: to be false is to fail to correspond with any fact. Moreover, on McTaggart’s view, there are no non-existent facts.
McTaggart also dispenses with possibilities, and argues that all statements about possibilities are best understood as concerning connections between existing things. Statements apparently about possibilities are really statements about actualities: they are about the actual implications and non-implications of various characteristics had by actual entities. (See section 40 of the first volume of the Nature of Existence for further discussion.)
Mereological Doctrines. McTaggart holds the following doctrines concerning the part-whole relation as it applies to substances. First, McTaggart endorses unrestricted composition: whenever there are some substances, there is a further substance that is composed of them. McTaggart dismisses the worry that unrestricted composition implies that there are bizarre substances such as the substance composed of all the readers of the SEP and the moon. (See chapter 16 of the first volume of the Nature of Existence.) For this reason, McTaggart holds that there is a substance that is composed of everything that there is. He calls this substance “the Universe”. (See section 77 and chapter 18 of the first volume of the Nature of Existence.)
Second, McTaggart accepts that the doctrine of temporal parts is well-founded: if time is real, then objects have temporal parts corresponding to each moment at which they exist. If time is unreal, then objects have parts corresponding to each node in the real C-series that they occupy. This view is articulated in several places in both volumes of the Nature of Existence, and it plays a minor argumentative role in section 163 of volume I. Interestingly, McTaggart does not explicitly argue for the doctrine, but rather seems to think that the doctrine of temporal parts will be ‘generally admitted’. (See the second volume of the Nature of Existence, section 412.)
Third, McTaggart argues that it is a priori that every substance is gunky. A substance is gunky just in case it has proper parts, and every proper part of that substance in turn has further proper parts. Chapter 22 of the first volume of the Nature of Existence contains a defense of this position.
Fourth, McTaggart distinguishes between compound substances and groups. A compound substance is a substance that has other substances as proper parts. On McTaggart’s view, every substance is a compound substance. A group also has substances as proper parts, but it not merely a compound substance. Rather, it is something more akin to a set or a collection. However, McTaggart explicitly claims that groups are not classes because a class is “determined by a class-concept, while a group is determined by a denotation.” (See page 276 of “An Ontological Idealism” in his Philosophical Studies, as well as chapter XV of the first volume of the Nature of Existence, wherein he claims that classes are determined by properties.)
In addition to having substances as parts, groups have them as members. On McTaggart’s view, parthood is not sufficient for membership. Although the parthood relation is transitive, the membership relation is not. According to McTaggart, whenever there are some substances, they also form a group, and whenever there are some groups they too from a group. Although there is a universal substance, no group contains all the other groups. Finally, no group contains itself as a part. McTaggart appears to have an iterative conception of the group-theoretic hierarchy, although he denies that there are groups with only one or fewer members.
One puzzling feature of McTaggart’s mereological system is his apparent acceptance of a form of relative identity: x and y might be the same substance while simultaneously being different groups. In section 128 of the first volume of the Nature of Existence, McTaggart considers the group consisting of the counties of Great Britain and the group consisting of the parishes of Great Britain. McTaggart argues that although these are not the same groups, we ought to say that they are the same substance. He does not appear to merely mean that this substance may be partitioned in two different ways, and that corresponding to these ways are two numerically distinct groups.
It is fair to say that McTaggart dedicated much more of philosophical energy to metaphysics than ethics. That said, McTaggart did have interesting ethical views, some of which will be discussed here.
In the Hegelian phase of McTaggart’s career, McTaggart defended a form of consequentialism in which the ultimate good coincided with what is ultimately real: a series of persons each of whose final end is in complete harmony with the universe (and so with the final ends of every other individual), resulting in the happiness of each individual. Although the production of this ultimate good is our obligation, it is exceedingly difficult for us to know which actions of ours are what we ought to do. For this reason, McTaggart suggests that we need a ‘criterion’ for moral rightness, i.e., a decision-procedure such that if we follow it we are most apt to do what we ought to do. McTaggart argues that a form of hedonistic utilitarianism is the best criterion for moral rightness that we can reasonably hope for. McTaggart grants that sometimes this criterion could give incorrect results, and that since following it is not a certain guide to what is right, we must admit that our ethical knowledge is limited and incomplete.
The latter McTaggart was a moral realist cut from the same cloth as his former student G.E. Moore. He held that (intrinsic) goodness and badness were simple qualities, not reducible to non-normative properties, and not reducible to the relation is intrinsically better than. (See chapter 64 of the second volume of the Nature of Existence for discussion.)
The fundamental bearers of intrinsic value are either persons (or other conscious beings) or states of persons (which in turn he took to be proper parts of persons). Because no person is a part of another person, the universe itself cannot be taken to be a fundamental bearer of intrinsic value. Therefore, one can say of the universe that it is intrinsically good or intrinsically bad only if one means by this either something about the average value of parts of the universe or by their total value. (This view is defended in “The Individualism of Value”, reprinted in Philosophical Studies.) McTaggart opts for the latter view, and for this reason, McTaggart accepts the repugnant conclusion, which is that a universe containing millions of people whose lives are barely worth living might be better than a world containing far fewer people, each of whom live lives of spectacular value. McTaggart notes that this conclusion would be repugnant to certain moralists, but sees no reason to think ‘repugnance in this case would be right.’ (See section 870 of the second volume of the Nature of Existence.)
Although persons or states of persons are the bearers of intrinsic value, they have their value in virtue of having other properties. McTaggart was an ethical pluralist, granting that many different sorts of properties can contribute to the value of a state of a person. Pleasure and pain are both intrinsically valuable (the latter having negative value, of course), and both are present in timeless reality. Pain is always intrinsically bad, regardless of whether the recipient of the pain deserves to be in pain. On the basis of this claim, McTaggart argued against the justifiability of vindictive punishment. (See Some Dogmas of Religion, section 133, as well as “Hegel’s Theory of Punishment”, which further develops this view; chapter five of Studies in Hegelian Cosmology is devoted to a discussion of punishment.) And unfortunately, delusory perceptions, of which we are susceptible, are intrinsically bad. For this reason, McTaggart concludes that absolute reality is not free from intrinsic disvalue. (Even if pain is illusory, the illusion that there is pain is real, and is itself bad. See his Studies in the Hegelian Dialectic, page 155.) For this reason, Hegel’s attempts to prove that the absolute is perfect are doomed to failure.
Love is central in McTaggart’s theory of the good. Love is not to be identified with benevolence, which McTaggart did not regard as an emotion but rather as a desire to do good for others. Furthermore, love is not to be identified with sympathy or sexual desire, but may occasion both. Love is not invariably caused by pleasure and it does not invariably cause pleasure. We might be caused to love someone because of that person’s qualities, but we do not love that person’s qualities but rather the person himself. We can love a person whom we do not believe to be good.
According to McTaggart, love is “supremely” good. By this, McTaggart does not mean that love is incommensurably better than all other goods; were it, the smallest increase in love would be greater than any other increase in any other valuable thing. However, love is supreme in the following way: there is some amount of love such that that particular amount of love is greater in intrinsic value than any amount of any other good. On McTaggart’s view, the goodness of other goods asymptotically approach the goodness of that amount of love, whereas the goodness of love enjoys no upper bound. (See sections 850–853 of the second volume of the Nature of Existence.)
The optimistic conclusion of the Nature of Existence is that timeless reality consists of persons who experience tremendous love for each other. The quantity of love is sufficient in value to dwarf any evils that remain. McTaggart argues that the value of this quantity of love might well be infinite.
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Other Internet Resources
- McTaggart bibliography, by Pablo Stafforini.
- Thomas, Emily, “John McTaggart,” Oxford Biblographies Online (requires a subscription to see the full bibliography).
I thank Ben Bradley, Daniel Nolan, David Sanford, Byron Simmons, and an anonymous referee for extremely helpful comments on earlier versions of this entry.