George Edward Moore

First published Fri Mar 26, 2004

G.E. Moore (1873-1958) (who hated his first names, ‘George Edward’ and never used them — his wife called him ‘Bill’) was an important British philosopher of the first half of the twentieth century. He was one of the trinity of philosophers at Trinity College Cambridge (the others were Bertrand Russell and Ludwig Wittgenstein) who made Cambridge one of centres of what we now call ‘analytical philosophy’. But his work embraced themes and concerns that reach well beyond any single philosophical programme.

1. Life and Career

Moore grew up in South London (his eldest brother was the poet T. Sturge Moore who worked as an illustrator with W. B. Yeats). In 1892 he went to Trinity College Cambridge to study Classics. He soon made the acquaintance there of Bertrand Russell who was two years ahead of him and of J. M. E. McTaggart who was then a charismatic young Philosophy Fellow of Trinity College. Under their encouragement Moore decided to add the study of Philosophy to his study of Classics, and he graduated in 1896 with a First Class degree in the subject. At this point he turned his energies towards attempting to follow in the footsteps of McTaggart and Russell by winning a ‘Prize’ Fellowship at Trinity College which would enable him to continue the study of philosophy there. In 1898 he was successful and over the next six years he matured as a dynamic young philosopher, actually leading Russell away from the idealist philosophy of McTaggart and others which was then dominant in Britain.

Moore's Fellowship ended in 1904; after a spell away from Cambridge, Moore returned there in 1911 to a lectureship in the University and he then lived there for the rest of his life (apart from an extended visit to the U.S.A. in 1940-44). In 1921 he became editor of Mind, the leading British philosophical journal, and in 1925 he became a Professor at Cambridge. These two appointments confirmed his position as the most highly respected British philosopher of the time, and with Wittgenstein back in Cambridge after 1929, Cambridge became the most important centre of philosophy in the world. Moore retired as Professor in 1939 (to be succeeded by Wittgenstein) and as editor of Mind in 1944; these retirements marked not only the end of his pre-eminence, but also of the golden age of Cambridge philosophy.

Early in his time in Cambridge Moore became friends with some of the young men who went on to form the ‘Bloomsbury Group’, such as Lytton Strachey, Leonard Woolf and Maynard Keynes. Through these friendships Moore exerted an indirect influence on British twentieth-century culture as profound as that of any more ‘engaged’ philosopher. These long-lasting friendships bear witness to Moore's Socratic personality and thus to a side of his character which his writings do not convey. Gilbert Ryle, the Oxford philosopher who was Moore's successor both as editor of Mind and as the dominant British philosopher after 1945, emphasized this side of Moore's personality:

He gave us courage not by making concessions, but by making no concessions to our youth or our shyness. He treated us as corrigible and therefore as responsible thinkers. He would explode at our mistakes and muddles with just that genial ferocity with which he would explode at the mistakes and muddles of philosophical high-ups, and with just the genial ferocity with which he would explode at mistakes and muddles of his own. (Ryle 270)

2. The Refutation of Idealism

Moore was first drawn to philosophy through contact with McTaggart and under McTaggart's influence he fell briefly under the spell of British idealism, especially the work of F. H. Bradley. Thus when in 1897 he made his first attempt to win a Prize Fellowship at Trinity he submitted a dissertation on ‘The Metaphysical Basis of Ethics’ in which he acknowledges his indebtedness to Bradley and presents an idealist ethical theory. One element of this theory is what he calls ‘the fallacy involved in all empirical definitions of the good’, which is immediately recognisable as a precursor of his famous claim in Principia Ethica that there is a fallacy, the ‘naturalistic fallacy’, in all naturalistic definitions of goodness. This point indicates that although, as we shall see below, Moore quickly came to reject the idealist philosophy of Bradley and McTaggart, he held that their criticisms of empiricism, as represented by J. S. Mill's philosophy, were sound and he carried this hostility to empiricism forward into his mature philosophy. In this respect, therefore, his early idealist enthusiasm had an enduring impact on his thought.

A substantial part of this early dissertation is devoted to a critical discussion of Kant's moral philosophy, and it is striking that although in his general approach and conclusions Moore endorses the kind of idealism advanced by Bradley, he is already critical of Kant's conception of practical reason. He argues that Kant's use of this conception blurs the distinction between ‘the psychological faculty of making judgments and inferences’ and that which is ‘true and objective’. This distinction, Moore maintains, ‘cannot be either done away or bridged over’. Hence, he argues, Kant's conception of morality as founded on a priori principles of practical reason is untenable. It is easy to see how this line of thought could be extended to a general criticism of Kant's conception of the a priori; and it is precisely this generalisation that Moore undertakes in his successful 1898 dissertation. At the same time he comes to see that his previous enthusiasm for Bradley's idealism was not well founded (though it still takes him a little time to accept that the arguments of Bradley and McTaggart against the reality of time are flawed). So it is in this 1898 dissertation that Moore turns decisively against idealist philosophy, both in its Kantian and Bradleian forms.

There are several aspects to this. As I have indicated, he rejects Kant's conception of the a priori as a muddled form of subjectivism or psychologism. The following passage from Principia Ethica (1903) is indicative of his polemic which can be found in many of his writings of this period:

That ‘to be true’ means  to be thought in a certain way is, therefore, certainly false. Yet this assertion plays the most central part in Kant's ‘Copernical Revolution’ of philosophy, and renders worthless the whole mass of modern literature, to which that revolution has given rise, and which is called Epistemology. (Principia Ethica 183)

The distinction Moore is drawing on here between thought on the one hand and what is objective or real on the other is one that runs through his critique of idealism. An important early context in which he elaborates it is his discussion of meaning in his famous paper ‘The Nature of Judgement’ (1899), which comes largely from his 1898 Dissertation. Moore begins here by attributing to Bradley a quasi-empiricist view of meaning as abstracted from the total content of judgement. This is a mistake, but what is important is what follows: as against this view Moore holds that meanings, which he calls ‘concepts’, are entirely non-psychological. They come together in propositions, which are the ‘objects’ of thoughts and, as such, are to be sharply distinguished from any mental contents or representations. Indeed true propositions do not represent or correspond to a fact or real state of affairs; instead they just are facts. He put this point very clearly in a short entry written a year later on ‘Truth’:

it seems plain that a truth differs in no respect from the reality to which it was supposed merely to correspond: e.g. the truth that I exist differs in no respect from the corresponding reality — my existence. So far, indeed, from truth being defined by reference to reality, reality can only be defined by reference to truth. (‘Truth’ 21)

As Moore came to see ten years later, this radical metaphysics of true propositions is too simple. But in the present context what is striking about it is the way in which by itself it hovers between idealism and realism. If propositions are thought of as contents of judgment, then to hold that reality just comprises true propositions is to take an idealist stance. What makes the position realist in Moore's hands is his uncompromising realism concerning propositions and concepts: although they are possible objects of thought, Moore writes, ‘that is no definition of them’; for ‘it is indifferent to their nature whether anybody thinks them or not’ (‘The Nature of Judgment’ 4)

Moore's most famous criticisms of idealism are contained in his paper ‘The Refutation of Idealism’ (1903). The basic theme of this paper is the extension to sense-experience of the strong distinction between the mind and its objects which we have encountered in connection with meaning. Moore concentrates here on the case of a ‘sensation of blue’ and maintains that this experience is a kind of ‘diaphanous’ consciousness or awareness of blue, which is not a ‘content’ of experience at all, but something real whose existence is not dependent on experience. His argument here is in part phenomenological: ‘when we try to introspect the sensation of blue, all we can see is the blue’ (41); but he also argues that to suppose otherwise, that the ‘blue’ is merely a content of the experience is to suppose that it is a quality of the experience, so that the experience is blue in much the way in which a blue bead is blue, which he takes to be absurd. Not surprisingly Moore's critics were not happy with this comparison, but it was not until the formulation of the ‘adverbial’ theory of experience by Ducasse in the 1940's, according to which someone who has a sensation of blue is someone who ‘senses bluely’, that there was a reasonably robust response to Moore's criticism. What is, nonetheless, odd about Moore's paper is that he makes no attempt to address the famous ‘argument from illusion’. Moore concludes that ‘“blue” is as much an object, and as little a mere content, of my experience, when I experience it, as the most exalted and independent real thing of which I am ever aware’ (42). As he was soon to realise, more needs to be said to handle cases in which something which is not in fact blue looks blue.

The final aspect of Moore's critical response to idealism concerns his rejection of the monism which was characteristic of British idealism. This is the holistic thesis that ordinary things are essentially inter-related in such an intimate way that they constitute together an ‘organic unity’ which is, in a sense, the only thing that ‘really’ exists, since it is the only thing whose existence is not dependent on the existence of anything else. This thesis is especially characteristic of Bradley's idealism, according to which the Absolute is the one real thing. In his early writings and in Principia Ethica Moore engages in a good deal of polemical criticism of this thesis, but it is hard to find any arguments against it, as opposed to a robust affirmation of a realist pluralism. Rather later, however, in his paper ‘External and Internal Relations’ (written in 1919) Moore focused on the idealist conception of internal relations which lies at the heart of the monist thesis. Moore's argument against the thesis that all relations are internal starts from the claim that the burden of proof lies on its supporters since it conflicts with our common sense conviction that things are not essentially inter-related in such a way that a change to one thing in one respect necessitates changes to everything else. Moore then argues that the best reason one could have for the thesis involves a logical fallacy; he shows how the thesis that all relations are internal might be plausibly, but fallaciously, inferred from Leibniz’ Law, the uncontentious principle that things which differ in their relations must differ in their identity. Simplifying a bit, and using Moore's concept of entailment (see below), his argument runs as follows:

  1. Leibniz’ Law states that
    xRy entails (z = xzRy),

    where ‘→’ is the truth-functional conditional

  2. Since entailment is a necessary connection, one might infer
    xRy → Necessarily (z = xzRy)
  3. From (2) one can immediately infer
    xRy → Necessarily (x = xxRy)
  4. Since x = x is itself a necessary truth, one can now infer
    xRy → Necessarily (xRy)

    which expresses the thesis that all relations are internal.

So, on the face of it, this thesis has here been inferred from Leibniz’ Law. Moore observes, however, that the step from (1) to (2) is invalid; it confuses the necessity of a connection with the necessity of the consequent. In ordinary language this distinction is not clearly marked, although it is easy to draw it with a suitable formal language.

Moore's argument here is a sophisticated piece of informal modal logic; but whether it really gets to the heart of the motivation for Bradley's Absolute idealism can be doubted. My own view is that Bradley's dialectic rests on a different thesis about the inadequacy of thought as a representation of reality, and thus that one has to dig rather deeper into Bradley's idealist metaphysics both to extract the grounds for his monism and to exhibit what is wrong with it.

3. Principia Ethica

The main achievement of Moore's early period is his book Principia Ethica. It was published in 1903 but was the culmination of the reflections which Moore commenced in his 1897 dissertation on ‘The Metaphysical basis of Ethics’. The main impetus, however, came from a series of lectures in London on ‘The Elements of Ethics’ which Moore gave late in 1898. Moore had the text of these lectures typed up with a view to publishing them; but as his thoughts progressed he reworked his text and Principia Ethica is the result of this reworking (the lectures have recently been published as The Elements of Ethics). Most of the first three chapters come from the 1898 lectures; whereas the last three chapters are largely new material.

In the first three chapters Moore sets out his criticisms of ‘ethical naturalism’. At the core of these criticisms is the thesis that the position involves a fallacy, the ‘naturalistic fallacy’, of supposing that goodness, which Moore takes to be the fundamental ethical value, can be defined in naturalistic terms, in terms, say, of pleasure or desire or the course of evolution. As against all such claims Moore insists that goodness is indefinable, or unanalysable, and thus that ethics is an autonomous science, irreducible to natural science or, indeed, to metaphysics. Moore's main argument against the possibility of any such definition of goodness is that when we confront a putative definition, such as that to be good is to be something which we desire to desire, we can tell that this is not a claim that is true by definition because its truth remains for us an ‘open question’ in the sense that it remains sensible to doubt it in a way which would not be possible if it were just a definition which makes explicit our understanding of the words. The merits of this argument are questionable; in many cases we can sensibly doubt the truth of a definition, especially where the definition makes use of discoveries that have not been part of our ordinary understanding, as is normally the case with definitions in the natural sciences. But there is, I think, a way of modifying Moore's argument which takes it around this objection, namely by taking it to rest on the epistemological thesis that ethical questions cannot be answered without the explicit involvement of ethical beliefs. The reason that this thesis is inimical to naturalistic definitions of ethical values is that an important role of definitions in the natural sciences and elsewhere is that they enable one to answer questions in new ways that would not otherwise be possible: it is thanks to the definition of water as H2O, and not in terms of its familiar phenotype, that we can be confident that some comets are mainly composed of water. But there is no way in which we would accept that the answer to a novel ethical question, for example concerning the acceptability of the use of human embryos for stem cell research, is to be found by finding a definition of ethical values which enables us to answer this question without drawing on beliefs that are expressed with the familiar ethical ‘phenotype’, i.e., explicitly ethical concepts.

This defence of Moore's argument does not address a different concern, namely that the argument applies only to versions of ethical naturalism which involve a definition of ethical value, and thus that naturalist positions which maintain that ethical value is an irreducible natural property are not touched by the argument. Moore's argument against positions of this kind rests on the claim that the ethical value of a situation is not a feature of it which is independent of its other properties; on the contrary it depends on its other properties. As he puts it in the preface he composed for the second edition of Principia Ethica, but never actually published, a thing's ‘intrinsic value’ depends on its ‘intrinsic nature’, and he glosses this dependence in terms of the relationship which we now call ‘supervenience’ (though Moore does not use the term): things with the same intrinsic nature, or natural properties, must have the same intrinsic value (see ‘The Conception of Intrinsic Value’ 286). Moore took it that supervenience was not an inherently reductive relationship, and thus that it was consistent for him to hold that goodness is not a natural property even though it supervenes upon natural properties; but, he assumed, if one takes the view that goodness is itself a natural property, the fact that it supervenes upon other natural properties makes it impossible to avoid a reductive thesis. So the supervenience of intrinsic value removes the option of a non-reductive naturalism without contradicting his version of ethical non-naturalism.

Subsequent discussion has shown that the relationship between supervenience and reduction is a complicated matter, and though I think that Moore's position is defensible this is not the place to take the issue further. Instead I want to turn to the concept of intrinsic value which is central to Moore's theory. One aspect of this is easy, namely the distinction between the ‘intrinsic’ value of a situation and its ‘instrumental’ value: this is the distinction between the value inherent in a situation and that which depends only on the situation's consequences. Despite this distinction it remains the case that intrinsic value is the fundamental type of ethical value, since instrumental value is definable in terms of the intrinsic value of a situation's consequences. But intrinsic value is not merely non-instrumental value; for it is also to be distinguished from what Moore calls the ‘value as a part’ of a situation, namely the extra contribution which the situation makes to the value of a complex situation of which it is a ‘part’, over and above its intrinsic value. This is not a conception which is familiar to us, but Moore illustrates the point by the following case: although knowledge has little intrinsic value, the value of the aesthetic appreciation of a beautiful work of art (which is, according to Moore, potentially one of the most valuable things there is) is greatly enhanced by knowledge about it. So this kind of knowledge can have a substantial ‘value as a part’ even though it has little intrinsic value. As before intrinsic value remains the fundamental conception of value, since a situation's value as a part is defined in terms of the overall intrinsic value of a complex situation to which it makes a contribution beyond its own intrinsic value. Nonetheless this point implies that a thing's intrinsic value is not simply its value irrespective of its consequences; it is also its value irrespective of its context. Hence the concept of intrinsic value is to be such that a type of situation has the same intrinsic value in all contexts — which is why Moore holds that its intrinsic value depends only on its ‘intrinsic nature’.

There are two connected problems here: the first concerns the way in which something's ‘value as a part’ depends on accepting that when it occurs as an element of a complex situation it may affect the latter's value in a way which is not simply the result of taking its intrinsic value into account. This judgement is enshrined by Moore in his ‘principle of organic unities’, which declares that this kind of non-aggregative valuation of complex situations is liable to occur. The problem here is not that Moore's principle is incorrect, but rather that it seems irrational since it puts a block on moral reasoning. The second problem concerns the thesis that intrinsic value is the same in all contexts. For this just seems wrong, in that the value of, say, friendship differs from one context to another. Although, as Moore rightly says, friendship is normally one of the most valuable things there is, it has no value at all where claims of justice are at stake, as in a court of law. So Moore's conception of absolutely universal intrinsic values should be replaced by a conception which allows for the ‘bracketing’ of normal values in certain contexts; and once this is in place, along with a more sophisticated account of normative values than Moore provides, it is reasonable to hope that the phenomena captured by Moore's irrational principle of organic unities will find a more comprehensible interpretation.

Another area where Moore's ethical theory is problematic is his account of ethical knowledge. Because of his hostility to ethical naturalism Moore denies that ethical knowledge is a matter of empirical enquiry. But, as we have seen, he is equally hostile to Kant's rationalist thesis that fundamental ethical truths are truths of reason. Instead he holds that ethical knowledge rests on a capacity for an intuitive grasp of fundamental ethical truths for which we can give no reason since there is no reason to be given. The trouble with this is that if we can say nothing to support a claim to such knowledge, those who disagree with it can only register their disagreement and pass on; hence ethical debate is liable to turn into the expression of conflicting judgements which admit of no resolution. In the light of this, it is not surprising that Moore's ethical theory was regarded as undermining the cognitive status of morality, and thus that it led directly to the development of ethical non-cognitivism by those who were influenced by Moore, such as A. J. Ayer and C. L. Stevenson. Yet there was another side to Moore's discussion of ethical issues, in which he found himself arguing against the hedonist thesis that pleasure is the only thing with positive intrinsic value, despite the fact that officially he held that no such arguments could be given. When engaged in this kind of ‘indirect’ method of argument, Moore sees himself as seeking to obtain agreement rather than to establish the truth, though he also acknowledges that from a first-person point of view there is little difference here. Because this indirect method is not integrated into his official method of ethical inquiry, he says little about its presuppositions. But it seems to me that one can find here the beginnings of a ‘common sense’ approach to ethics which is distinctly preferable to his official appeal to intuitive judgments concerning the relative intrinsic value of situations of arbitrary complexity.

So far I have discussed Moore's ‘metaethics’, his views about the metaphysics of ethical value and the nature of ethical knowledge. This emphasis reflects the fact that this aspect of Moore's ethical theory has been most influential; but it is also worth mentioning briefly some points from his moral theory. Moore presents a straightforward consequentialist account of the relationship between the right and the good: the right action is that which will produce the best outcome. In practice, because it is so difficult for us to determine by ourselves what is the best outcome, he allows that we probably do best if we follow established rules; thus Moore ends up recommending a conservative form of rule consequentialism, for which he was criticised by Keynes and Russell. Later critics such as W. D. Ross argued that because Moore subjects our personal responsibilities to the impersonal test of producing the best outcome his position does not adequately capture the way in which they arise from our relationships with particular people; as recent critics put it, Moore's moral theory is resolutely ‘agent-neutral’ and for that reason inadequate as an account of the personal responsibilities which involve irreducibly ‘agent-relative’ values.

Finally, in the last chapter of Principia Ethica,Moore sets out his ‘ideal’ — a deliberately unsystematic list of intrinsic goods (such as friendship and the appreciation of beauty) and intrinsic evils (such as consciousness of pain). Moore's choice of values is striking: it connects with the ‘Bloomsbury’ ideal of life devoted to Art and Love, and excludes social values such as equality and freedom. The individualism of the resulting morality is enhanced by the fact that Moore maintains that these intrinsic values are incommensurable, and thus that the assessment of priorities among them is inescapably a matter of individual judgment. As Keynes put it, Moore's ideal was a kind of secular ‘religion’ - not much use for public policy but fine for talented individuals who could agree to differ in their detailed value judgments.

4. Philosophical Analysis

By the time Moore returned to Cambridge in 1911 to a lectureship there, Russell  and Whitehead were finishing off their massive project of exhibiting the logical foundations of mathematics — Principia Mathematica. Although Moore was neither a mathematician nor a logical theorist he was one of the first people to grasp that Russell's new logical theory was an essential tool for philosophy and offered important new insights. One example of this concerns the status of propositions, the ‘objects’ of thought. As we saw above, in his early work Moore had been emphatic that propositions are altogether independent of thought and had even proposed that facts are just true propositions. But as he came to think more about falsehood in his lectures Some Main Problems of Philosophy of 1910–11, it became clear to him that this position was a mistake, since the truth of a proposition should not affect its  ontological status and yet it would be absurd to give false propositions the status of facts. So he now rejected the view that facts are just true propositions. On his new view, facts are, as before, constituted by objects and their properties; but what about propositions? According to Moore, philosophers talk legitimately of propositions in order to identify the aspects of thought and language which are crucial to questions of truth and inference, and in doing so it may appear that they regard propositions as genuine entities. But, Moore now holds, this implication is unwarranted: the mistake here is one of supposing that ‘every expression which seems to be a name of something must be so in fact’ (Some Main Problems of Philosophy, 266). Moore does not allude here explicitly to Russell's theory of incomplete symbols and logical fictions, but it is clear that this is the kind of position he has in mind. The new logic enables one to preserve realist appearances without accepting realist metaphysics.

Yet Moore was not an uncritical follower of Russell. He was critical of Russell's account of implication in which Russell proposes that the truth-functional conditional expresses all there is to the logical relationship of implication between propositions, and introduced instead the term ‘entailment’ for this latter relationship (‘External and Internal Relations’ 90ff.). While recognising that entailment is closely connected to logical necessity he came to think that entailment is not just a matter of the necessity of the truth-functional conditional, thereby setting off a debate about this relationship which continues to this day. Again, Moore was critical of Russell's treatment of existence, in particular his denial that it makes sense to treat existence as a first-order predicate of particular objects (for Russell, existence has to be expressed by the existential quantifier and is therefore a second-order predicate of predicates). While agreeing with Russell that existence is not a straightforward first-order predicate (so that the logical form of ‘Tame tigers exist’ is not the same as that of ‘Tame tigers growl’), Moore argued that statements such as ‘This might not exist’ make perfectly good sense and that they could not do so unless the simpler statement ‘This exists’ also makes sense (‘Is Existence a Predicate?’ 145).

Moore's uses of Russell's logic take place in the broader context of his use of analysis as a method of philosophy. Although Moore always denied that philosophy is just analysis, there is no denying that it plays a central role in his philosophy and it is therefore important to determine what motivates this role. This question is especially pressing in Moore's case because he rejected the main analytical programmes of twentieth century philosophy — both Wittgenstein's logical atomism and the logical empiricism of the members of the Vienna circle and their followers such as A. J. Ayer. In the first case, Moore rejected Wittgenstein's thesis that whatever exists exists necessarily; as with the idealist thesis that all relations are internal, Moore held that our common sense conviction that some of the things which exist might not have done so creates a strong presumption against any philosopher who maintains the opposite, and that the logical atomist position does not provide convincing reasons why this presumption should be overturned. In addition Moore held that it is just not true that all necessity is logical necessity, as Wittgenstein maintained; in his early writings, despite his hostility to Kant, he had explicitly defended the conception of necessary synthetic truths and he did not change his mind on this point. This point also provides a reason for his rejection of logical empiricism, since this position famously includes the thesis that all necessary truths are ‘analytic’. But Moore also recognised that his early criticisms of William James' pragmatism can be applied to the logical empiricist position. In connection with James, Moore had observed that where a proposition concerns the past, it may well be that we are in a situation in which a proposition and its negation are both unverifiable because there is now no evidence either way on the matter. But, he argued, it does not follow that we cannot now affirm that either the proposition or its negation is true, thanks to the Law of Excluded Middle; in which case it cannot be that truth is verifiability — contrary both to James' pragmatism and to logical empiricism.

Yet why then did Moore think that the analysis of propositions was so important? In part his motivation derives from his acceptance of a principle which Russell had introduced — that ‘every proposition which we can understand must be composed wholly of constituents with which we are acquainted’ (Russell 91). For this principle motivates the ‘sense-datum analysis’ of perception to which he devoted so much attention and which I shall discuss in a moment. In addition, when explaining the importance of philosophical analysis, he emphasized the importance of getting clear what is at issue in some debate; but an issue which he himself was not clear about was that of the implications of an analysis. In his early writings he took the view that in so far as the analysis of a proposition clarifies it, it also clarifies its ontological implications; thus he then held it to be an objection to a phenomenalist analysis of propositions about material objects that the analysis calls into question the existence of such objects. But he later took the opposite point of view, maintaining that a phenomenalist analysis just provides an account of what their existence amounts to. In between these two positions, in his 1925 paper ‘A Defence of Common Sense’ (which I discuss further below), Moore had held that what the sense-datum analysis of perception shows is that sense-data are the ‘principal or ultimate subject<s>’ (128) of propositions about perception. This remark, I think, reflects the true importance of philosophical analysis for Moore: its importance for him is metaphysical in so far as it reveals the ‘ultimate’ substances which are the subjects of our ordinary common sense thought and talk.

5. Perception and Sense-data

It did not take Moore long to realise that the realist position he had advanced in ‘The Refutation of Idealism’ was too ‘na•ve’ to be tenable; he had to be able to accommodate ‘false’ appearances somehow. But the strategy Moore adopted to deal with this remained true to the basic thesis of ‘The Refutation of Idealism’ that one should account for the appearances of things in terms of the properties of the primary objects of experience, and not the qualities of experiences themselves. To elaborate this position Moore introduced the term ‘sense-datum’ to describe these primary objects of experience:

But now, what happened to each of us, when we saw that envelope? I will begin by describing part of what happened to me. I saw a patch of a particular whitish colour, having a certain shape …. These things: this patch of a whitish colour, and its size and shape I did actually see. And I propose to call these things, the colour and size and shape, sense-data … (Some Main Problems of Philosophy 30)

Moore implies here that the colour, shape and size are distinct sense-data; but he soon revised his terminology so that these are regarded as properties of the visual sense-datum he ‘actually saw’, or ‘directly apprehended’ as he normally says.

Once the concept of a sense-datum has been introduced in this way, it is easy to see that false appearances can be handled by distinguishing between the properties of sense-data we apprehend and the properties of the physical objects which give rise to these sense-data. But what is the relationship between sense-data and physical objects? Moore took it that there are three serious candidates to be considered: (i) an indirect realist position, according to which sense-data are non-physical but somehow produced by interactions between physical objects and our senses; (ii) the phenomenalist position, according to which our conception of physical objects is merely one which expresses observed and anticipated uniformities among the sense-data we apprehend; (iii) a direct realist position, according to which sense-data are parts of physical objects — so that, for example, visual sense-data are visible parts of the surfaces of physical objects. The indirect realist position is that to which he was initially drawn; but he could see that it leaves our beliefs about the physical world exposed to skeptical doubt, since it implies that the observations which constitute evidence for these beliefs concern only the properties of non-physical sense-data, and there is no obvious way for us to obtain further evidence to support a hypothesis about the properties of the physical world and its relationship to our sense-data. This argument is reminiscent of Berkeley's critique of Locke, and Moore therefore considered carefully Berkeley's phenomenalist alternative. Moore's initial response to this position was that the implied conception of the physical world was just too ‘pickwickian’ to be believable. This may be felt to be too intuitive, like Dr. Johnson's famous objection to Berkeley; but Moore could also see that there were substantive objections to the phenomenalist position, such as the fact that our normal ways of identifying and anticipating significant uniformities among our sense-data draw on our beliefs about our location in physical space and the state of our physical sense-organs, neither of which are available to the consistent phenomenalist.

So far Moore's dialectic is familiar. What is unfamiliar is his direct realist position, according to which sense-data are physical. This position avoids the problems so far encountered, but in order to accommodate false appearances Moore has to allow that sense-data may lack the properties which we apprehend them as having. It may be felt that in so far as sense-data are objects at all, this is inevitable; but Moore now needs to provide an account of the apparent properties of sense-data and it is not clear how he can do this without going back on the initial motivation for the sense-datum theory by construing these apparent properties as properties of our experiences. But what in fact turns Moore against this direct realist position is the difficulty he thinks it leads to concerning the treatment of hallucinations. In such cases, Moore holds, any sense-data we apprehend are not parts of a physical object; so direct realism cannot apply to them, and yet there is no reason to hold that they are intrinsically different from the sense-data which we apprehend in normal experience. This last point might well be disputed, and at one point Moore himself considers the possibility of a distinction between ‘subjective’ and ‘objective’ sense-data; but once one has introduced sense-data in the first place as the primary objects of experience it is not going to be easy to make a distinction here without assuming more about experience than Moore at any rate would have wanted to concede.

Moore wrote more extensively about perception than about any other topic. In these writings he moves between the three alternatives set out here without coming to any firm conclusion. From the outside, it seems clear that what was leading him astray was the sense-datum hypothesis itself and his reflections on perception can be regarded as an extended reductio ad absurdum of this hypothesis. It was only towards the end of his career that he encountered in Ducasse's adverbial theory a serious alternative to the sense-datum hypothesis. But the adverbial theory provides no easy way of avoiding the difficulties Moore confronted: Moore rightly objected to Ducasse that it is not at all clear how the structure of a sensory field can be construed in adverbial terms. Yet there were other alternatives: in particular, from the start of the twentieth century the phenomenological movement had offered an account of perception based upon a recognition of its inherent intentionality which avoids some of the pitfalls of the sense-datum theory. It is, I think, a pity that Moore did not engage with this position, but this detachment was all too characteristic of the relationship at the time between the analytical and phenomenological traditions.

6. Common Sense and Certainty

An important aspect of Moore's rejection of idealism was his affirmation of a ‘common sense’ realist position, according to which our ordinary common-sense view of the world is largely correct. Moore first explicitly championed this position in his 1910-11 lectures Some Main Problems of Philosophybut he made it his own when he responded in 1925 to an invitation to describe his ‘philosophical position’ by setting this out as ‘A Defence of Common Sense’. Moore begins the paper by listing a large number of ‘truisms’ such as that ‘the earth had existed also for many years before my body was born’. Concerning these truisms he then asserts, first, that he knows them for certain, second, that other people likewise know for certain the truth of comparable truisms about themselves and, third, that he knows this second general truth (and, by implication, others do too). So the truth and general knowledge of these truisms is a matter of common sense. Having set out these truisms, Moore then acknowledges that some philosophers have denied their truth or, more commonly, denied our knowledge of them (even though, according to Moore, they also know them) and he attempts to show that these denials are incoherent or unwarranted. These claims might seem to leave little space for radical philosophical argument. But in the last part of the paper Moore argues that his defence of common sense leaves completely undecided the question as to how the truistic propositions which make up the common sense view of the world are to be analysed; the analysis may be as radical as one likes as long as it is consistent with the truth and knowability of the propositions analysed. Thus, for example, he is content to allow that philosophical argument may show that a phenomenalist analysis of propositions about the physical world is correct.

This last point shows that Moore's defence of common sense is not as much of a constraint on philosophical theory as one might at first have thought; for philosophical analysis can reveal to us facts about the ‘principal or ultimate subject’ of a truistic proposition which are by no means what common sense supposes. This implication is important when one turns to consider Moore's most famous paper, his ‘Proof of an External World’ — the text of a British Academy lecture delivered in 1939 just when Moore was retiring from his Cambridge Professorship. Moore here sets himself the task of doing what Kant had earlier set himself to do, namely providing a proof of the existence of ‘external objects’. Much of the lecture is devoted to working out what counts as an ‘external object’, and Moore claims that these are things whose existence is not dependent upon our experience. So, he argues, if he can prove the existence of any such things, then he will have proved the existence of an ‘External World’. Moore then maintains that he can do this —

How? By holding up my two hands, and saying, as I make a certain gesture with the right hand, ‘Here is one hand’, and adding, as I make a certain gesture with the left, ‘and here is another’ (‘Proof of an External World’ 166).

Moore then goes to argue that this demonstration of his hands was a ‘perfectly rigorous’ proof of the existence of external objects. For its premises certainly entail its conclusion and they are things which he then knew to be true —

I knew that there was one hand in the place indicated by combining a certain gesture with my first utterance of ‘here’ and that there was another in the different place indicated by combining a certain gesture with my second utterance of ‘here’. How absurd it would be to suggest that I did not know it, but only believed it, and that perhaps it was not the case! You might as well suggest that I do not know that I am now standing up and talking — that perhaps after all I'm not, and that it's not quite certain that I am! (‘Proof of an External World’ 166)

The significance of this performance has been debated ever since Moore set it out. It is commonly supposed that Moore here sets himself to refute philosophical skepticism; and that his performance, though intriguing, is unsuccessful. But this interpretation is incorrect: Moore's avowed aim is to prove the existence of an external world, not to prove his knowledge of the existence of an external world. Moore himself set this out clearly in a subsequent discussion of his lecture:

I have sometimes distinguished between two different propositions, each of which has been made by some philosophers, namely (1) the proposition ‘there are no material things’ and (2) the proposition ‘Nobody knows for certain that there are any material things’. And in my latest British Academy lecture called ‘Proof of an External World’ … I implied with regard to the first of these propositions that it could be proved to be false in such a way as this; namely, by holding up one of your hands and saying ‘This hand is a material thing; therefore there is at least one material thing’. But with regard to the second of the two propositions …. I do not think I have ever implied that it could be proved to be false in any such simple way … (‘A Reply to my Critics’ 668)

Setting aside any anti-skeptical intent therefore, what needs assessment is the metaphysical significance of Moore's proof, as a proof of an ‘external world’. Clearly, everything here depends on what is to count as ‘external’, in particular whether Moore's demonstration of the existence of his hands proves the existence of things that are in no way at all dependent upon experience or thought. It is, I think, obvious that it does not; for that issue is one which depends on broader philosophical questions about idealism which cannot possibly be settled that way. Moore's own distinction between questions of truth and questions of analysis should be introduced here. Moore's ‘proof’ demonstrates the ‘empirical’ truth of a simple truism, that he has hands; but it leaves entirely open the question of the analysis of this truism. Yet it is at the level of analysis that the ‘transcendental’ question of whether things such as hands are altogether independent of experience and thought is to be answered.

Although, as I have indicated, Moore did not intend his ‘proof’ as a refutation of skepticism, he did frequently argue against skeptical views; and in his early writings, despite the passage quoted just now, he does sometimes give the impression that he thinks one can refute skepticism by simply bringing forward a straightforward case of knowledge, such as ‘I know that this is a pencil’. But on examination it turns out that his strategy here is more subtle; he wants to argue that we get our understanding of knowledge primarily through straightforward cases of this kind, and thus that skeptical arguments are self-undermining: for, on the one hand, they rely on general principles about the limits of knowledge and thus assume some understanding of knowledge but, on the other hand, they undermine this understanding by implying that there are no such straightforward cases of it. The force of arguments of this kind is, however, disputable, since the skeptic can always present his argument as a reductio ad absurdum of the possibility of knowledge; and the same point applies to Moore's other attempts to convict the skeptic of some kind of pragmatic incoherence.

In two of his last writings, ‘Four Forms of Skepticism’ and ‘Certainty’, Moore, perhaps dissatisfied with these earlier arguments and with the misunderstanding of his ‘proof’, returned to the issue and set himself the challenge of refuting Cartesian skepticism. Notoriously, by the end of ‘Certainty’ Moore acknowledges defeat: having agreed that if he does not know that he is not dreaming, then he does not know such things as that he is standing up and talking, he accepts (with reservations) that he cannot know for certain that he is not dreaming. Most commentators agree that Moore lost his way here. But it is not clear where, since Moore makes no obvious mistake. Nonetheless the viability of a ‘common sense’ response to skepticism remains an important feature of later discussions of the topic. Moore was clearly right when, for example, he remarked that despite Russell's frequent skeptical professions, Russell was nonetheless perfectly sure, without a shadow of doubt, on thousands of occasions, that he was sitting down. But what is difficult to achieve here is a formulation of the skeptical dialectic which both shows the importance of Moore's ‘common sense’ affirmations of certainty and yet avoids a dogmatic insistence that knowledge does not need to be vindicated in the face of skeptical argument. I myself think that Wittgenstein's writings On Certainty, which were much influenced by Moore, best indicate how this is to be achieved, but this is not the place to demonstrate this achievement.

7. Moore's Legacy

Moore was not a systematic philosopher: unlike Reid's philosophy of common sense, Moore's ‘common sense’ is not a system. Even in ethics, where he comes closest to presenting a ‘theory’ he explicitly disavows any aspiration to provide a systematic account of the good. Hence, as the preceding discussions show, Moore's legacy is primarily a collection of arguments, puzzles and challenges. One notable addition to those mentioned already is ‘Moore's paradox’: if I am mistaken about something, then I believe something which is not the case — perhaps that it is raining when it is not. Yet if I attribute this mistake to myself by saying ‘It's not raining but I believe that it is’ my statement is absurd. Why is this so? Why is it absurd for me to say something that it is true about myself? Moore himself thought that the explanation here was just that we generally believe the things we say, so that when saying ‘It's not raining’ I imply that I believe this; but Wittgenstein rightly saw that this explanation was superficial and that Moore had put his finger on a much deeper phenomenon here which concerns our sense of our own identity as thinkers.

This case is typical. Moore had an unparalleled ability for identifying philosophical ‘phenomena’. His own discussions of their significance are not always satisfying; but he would be the first to acknowledge his own fallibility. What matters is that if we start where he starts we can be sure that we are dealing with something that will tell us something important about ourselves and the world.


Primary Sources

[* indicates the edition used for page references in this entry]

  • ‘The Nature of Judgment’ Mind 8 (1899) 176-93. Reprinted in *G. E. Moore: Selected Writings1-19.
  • ‘Truth’ in J. Baldwin (ed.) Dictionary of Philosophy and Psychology Macmillan, London: 1901-2. Reprinted in *G. E. Moore: Selected Writings 20-2.
  • ‘The Refutation of Idealism’ Mind 12 (1903) 433-53. Reprinted in Philosophical Studies and in *G. E. Moore: Selected Writings23-44.
  • Principia Ethica Cambridge University Press, Cambridge: 1903. *Revised edition with ‘Preface to the second edition’ and other papers, ed. T. Baldwin, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge: 1993.
  • Ethics Williams & Norgate, London: 1912.
  • ‘External and Internal Relations’ Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society20 (1919-20) 40-62. Reprinted in Philosophical Studies and in *G. E. Moore: Selected Writings 79-105.
  • ‘The Conception of Intrinsic Value’ in Philosophical Studies. Reprinted in *Revised edition of Principia Ethica,  280-98.
  • Philosophical Studies K. Paul, Trench, Trubner & Co, London: 1922.
  • ‘A Defence of Common Sense’ in J. H. Muirhead (ed.) Contemporary British Philosophy (2nd series), Allen and Unwin, London: 1925, 193-223. Reprinted in Philosophical Papers and in *G. E. Moore: Selected Writings106-33.
  • ‘Is Existence a Predicate?’ Aristotelian Society Supplementary volume 15 (1936) 154-88. Reprinted in Philosophical Papers and in *G. E. Moore: Selected Writings 134-46.
  • ‘Proof of an External World’ Proceedings of the British Academy 25 (1939) 273-300. Reprinted in Philosophical Papers and in *G. E. Moore: Selected Writings 147-70.
  • ‘A Reply to My Critics’ in P. A. Schilpp (ed.) The Philosophy of G. E. Moore Northwestern University Press, Evanston ILL: 1942, 535-677.
  • Some Main Problems of Philosophy George, Allen and Unwin, London: 1953.
  • ‘Certainty’ in Philosophical Papers 226-251. Reprinted in *G. E. Moore: Selected Writings 171-96.
  • Philosophical Papers George, Allen and Unwin, London: 1959.
  • The Elements of Ethics, T. Regan (ed.), Temple University Press, Philadelphia PA: 1991.
  • G. E. Moore: Selected Writings, T. Baldwin (ed.), Routledge, London: 1993.

For a complete bibliography of Moore's published writings up to 1966, see P. A. Schilpp (ed.) The Philosophy of G. E. Moore Northwestern University Press, Evanston ILL: 1942, 691-701.

Secondary Sources


  • P. A. Schilpp (ed.) The Philosophy of G. E. Moore Northwestern University Press, Evanston ILL: 1942.
  • A. Ambrose and M. Lazerowitz (eds.) G. E. Moore: Essays in Retrospect Allen and Unwin, London: 1970.
  • T. Baldwin G. E. Moore Routledge, London: 1990.

Section 1. Life and Career

  • J. M. Keynes ‘My Early Beliefs’ in Two Memoirs Hart-Davis, London: 1949.
  • G. Ryle ‘G. E. Moore’ in Collected Papers I, Hutchinson, London: 1971.

Section 2. The Refutation of Idealism

  • C. Ducasse ‘Moore's Refutation of Idealism’ in P. A. Schilpp (ed.) The Philosophy of G. E. Moore.
  • P. Hylton Russell, Idealism and the Emergence of Analytic Philosophy Oxford University Press, Oxford: 1990.

Section 3. Principia Ethica

  • C. D. Broad ‘Certain Features in Moore's Ethical Doctrines’ in P. A. Schilpp (ed.) The Philosophy of G. E. Moore.
  • W. J. Frankena ‘Obligation and Value in the Ethics of G. E. Moore’ in P. A. Schilpp (ed.) The Philosophy of G. E. Moore.
  • W. J. Frankena ‘The Naturalistic Fallacy’ Mind 48 (1939).
  • N. M. Lemos Intrinsic Value. Cambridge University Press, Cambridge: 1994.
  • W. D. Ross The Right and the Good Oxford University Press, Oxford: 1930.
  • N. Sturgeon ‘Ethical Intuitionism and Ethical Naturalism’ in P. Stratton-Lake (ed.) Ethical Intuitionism Oxford University Press, Oxford: 2002.
  • Ethics 113 (2003) — special edition for centenary of Principia Ethica
  • The Journal of Value Inquiry 37 (2003) — special edition for centenary of Principia Ethica.

Section 4. Philosophical Analysis

  • B. Russell The Problems of Philosophy, Williams and Norgate, London: 1912.
  • N. Malcolm ‘Moore and Ordinary Language’ in P. A. Schilpp (ed.) The Philosophy of G. E. Moore.
  • J. Wisdom ‘Moore's Technique’ in P. A. Schilpp (ed.) The Philosophy of G. E. Moore.

Section 5. Perception and Sense-data

  • O. K. Bowsma ‘Moore's Theory of Sense-data’ in P. A. Schilpp (ed.) The Philosophy of G. E. Moore.
  • R. Chisholm ‘The Theory of Appearing’ in R. Swarz (ed.) Perceiving, Sensing and Knowing Doubleday & Co., Garden City NY: 1965, 168-86.
  • G. A. Paul ‘Is There a Problem about Sense-Data?’ in R. Swarz (ed.) Perceiving, Sensing and Knowing Doubleday & Co., Garden City NY: 1965, 271-87.

Section 6. Common Sense and Certainty

  • T. Clarke ‘The Legacy of Skepticism’ Journal of Philosophy (1972).
  • N. Malcolm ‘Defending Common Sense’ Philosophical Review (1949).
  • N. Malcolm ‘Moore and Wittgenstein on the sense of “I Know”’ in Thought and Language, Cornell University Press, Ithaca NY: 1977.
  • M. McGinn Sense and Certainty Blackwell, Oxford: 1989.
  • A. Stroll Moore and Wittgenstein Oxford University Press, New York: 1994.
  • B. Stroud The Significance of Philosophical SkepticismOxford University Press, Oxford: 1984.
  • L. Wittgenstein On Certainty Blackwell, Oxford: 1969.
  • C. J. Wright ‘Facts and Certainty’ Proceedings of the British Academylxxi (1985) 429-72.

Section 7. Moore's Legacy

  • L. Wittgenstein Philosophical Investigations Blackwell, Oxford: 1953 (see part II section x for ‘Moore's paradox’).

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