The Normativity of Meaning and Content
There is a long tradition of thinking of language as conventional in its nature, dating back at least to Aristotle (De Interpretatione). By appealing to the role of conventions, it is thought, we can distinguish linguistic signs, the meaningful use of words, from mere natural ‘signs’. During the last century the thesis that language is essentially conventional has played a central role within philosophy of language, and has even been called a platitude (Lewis 1969). More recently, the focus has been less on the conventional nature of language than on the claim that meaning is essentially normative in a wider sense, leaving it open whether the normativity in question should be understood in terms of conventions or not (Kripke 1982).
Normativism is not limited to language, however – versions of it have also been defended in the case of mental content. It has been suggested that a mental state has content only if there are certain norms in force for it. According to many, the essentially normative aspect of meaning and content reflects a deep-lying contrast between mind and nature.
This essay discusses a number of central normativist theses with respect to meaning as well as to content. We begin by identifying different versions of meaning normativism, presenting the arguments that have been put forth for and against them. We then continue by discussing content normativism, providing an overview of the contemporary debate. Both debates are very much on-going and at this point there is little consensus as to whether normativism holds for either meaning or content. Since the first publication of this essay much of the debate has focused on two of its central issues: First, it has been debated whether meaning normativism can be derived from the fact that meaningful expressions necessarily have correctness conditions. This is the argument we labelled the ‘the simple argument’ and in section 2.1.1 we discuss recent contributions to the debate. Second, the nature of rule-guidance has been much discussed, in particular relating to content normativism, and new proposals have been made as to how it is to be understood. We discuss this in sections 2.2 and 3.2. It has also been argued, however, that the normativity essential to meaning (and content) is of a more ‘primitive’ character than has so far been recognized in the debate. We discuss this in section 2.1.1, 2.2.1, and specifically in section 2.2.4.
- 1. Interpretations of the Normativity Thesis
- 2. Meaning
- 3. Content
- 4. Concluding Remarks: Normativism and Naturalism
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Normativism in the theory of meaning and content is the view that linguistic meaning and/or intentional content essentially is normative. Both of its components, normativity and its essentiality to meaning/content, can be interpreted in a number of different ways, however; as a result, there is a whole family of more or less closely related views laying claim to the slogan “meaning/content is normative”.
To say that meaning/content is essentially normative is making a claim about the nature of meaning/content, about what meaning/content is. Consequently, it is at least a matter of metaphysical necessity, possibly even of conceptual necessity, that there is no meaning/content without norms. But which is prior? Metaphysically speaking, are certain norms valid, or in force, because certain things – such as linguistic expressions/intentional states – have certain meanings/contents? Or do such things have (a certain) meaning/content because certain norms are in force? Accordingly, for a given set of norms, the claim that meaning/content is essentially normative can be read in different ways: As a claim that remains neutral on the question of metaphysical priority, as claiming priority for meaning/content, or as claiming priority for norms.
Assuming that one or the other is prior if the neutral claim is true, we have distinguished between two forms of normativity: meaning/content ‘engendered’ (ME/CE) normativity and meaning/content determining (MD/CD) normativity (cf. Glüer & Wikforss 2009). MD/CD norms are such that they metaphysically determine, or constitute, meaning/content; here, the norms are prior. ME/CE normativity is normativity ‘engendered by’, or consequent upon, meaning/content. Given the actual shape of the debate where it is often argued that normative consequences can be more or less directly derived from something’s having meaning/content while remaining neutral on the issue of how this meaning/content is determined, we shall here interpret ME/CE normativism as any position according to which meaning/content is essentially such that it has normative consequences, regardless of how meaning/content is determined.
MD/CD normativism is an answer to the “foundational” question: What is it that determines meaning (and/or content)? In the context of such “foundational semantics” (the term is Stalnaker’s), the relevant determination relations aren’t merely mathematical, or functional, relations; rather, relevant are those relations “in virtue of” which something has meaning, i.e., relations “constitutive of”, or essential to, having meaning. Relations of metaphysical determination are often called “supervenience” relations. Such relations can be of many kinds. For instance, they can be one-one (equivalence relations) or many-one (“mere” supervenience relations). Some of them allow for analytic or ontological reduction, others do not. But all of them involve three elements: a set of supervenient entities SE, a set of entities forming the supervenience base SB, and a principle according to which what is in SB determines what is in SE (a function from SB to SE). What is important is that a principle of determination is required in any foundational account. As long as only the supervenience base is specified, its elements can be mapped onto meanings/contents in any old way, thus leaving meaning/content completely indeterminate. Arguably, this is one of the most important lessons of Wittgenstein’s so-called rule-following considerations (Pagin 2002).
There is a tradition of reading these considerations as ruling out realism about meaning/content (for instance Dummett 1959; Kripke 1982; Wright 1986; Travis 2006; see also Hattiangadi 2007), the view that having meaning/content consists in having, or determining, objective judgment-independent conditions of truth or correctness. In this tradition, an anti-realist, epistemic conception of truth is used as the basic semantic concept, and it is often argued that this is required precisely because there is no set of facts, no supervenience base capable of determining realist meanings/contents. Despite its partially revisionary character, semantic anti-realism does not rule out a substantive metaphysics of (anti-realist) meaning/content, however. It can be combined with both ME/CE and MD/CD normativism.
This is not true, however, of radically quietist readings of Wittgenstein according to which substantive metaphysical claims about meaning/content cannot (sensibly) be made at all (cf. Boghossian 1989a). While normativism does not commit its proponents to the possibility of reducing meaning/content to the normative, or even to the possibility of an account of meaning/content in terms of substantive necessary and sufficient conditions, it does require the possibility of stating substantive necessary conditions on meaning/content (cf. McDowell 1991; 1992).
To say that meaning/content is essentially (ME/CE or MD/CD) normative is to say that meaning/content is essentially such that certain norms are valid, or in force, whenever something has meaning/content. Being valid, or in force, however, can be understood along cognitivist or non-cognitivist lines. Cognitivists analyze normative statements as factual, truth-conditional claims answering to an independent normative reality of normative facts. Non-cognitivists claim that such statements are non-factual, and typically analyze them in terms of the psychological states of their subjects. Standardly, contemporary non-cognitivists (most prominently, Simon Blackburn and Alan Gibbard) nevertheless hold on to a “minimalist” realism about the normative. As the debate between cognitivists and non-cognitivists is of some, but not central, importance for our topic, we shall therefore assume that non-cognitivism can be combined with normativism about meaning/content.
More central will be the question: What kind of norm, what kind of normativity, are we dealing with here? Prima facie there might seem to be as many possible readings of both ME/CE and MD/CD normativism as there are kinds of norms or normativity. We shall go through the most relevant distinctions (most of which can be found in the classifications provided by von Wright 1963, chap. I; Schnädelbach 1990, 83ff). We shall see that there are at least some kinds of norms or normativity that cannot be combined with the idea that meaning/content is essentially normative.
The most basic distinction relevant here is that between norms for action and norms of being. Norms of being are often associated with evaluations; they tell us that a certain state of affairs ought to obtain, i.e., is valuable or good in a certain sense. Norms for action, on the other hand, tell us what to do. There is broad consensus that the normativity of meaning/content involves norms for action, but there at least does not seem to be anything inconsistent about construing it in purely axiological terms.
Concerning norms for action, there are at least four more dimensions along which relevant distinctions can be drawn. First, we can distinguish between instrumental and non-instrumental norms. An instrumental norm tells us what to do in order to reach a certain goal, what means to employ to a certain end, where the relation between means and end is contingent. An example von Wright gives is:
(D) If you want to make the hut habitable, you ought to heat it (von Wright 1963, 10).
The normative force of instrumental norms characteristically is contingent upon the agent’s having a certain goal, their intending, or desiring, to reach a certain end, while that of non-instrumental norms is not so dependent.
Among non-instrumental norms for action, many distinguish between prescriptions and constitutive rules (cf. Rawls 1955; Midgley 1959; von Wright 1963; Shwayder 1965; Searle 1969, chap. 2.5; Schnädelbach 1990). For reasons that will become clear shortly, we prefer to distinguish between prescriptions and other norms for action, and between constitutive and non-constitutive norms or rules. Thus, second, prescriptions are norms that can typically be formulated in deontic vocabulary, i.e., in terms of what an agent ought (not) to, or should (not) do, or in terms of what is prescribed, forbidden or allowed. The laws of the state are prime examples, and so are those of morals and etiquette. Prescriptions can be conditional, as for instance (P1), or unconditional, as for instance (P2):
(P1) At a formal dinner, you ought to wear a tie.
(P2) You ought to tell the truth.
For conditional prescriptions, we can, third, distinguish between those where the deontic operator (‘ought’, ‘should’) takes wide scope over the conditional and those were it takes narrow scope:
(CPw) You ought to (if C then do X).
(CPn) If C, you ought to (do X).
The main difference between (CPw) and (CPn) is that on (CPw), there are two ways of discharging your obligation: by doing X or by making it the case that C is not fulfilled. On (CPn) there is only one way of discharge: once C is fulfilled, you must do X. Only on (CPn), that is, can the consequent be detached.
For prescriptions, two principles are usually taken to hold intuitively. First, the principle that ought implies can, i.e., that to be prescribed, or allowed, actions have to be such that it is at least in principle possible to perform them. And second, the principle that ought implies the possibility of violation; there would seem to be no point to forbidding impossible things. Both principles are, however, slightly controversial.
Fourth, we can distinguish between constitutive and non-constitutive norms or rules. Non-constitutive rules or norms are rules or norms for a type of action, or activity, that exists independently of the rules. The prescriptions of dinner etiquette are prime examples; they regulate the independently existing practice of eating. Rules of games, on the other hand, are prime examples of constitutive rules; in some sense, they “create” the very actions, or activities, they regulate. It would, for instance, be impossible to play chess, ice hockey, or soccer, without the rules of chess, ice hockey, or soccer. According to Midgley (1959) and Searle (1963, 33ff), constitutive rules typically, and naturally, can be put into the following form:
(CR) In C, doing X counts as doing Y.
According to this suggestion, constitutive rules tell us that, in a certain context (for instance, a game of soccer), an action of type Y (for instance, scoring a goal) can be performed by means of performing an action of a different type X (for instance, kicking the ball into the goal). Prescriptions do not naturally fit this form. It has therefore been objected that this characterization of constitutive norms is too narrow – there are prescriptions that are constitutive of certain games (for instance, it’s constitutive of ice hockey that spearing is forbidden). A wider characterization of constitutive norms or rules thus counts rules or norms as constitutive of a certain action, or activity, A iff A cannot be performed, or engaged in, unless these norms are in force (cf. Glüer & Pagin 1999).
Then, there are three more relevant distinctions that apply both to norms for action and to axiological norms. First, we can distinguish between prima facie and categorical norms (or obligations) (cf. Ross 2002 ). Prima facie norms are norms that can be overridden by other norms. Thus, it might be that under very many circumstances, you ought to tell the truth, but not under all; under special circumstances this obligation may be overriden by other obligations, for instance, the obligation not to deliver your friend to the secret police. Categorical norms are such that they cannot be thus overridden.
Second, we can distinguish between norms of different provenance. There are the norms of morals, etiquette, and prudence, the laws of the state, and the rules of games. Analogously, values of different kinds can be distinguished.
And third, there are questions about what it means for each of these different kinds of rules and norms to be valid, or in force for an individual subject. Does this force derive from the individual, from a whole collective of individuals, or something else? If a norm or rule R is in force for an individual subject S, what kind of relation does S have to have to R? Is R in force for S iff S follows R, i.e., acts with the intention of doing what R requires? Or iff S accepts R in some weaker sense such that R is in force even for S‘s intentional violations of R? Or can R‘s being in force for S be conceived of in complete independence of S‘s intentional states regarding R? The answers to these questions might, of course, be different for different kinds of norms or rules.
These distinctions will be helpful in the following explorations regarding the various ways in which meaning and content have been considered to be essentially normative. Already now, however, we can somewhat limit the possible readings of this claim. We can, for instance, exclude the possibility that the norms of meaning/content are instrumental: This would not at all sit well with the idea that these norms or rules are essential to meaning. By the same token, we can exclude the possibility that they are of any other provenance than the semantic; their force must, in some way, derive from the possibility of meaning/content itself. Moreover, if the claim is that the relevant norms or rules are metaphysically prior to meaning/content, they have to be of the constitutive kind.
We have distinguished two ways in which normativism about meaning can be understood: ME normativism and MD normativism. The difference between the two, again, is that the MD normativist is committed to the metaphysical priority of norms, since the norms are said to determine meaning, while the ME normativist remains neutral on the issue of meaning determination. Both versions of meaning normativism, however, claim that the following is both necessary, and essential to, an expression e’s having meaning (for a speaker, or group of speakers, S at a time t):
(M) e means M for S at t only if a norm for e is in force for S at t.
Historically, MD normativism is associated with Wittgenstein (in particular the ‘Middle Period’ writings) and the tradition of appealing to linguistic conventions, prominent in the 1950’s and 1960’s (in the writings of Grice, Lewis, Searle and Strawson for instance). A wider notion of the normativity of meaning, ME normativism, appeared on the philosophical scene more recently, and is associated with Saul Kripke’s book on Wittgenstein’s rule-following considerations (Kripke 1982). In the book Kripke presents us with a meaning skeptic who challenges the very idea that there are facts in virtue of which our terms have a meaning. Kripke’s skeptic puts down certain constraints on the range of facts that could serve to determine meaning, among these that the essentially normative character of meaning has to be respected. The meaning determining fact, Kripke argues, must be such that it follows from it how the term ought to be applied (ibid: 11). Equipped with this normativity constraint the skeptic goes on to argue against all theories that fail to accommodate the required normative dimension of meaning, in particular dispositionalist theories according to which meaning is determined by the speaker’s dispositions to apply her terms (ibid: 22–37).
Kripke’s discussion reignited interest in the question of meaning and rules, and resulted in an enormous literature both on the skeptical argument and the very idea that meaning is essentially normative. Much of that discussion has been carried out without reference to the earlier debate on meaning and conventions, but attempts have also been made to relate the two debates. In what follows we shall first discuss ME normativism, where the discussion following Kripke’s book plays a central role, and then MD normativism.
It is clear that the type of normativity Kripke has in mind is meaning engendered normativity, or ME normativity; i.e., the claim is that meaning statements such as ‘expression e means M for S’ have normative consequences, leaving it open whether the norms are prior to meaning or not. Moreover, it is clear that the relevant normativity is that of prescriptivity, concerning what S ought to do. As noted above, arguments in support of the thesis that meaning is essentially normative need to be based on semantic premises – the normativity in question cannot derive from external sources. In the case of ME normativity, the arguments may be more or less direct, depending on more or less substantial assumptions about meaning. On one end of the spectrum are arguments that turn on the idea that there are direct conceptual entailments from meaning statements to normative consequences; on the other end are arguments that depend on substantial theoretical assumptions about meaning. In the debate, direct arguments have played a prominent role since these fit the idea, implicit in Kripke, that the claim that meaning is normative provides a pre-theoretical constraint on any acceptable theory of meaning; one that has to be accepted independently of one’s specific semantic theory. However, the normativity thesis need not serve as a pre-theoretical constraint – as long as the thesis is that meaning is essentially normative it qualifies, even if indirect arguments will be more controversial. Let us begin with the most well known direct argument in support of ME normativity, what we call ‘the simple argument’.
2.1.1 The Simple Argument
The classic defense of ME normativity can be found in Paul Boghossian (1989a). According to Boghossian the normativity of meaning derives from the fact that meaningful expressions have correctness conditions. If ‘green’ means green, Boghossian argues, it follows immediately that ‘green’ applies correctly only to green objects, and this, in turn, has immediate normative consequences for how a speaker S should apply ‘green’: “The fact that the expression means something implies, that is, a whole set of normative truths about my behavior with that expression: namely, that my use is correct in application to certain objects and not in application to others (513).” (See also Blackburn 1984: 281, Miller 1998:198, Whiting 2007 and 2009.) The strategy, therefore, is to move from (CM), to a normative conclusion, (ME1):
(CM) For any speaker S, and any time t: if ‘green’ means green for S at t, then it is correct for S to apply ‘green’ to an object x iff x is green at t.
(ME1) For any speaker S, and any time t: if ‘green’ means green for S at t, then S ought to apply ‘green’ to an object x iff x is green at t.
(CM) can hardly be challenged: Meaningful expressions have semantic correctness conditions. Of course, there is some controversy as to how these correctness conditions are to be construed, whether the basic notion of semantic correctness is that of truth or warranted assertability, for instance. However, it cannot be questioned that some notion of semantic correctness is required. This, indeed, seems to be part of the very concept of meaning. If, therefore, the notion of semantic correctness is an essentially normative notion, we would have a very direct argument in support of ME normativity, based simply on conceptual entailments. Before discussing the argument, let us make some preliminarily remarks concerning (ME1).
First, what is it to apply an expression? It should be clear that the relevant notion of application is that of predication. For instance, we apply a predicate such as ‘green’ when we use it in an assertion, to predicate a property of an object x. In the case of singular terms, similarly, what is of relevance is referential use. The notion of application, hence, is more narrow than that of use, since we use our terms in a wide variety of ways that do not include the expression of judgments, as when we ask a question or make a hypothetical statement (see Millar 2004: 162).
Second, how should the deontic operator in (ME1) be construed? Since (ME1) involves an embedded conditional, we may in fact distinguish between three readings, a narrow scope reading, an intermediate and a wide scope reading:
(ME1′) If ‘green’ means green for S at t, then (S ought to (apply ‘green’ to x) iff x is green).
(ME1″) If ‘green’ means green for S at t, then (S ought to (apply ‘green’ to x iff x is green)).
(ME1′′′) S ought to (if ‘green’ means green for S at t, apply ‘green’ to x iff x is green).
In the debate, all three construals can be found. Thus, it has been suggested that the intermediate scope interpretation best captures the intuition that if S means green by ‘green’ she is thereby obligated to use the term in certain ways (under certain conditions), without (as on the narrow scope reading) implying that the obligation is conditional on x being green (Hattiangadi 2006: 225, fn 4). Another issue concerns the possibility of detaching. Some favor the narrow scope reading, since it allows one to detach the ‘ought’, and supports the intuition that the semantic obligation can only be discharged one way: in this case, by applying ‘green’ to green objects (Bykvist & Hattiangadi 2007: 283). Others prefer the wide scope reading, precisely because it does not allow one to detach ‘ought’ and hence implies a more disjunctive obligation: S ought either to apply ‘green’ to green objects, or not mean green by ‘green’ (Gampel 1995: 228, Millar 2004: 168–169).
A related question is whether (ME1) clashes with the widely endorsed principle that ought implies can. As it stands, (ME1) can be read as implying that S has an obligation to apply ‘green’ to all green objects, an obligation that cannot possibly be fulfilled (Hattiangadi 2007: 180). One response to this is to endorse the wide scope reading, (ME1′′′), since it allows the subject to discharge her obligation by not meaning green by ‘green’ – something that does seem to be in her power. Another response consists in removing the biconditional in (ME1), replacing it with a weaker principle (Whiting 2007: 137):
(ME2) For any speaker S, and any time t: if ‘green’ means green for S at t, then S ought to apply ‘green’ to an object x only if x is green at t.
The question has been raised, however, whether (ME2) is sufficiently strong to support ME normativity. The trouble is that (ME2) does not seem to place any normative constraints on the subject’s behavior. If x is green, it no longer follows that S ought to apply ‘green’ to x, whereas if x is not green it just follows that it is not the case that S ought to apply ‘green’ to x. The latter, it has been stressed, is distinct from the claim that S ought not to apply ‘green’ to x – for instance, it is compatible with it being permissible to apply ‘green’ to x (Bykvist & Hattiangadi 2007: 280). This means that (ME2) fails to support the claim that when S applies a term in a way that is semantically incorrect, then she has done what she ought not do: ‘semantically incorrect’ and ‘ought not’ thus come apart.
In response it has been suggested that ‘ought’ in (ME1) is replaced by a ‘may’. This allows the normativist to retain the biconditional and yet avoid the troubles caused by the principle that ought implies can: That an action is correct implies only that one may do it, not that one is obligated to do it, and there is no principle that ought implies can. If ‘green’ is true of green objects only then S may apply ‘green’ to an object if and only if it is green, and this is not in conflict with the fact that the subject is not able to apply ‘green’ to every green object there is (Whiting 2009: 544 and 2010: 216, Peregrin 2012: 88).
There is therefore some initial unclarity as to precisely which prescription is supposed to follow directly from (CM). A more fundamental question is whether the strategy of the simple argument can succeed in the first place. Opponents of ME normativity do not challenge (CM) which, again, seems trivially true. Rather, they deny that (CM) has normative consequences just by itself. The crucial claim here is that ‘correct’ can be used both normatively and non-normatively (cf. Glüer 2001, Glüer & Wikforss 2009, 36 and 2015a). If that is true, the simple argument won’t go through: Rather, an additional premise will be required to the effect that ‘correct’ in (CM) is used normatively. And whether or not that premise can be supplied, the argument won’t be direct anymore.
Anti-normativists usually go further and claim that the way ‘correct’ is used in (CM) in fact is non-normative. What the appeal to correctness conditions gives us, it is claimed, is only a way of categorizing applications of ‘green’ into two basic kinds (the true and the false, for instance), and this does not in itself entail that one ought to apply the term in any particular way. The notion of semantic correctness is non-normative in just this sense: That an application of e is correct, does not entail that it ought to be made, and, conversely, incorrect applications do not immediately imply that S has violated any semantic prescription. If ‘green’ means green then S applying it to a red object implies that her statement is false, but it does not thereby follow that she has failed to do what she ought, semantically, to do (Fodor 1990, Horwich 1995, Glüer 1999, 2001, Wikforss 2001, Dretske 2000, Hattiangadi 2006; 2009a). , 
Proponents of the direct argument respond by insisting that the notion of semantic correctness is a normative notion. To many, this seems a simple conceptual truth holding for the notion of correctness in general, and therefore also for that of semantic correctness (Gibbard 2005: 358, Whiting 2007: 135 and 2009: 538). Normativists also appeal to ordinary usage here, suggesting that ‘correct’ is normally used normatively and should therefore be interpreted that way in semantics as well (Whiting 2009: 538, Peregrin 2012: 84). That hasn’t convinced anti-normativists who point out that dictionaries such as Merriam-Webster’s commonly list normative and non-normative usages for the adjective ‘correct’ (Glüer & Wikforss 2015a).
Normativists have also argued that even if the basic semantic concept itself wasn’t normative, the notion of semantic correctness still would or could be. Semantic correctness, it is argued, is not simply the same as, for instance, truth. Normativists here appeal to a distinction stressed by Rosen (2001: 620) between correctness and the ‘correctness making feature’, the (non-normative) property something must have in order to count as correct. According to Rosen, correctness is a higher-order property. To say that something is correct is not just to say that the correctness making features are in place (as when someone plays the notes of the Moonlight Sonata) but to make the higher-order claim that the action (the piano performance) possesses the feature that makes for correctness in acts of that kind (the act of playing the Moonlight Sonata). Similarly, it is argued, to say that applying ‘green’ to a green object is correct, is to say that the application has a certain non-normative property (the expression applies truly) but it is also to make the higher-order statement that the application possesses the feature that makes it correct in a normative sense. Even if the basic word-world relation is non-normative, therefore, it does not follow that the property of correctness does not have a normative dimension (Speaks 2009: 408, Whiting 2009: 540, Fennell 2013: 58–59). It is difficult to see, however, how something like ‘the correctness making feature’ could strictly speaking be a second-order property (i.e. a property of a property). It is one and the same object that both has the correctness making feature and is correct, after all. Rather, Rosen-style correctness is a first-order, second-level property (to use the terminology of Russell’s ramified theory of types). More importantly, even if that is the best way to construe the intuitive general notion of correctness, all this means is that it might be possible to provide arguments for the claim that the notion of semantic correctness is normative even if we agree that the basic semantic concept itself is not normative. But the basic anti-normativist challenge applies to Rosen-style correctness just as to any other construal of the intuitive, general notion of correctness: Since ‘correct’ can be used normatively and non-normatively, there is no simple, direct implication from correctness to normativity (cf. Glüer & Wikforss 2009, 37, fn. 10; 2015).
This strand in the debate might seem to suggest that behind the discussion of the simple argument lies nothing but a basic clash of intuitions. The anti-normativist denies what the normativist asserts – that the concept of semantic correctness is an essentially normative concept. A possible conclusion, therefore, is that the normativist and the anti-normativist operate with different concepts of semantic correctness. This raises the question, however, whether there is nevertheless co-extensionality between the two concepts. As long as (CM) is the common starting point this would seem to be the case; any sorting effected by the normative distinction between correctness and incorrectness will coincide with the sorting effected by the non-normative distinction. If so, it would seem that further arguments are required to resolve the dispute, beyond the appeal to intuitions: The normativist would have to provide some reasons why the non-normativist notion of correctness is not a notion of semantic correctness. This poses a special challenge to normativists who appeal to Rosen’s distinction and grant that the basic semantic relation is non-normative: If this relation is non-normative then the question is not whether the concept of semantic correctness could be given a normative construal but whether semantics needs such a construal (Glüer & Wikforss 2015a).
Another strand in the discussion of the simple argument concerns the status of the relevant semantic obligations. Here it is often emphasized that semantic obligations are merely prima facie and may be overridden by other obligations, such as the obligation (in a certain context) to tell a lie. It is therefore not an objection to ME normativity that there are situations in which ‘green’ means green for S, without it being the case that S ought to apply ‘green’ to green objects only (Whiting 2007: 139 and 2009: 546).
This appeal to prima facie obligations has been challenged. What is distinctive of a prima facie obligation, as opposed to a mere instrumental means-end imperative, is that it cannot be overridden by mere desires. However, it is argued, if S has no desire to speak the truth, then S has no obligation to apply ‘green’ to green objects. For instance, if neither S, nor her audience, care whether S tells the truth, then there is no obligation to apply ‘green’ correctly. Hence, (CM) does not even yield prima facie obligations (Hattiangadi 2006: 232 and 2007:189). In response, the normativists suggest that in such a situation the speaker’s use would nevertheless be semantically incorrect and involve a violation of her semantic obligations. The violation would not be very serious, but it would still be a violation (Whiting 2007: 139). This has been challenged, too. Verheggen, for instance, argues that Whiting’s attempt to back this up by the possibility of criticising a speaker who misapplies an expression out of mere desire is not convincing. After all, the speaker acts as she does precisely because of what she means by the expression – therefore, there is no semantic reason to criticize her (Verheggen 2011, 562).
Nevertheless, it would be hasty to conclude that nothing but instrumental norms can be derived from meaning facts in conjunction with desires. As noted above, it is clear that an appeal to merely instrumental norms, or means-ends norms, fails to support the idea that meaning is essentially normative. Although facts about correctness conditions may play a role in the generation of instrumental norms such as “If you wish to communicate with ease you ought to apply ‘green’ to x if and only if x is green”, the ought in question derives from the agent’s desires and intentions (given certain empirical facts, regularities, or laws), not from the correctness conditions themselves. Indeed, very many facts can play a role in the generation of instrumental norms without thereby being intrinsically normative – for instance, given the laws of nature, facts about the weather, taken together with facts about my desires, have implications for how I should dress (Coates 1986, Bilgrami 1993, Glüer 2001, Wikforss 2001, Hattiangadi 2006, 2009b). Not all hypothetical norms are instrumental, or based on contingent means-ends relations, however. An example would be the following: If you want to castle in chess, you should (or indeed: must) move your king and one of your rooks in a certain way. Similarly, it has been suggested that there is an important difference between hypothetical norms involving ordinary non-normative facts (such as facts about the weather) and norms involving meaning facts: Since meaning facts are constituted by correctness conditions, meaning facts always dictate how I should behave when I intend to produce a meaningful utterance. Even though what they dictate depends on my particular desires in the situation, the fact that they dictate something does not depend on any desire – in contrast to the dictates derivable from weather facts (Verheggen 2011: 563). One might wonder, though, whether the cases ultimately really are disanalogous: Just as one might not care whether one gets wet or stays dry, it might seem, one might just not care whether what one says is semantically correct or not – do correctness conditions really dictate anything if all I want to do is say something meaningful?
Before considering alternative arguments in support of ME normativity, let us comment on the relation between Kripke’s normativity constraint and the so called ‘problem of error’. As noted above, Kripke takes his normativity constraint to rule out dispositionalist accounts of meaning. Kripke formulates his objection to dispositionalism in various ways: Dispositions only concern what the agent will do, not what she should do (1982: 29; 37); the dispositionalist cannot account for mistakes (ibid. 30–35); dispositionalist facts are not guiding and cannot justify the agent’s actions (ibid. 37). In the debate, the main focus has been on the question whether the dispositionalist can account for the possibility of mistake or error. For an expression meaning green, for instance, it is just as much a platitude that mistaken or erroneous application is (in principle) possible as that the expression has correctness conditions. Indeed, for such an expression the possibility of error or mistake is little more than a reflection of (CM): There must be a distinction between correct and incorrect applications. The question, then, is the following: If meaning is determined by how S is disposed to use her term, then how could she use the term incorrectly? It has been argued that she couldn’t – rather, every apparent error would just indicate a difference in meaning. Hence, the dispositionalist would be in danger of undermining the distinction between what seems right to the speaker (in the sense of being disposed to apply a particular expression) and what is right (Boghossian 1989a: 537–540).
It is much disputed whether the dispositionalist can solve this problem. It should be noted, however, that the problem of error does not seem to have much to do with semantic normativity (Fodor 1990: 135–136, Bilgrami 1992, Wikforss 2001: 208, Hattiangadi 2006: 229, 2007: 186). The error objection does not turn on the fact that the dispositionalist cannot allow for semantic oughts but, rather, on the fact that we must not construe the relation between the meaning determining facts and meaning in such a way that mistake is ruled out.
Of course, even provided with a solution to the problem of error dispositionalism might come to grief with Kripke’s skeptic. Solving the problem of error requires showing that there is a plausible principle P assigning meanings to expressions on the basis of the speaker’s dispositions to use them, a principle underwriting plausible ascriptions of error. On a quite plausible interpretation of the skeptic’s main strategy – i.e. that of “quussing” candidate facts – this strategy is as applicable here as elsewhere. If, for instance, P assigns addition to ‘plus‘ on the basis of disposition D, the skeptic will want to know why this is the right principle – as opposed to some other principle P’ assigning quaddition to ‘plus’ on the basis of D. As the mere fact of the speaker’s having D does nothing to determine which of these principles is the right one, dispositional facts are as quussable as any of the other candidates – and this remains the case even if your dispositionalism comes with a plausible principle of meaning determination (cf. Pagin 2002, 160f).
But pointing to the possibility of quussing is not the same thing as raising a normativity objection. Raising a normativity objection to dispositionalism requires additional considerations. Ginsborg (2011a, b) and (2012) suggests some such additional considerations. Ginsborg argues that dispositionalism can be defended against both Kripke’s error and finitude objections and, further, that dispositional facts cannot be quussed. According to her interpretation of Kripke, the quus-hypothesis undermines those, and only those, candidates for the role of meaning determining fact that aspire to guide, instruct, or justify a speaker’s use of their terms. Since dispositionalism has no such aspirations, it is not vulnerable to quussing (2011b, 155; for criticism, see Haddock 2012, Verheggen 2015). Nevertheless, Ginsborg maintains, dispositionalism cannot be the full story; taken just by itself, it ultimately does fall prey to a normativity objection.
To make this plausible, Ginsborg argues that there is a version of the normativity objection that is more fundamental than those investigated in the debate so far. In this version, the relevant norms are not supposed to provide guidance, justification, or reasons for using expressions one way or another – according to her, it is precisely these requirements that generate vulnerability to quussing. Rather, sensitivity to the relevant norms is needed to secure understanding. The pure dispositionalist, Ginsborg argues, cannot distinguish the intelligent use of language from mere parroting or other automatic behaviour. Intuitively, the parrot, or the automaton, do not use expressions with understanding. Using an expression with understanding requires grasping its meaning, and this involves not only being disposed to use it in a certain way, but also being disposed to ‘take it’ that the expression ought to be used the way one is disposed to use it. The attitude required is one of “primitive appropriateness” – such appropriateness cannot be explicated in terms of truth (Ginsborg 2012, 132), and taking something to be appropriate in this sense does not require any prior grasp of rules, concepts, or meaning (ibid. 137f). Primitive normativity thus is one of the central notions in Ginsborg’s partially reductive account of meaning determination, according to which “expressions have meaning only in virtue of there being ways in which they [primitively] ought to be applied” (ibid. 132). This is a (new) form of MD-normativism, and we shall return to it below (in section 2.2, esp. 2.2.1 and 2.2.4).
Next, let us consider alternative arguments in support of ME normativity.
2.1.2 Using an Expression in Accordance with its Meaning
An alternative to the simple argument is to suggest that there is a further notion of semantic correctness, one that is not co-extensional with that of (CM) but that is both essential to meaning and normative. Thus, it has been claimed that there is a crucial ambiguity in the notion of correct use (Millar 2004: 160). On the one hand, there is the notion of semantic correctness as in (CM); on the other hand there is the notion of correct use as in ‘using an expression in accordance with its meaning’. That the two do not coincide is clear from the fact that one may use an expression in accordance with its meaning, and yet make a false statement, as when one has a false belief about the world (McGinn 1984, Millar 2002, 2004: 160–175; Moore 1954/1955: 308; Sellars 1956: 166, Buleandra 2008: 180, Fennell 2013: 69). We must distinguish empirical mistakes from linguistic mistakes, it is argued, and it is essential that we are able to allow for both. Moreover, it is said, this further notion of semantic correctness is an essentially normative notion, one that has implications for what S ought to do or is obligated to do: if ‘green’ means green for S, then S ought to use ‘green’ in accordance with its meaning. (This idea, too, goes back to Kripke who, at points, speaks of what I should do, if my use of the term is to be “in accordance with how it was meant” (1982: 30, 37).)
How is the notion of ‘using an expression in accordance with its meaning’ to be construed? According to one proposal, it concerns which expressions are ‘appropriate’ or ‘suitable’ for expressing a certain belief. The notion of ‘suitability’, in turn, is derived from the ordinary semantic correctness conditions taken together with what I intend to express by my expressions: If ‘green’ applies correctly only to green objects, and I mean to express my belief that x is green, then I ought to use the term ‘green’ and not, say, ‘red’. This allows for the possibility that my use is correct in the sense of (CM), and yet linguistically incorrect (if x is red and I use the term ‘red’ to express my belief that x is green); and, vice versa, that my use is incorrect in the sense of (CM), but linguistically correct (if x is red and I use the term ‘green’ to express my belief that x is green) (McGinn 1984: 60, Millar 2004: 162–163). Hence, in the place of (CM) we have:
(CM*) For any speaker S, and any time t: if ‘green’ means green for S at t, then it is correct for S at t to apply ‘green’ to an object x iff S intends to express the belief that x is green at t.
Possible misuses are said to include both performance errors (such as slips of the tongue) and so-called meaning errors (as when the speaker thinks ‘arcane’ means ancient) (Millar 2004: 163).
This raises the question of what motivates this further notion of correctness. While it is a platitude that meaningful expressions have semantic correctness conditions, it is not a platitude that an expression is meaningful only if there are these further correctness conditions, and this leaves it open to opponents of ME normativity to question the semantic relevance of (CM*). If ‘green’ means green for S, and S uses ‘red’ to express her belief that x is green, she may fail in her communicative intentions (although not necessarily, consider the use of irony and metaphor), but does it follow that she has used her expressions incorrectly in a semantically relevant sense? The added notion of correctness, it may therefore be argued, simply does no semantic work. In this respect there appears to be an important difference between the notion of semantic correctness in (CM) and that of (CM*): While it is essential that we allow for the possibility of using an expression incorrectly in the sense of (CM), making room for empirical error, it may not seem as important that we allow for the possibility of using an expression incorrectly in the sense of (CM*), making room for linguistic error. This concern has been raised by some normativists as well. For instance, Whiting (2013) argues that it is a mistake to try to defend normativism on these grounds, and that the normativist should stick to the orthodox interpretation that takes as its starting point (CM).
In the literature, the most common route to the conclusion that we need some such further notion of semantic correctness goes via assumptions about the nature of understanding (Wright 1980: 20, McDowell 1984, McGinn 1984:109, Kotatko 1998, Millar 2004, Buleandra 2008, Fennell 2012). Understanding the meaning of a term, it is argued, involves using it in accordance with its meaning and, moreover, feeling obligated to thus using it. To learn the meaning of an expression, McDowell writes for instance, “is to acquire an understanding that obliges us subsequently … to judge and speak in certain determinate ways, on pain of failure to obey the dictates of the meaning we have grasped” (1984: 45). This motivates the appeal to further correctness conditions, it is held, since a speaker may fully understand a term while using it in a false judgment and, conversely, use the term in a true judgment while failing to understand the term properly.
The idea that understanding puts constraints on use is often combined with the claim that there are rationality constraints on meaning attributions. Thus, it has been suggested that the normativity of meaning flows from the idea that when interpreting another speaker, the interpretation is constrained by the principle that the other should come out as being by and large rational and not wildly mistaken. Using an expression in accordance with its meaning, is using the expression in a way that ‘makes sense’, and does not violate these rationality constraints. The normativity of meaning, on this view, simply follows from something like the Davidsonian idea that meaning and intentional content are determined by the principle of charity (McDowell & Pettit 1986, 11; Millar 2004; Zangwill 1998; Kriegel 2010). According to the principle of charity, the best interpretation of a speaker S is that which optimizes overall coherence and truth across S’s utterances and beliefs, but also their desires and actions (e.g., Davidson 1991, 211; for more on the principle of charity, see Glüer 2011, ch. 3).
The route via understanding depends on assumptions about the nature of linguistic understanding that may be challenged. For instance, even if it is granted that understanding the meaning of an expression e involves using e in certain ways (something which may also be questioned, see Williamson 2007), it is a further supposition that this brings with it an additional notion of semantic correctness/incorrectness. It might simply be said that unless one uses ‘green’ in certain ways one does not mean green by ‘green’. That is, if one does not use the expression in accordance with the meaning green, then it does not follow that one uses one’s expression incorrectly, but merely that one uses it with a different meaning. This ties understanding to use without appealing to the notions of correct and incorrect use. Thus, the speaker who (regularly) uses ‘arcane’ in accordance with the standard meaning of ‘ancient’, means ancient and not arcane by her expression (Davidson 1986). In fact, it has been suggested that the appeal to rationality constraints mandates this: It is precisely because the standard interpretation would imply attributing unacceptable error and irrationality that the term needs to be reinterpreted (for a discussion of the principle of charity see section 2.2).
A related argument appeals not to the nature of understanding, but to the nature of intentions (Wright 1984, 1987, McDowell 1991). Kripke, at one point, stresses that the relation of meaning and intention to future action is normative, not descriptive (1982: 37). What he seems to have in mind is the idea that there is an internal relation between an intention and what fulfills it: if S intends to do A, only doing A will fulfil her intention (ibid: 25). Similarly, it is suggested, if S intends ‘green’ to mean green, then S has to do certain things in order for her intention to be fulfilled. Obviously, it cannot be that what she has to do is apply the term correctly in the sense of (CM). That would have the disastrous consequence that if she applies ‘green’ to a non-green object, it immediately follows that S does not mean green by ‘green’, and hence all possibility of empirical error is ruled out. Rather, what S has to do to fulfil her intention is to use ‘green’ in accordance with its meaning.
It has been argued that this move fails to strengthen the normativist case. If, indeed, the intention to mean green by ‘green’ is fulfilled only if S uses ‘green’ in accordance with its meaning, then there can be no such thing as meaning green by ‘green’ while not using the expression in accordance with its meaning. It follows that failing to use an expression in accordance with its meaning is not using the expression linguistically incorrectly, but using it with a different meaning. Thus it is argued that the claim that there is an internal relation between an intention and its fulfilment, far from supporting ME normativity, is in tension with it (Glüer & Wikforss 2009: 48–51). It should be noted that this objection is premised on the principle, mentioned above, that ought implies the possibility of violation: If the relation between intention and future action is internal there is no possibility of violation, the reasoning goes, hence the relation cannot be both internal and prescriptive. (The principle is stressed by Mulligan 1999, Railton 1999, 3f; Williamson 2000, 241; Glüer 2001; Glüer & Wikforss 2009.)
Questions can also be raised concerning the normative consequences of the notion of ‘using a word in accordance with its meaning’. Assuming that this further notion of correctness is essential to meaning and that we need to be able to allow for meaning errors, does it follow that speakers ought to use their terms correctly, in this sense? Do we have a semantic obligation to use our expressions in accordance with their meaning? As in the case of the simple argument, it might be argued that the appearance of an ought here derives from added normative premises, such as instrumental norms concerning the ease of communication, or pragmatic norms regulating speech acts.
In response it has been suggested that the relevant normative consequences should not be understood in terms of obligations but, rather, in terms of commitments. This is the line taken by Alan Millar (2002 and 2004). Meaning statements, such as “‘Green’ means green”, Millar argues, are true in virtue of there being a rule-governed practice. If S uses ‘green’ to mean green, therefore, she becomes a participant in this practice and incurs a commitment to use the term accordingly. To be properly committed, Millar suggests, S has to be disposed to adjust her use if she discovers that it is not in keeping with the meaning of the expression (as when S uses ‘arcane’ to mean ancient). The commitment is not dependent on one’s desire to communicate, or on the intention to speak the truth, but merely on S participating in the practice of using ‘green’ with a certain meaning. However, Millar stresses, it does not follow that she ought to use her expressions a certain way, since it does not follow that she ought to participate in the practice – there may be reasons to withdraw from the practice instead. Hence, one may participate in a practice without it following that one ought to “carry out the performances associated with one’s role” (Millar 2004: 173).
This proposal illustrates how ME normativity might be derived from MD normativity: Meaning statements have normative consequences, according to Millar, because meaning is determined by the speaker following certain rules. Metaphysically the rules come first and make meaning possible. Before turning to a discussion of MD normativity, let us briefly consider some other arguments put forth in support of ME normativity.
2.1.3 Alternative Arguments
The arguments above are all attempts to show that meaning statements have normative implications. An alternative strategy is to suggest that meaning statements simply are prescriptions. When we state “‘Green’ means green” we may appear to be making a descriptive statement whereas, in fact, we are prescribing how ‘green’ ought to be used (Gauker 2007, 2011, Lance & O’Leary Hawthorne 1997, Peregrin 2012: 96, Gibbard 2012). This proposal can either be construed as a claim about the semantic content of meaning statements, or as a claim about the typical use of meaning statements. Thus, a statement may be used prescriptively, while having a descriptive, factual content (‘In this classroom we raise our hands before speaking’).
If the suggestion is that meaning statements have a prescriptive content it would provide another very direct argument in support of ME normativity, one that does not have to proceed via the controversial claim that the notion of semantic correctness is an essentially normative notion. This is an advantage over the simple argument. However, there are also disadvantages. For instance, the question arises whether the claim that meaning statements lack descriptive content can accommodate the role of such statements in inferential contexts. (See Gauker 2007: 194–195 for a discussion.) Another question concerns the implications from ‘ought’-statements to meaning statements. According to the simple argument, “‘Green’ ought to be applied to x if and only if x is green” follows immediately from “‘Green’ means green”. According to this argument the converse also holds: “‘Green’ means green” follows directly from “‘Green’ ought to be applied to x if and only if x is green” (c.f. Gibbard 2012: 12 and 113–115). The latter has been questioned on the grounds that even if it is true that ‘green’ ought to be applied this way, the ‘ought’ in question may not have anything to do with semantics but, say, with religious practices (Byrne 2002: 207).
These difficulties are avoided if, instead, meaning statements are simply construed as having a prescriptive use (while having a descriptive content). On either construal, however, the question arises why we should believe that meaning statements are prescriptive. One suggestion is that the prescriptive function of meaning statements follows from their role in coordinating our linguistic use (Gauker 2007 and 2012: 279). Meaning statements are proposals about how terms ought to be used, and as such they serve to determine meaning and remove an otherwise irresolvable indeterminacy (see also Gibbard 2012: 109–112. As a result, “we all think of meanings as standards that we are obliged to conform to” (2007: 185). This defense of the normativity thesis therefore turns on controversial issues concerning indeterminacy. Another proposal shuns the metaphysical questions concerning the nature of meaning and appeals to the function of meaning statements in our practices (Lance & O’Leary Hawthorne 1997). Instead of asking for the facts that constitute meaning, it is argued, we should consider the role of meaning statements in our socio-linguistic practices. It then emerges that such statements serve the regulative function of licensing and censoring certain uses. It should be noted that unless this proposal about the function of meaning statements is said to have some metaphysical implications concerning the nature of meaning, it will fall short of supporting the claim that meaning is essentially normative. , 
In addition, there are a variety of other arguments in support of ME normativity. One such argument grants that correctness conditions are not themselves normative, but suggests that we derive the normativity of meaning from the idea that we ought to speak the truth (Ebbs 1997, Haugeland 1998, Soames 1997: 221, 224). As noted above, this only succeeds if the obligation in question can be said to derive purely from semantic sources. The question, then, is whether there is any reason to suppose that we have a semantic obligation to speak the truth. The impression that there is, it has been suggested, is a result of a conflation of semantics and pragmatics. Thus, it is commonly held that there are rules of assertion, and some of these are such that they are violated when the speaker makes a false judgment. For instance, it has been proposed that there is a ‘knowledge rule’: “One must: assert p only if one knows p” (Williamson 2000: 242). However, opponents of ME normativity stress, these are pragmatic rules, regulating the performance of speech acts, not semantic ones. If such rules are essential for the possibility of assertion, then assertion is essentially normative, but it does not follow that meaning is (Glüer & Wikforss 2009a: 37–38, Speaks 2009). For discussion of the claim that assertion is normative, see the entry on assertion.
Another set of arguments reject the focus on correctness conditions and appeal to other aspects of Kripke’s normativity objection to dispositionalist theories. For instance, it has been suggested that the claim that meaning is essentially normative is primarily a claim about the justificatory role of meaning. Facts about meaning are, essentially, such that they are able to justify S‘s use of her terms, able to guide S‘s usage. In this sense, meaning facts are like prescriptive rules, such as the rules of etiquette – it is of their essence that they guide action or give directions. The reason dispositionalism fails, then, is not that the dispositionalist cannot account for error, but that facts about what I am disposed to do are not essentially capable of justifying (Gampel 1995: 225–231, Zalabardo 1997: 480–483, Kusch 2006: 50–94).
Whether this argument succeeds depends on whether it can be shown that the role of meaning in motivating action is equivalent to that of prescriptions. Thus, the fact that ‘green’ means green may of course guide the speaker’s actions in the sense that any facts do so – i.e., if S believes that ‘green’ means green. To show that meaning facts play a normatively guiding role, therefore, it does not suffice to appeal to the idea that meaning facts play a role in motivating action; it also has to be shown that the motivating role is that of a prescription rather than a belief (see section 2.2 below).
This raises the general question of the extent to which Kripekan normativity considerations can be isolated from the larger context within which they occur, i.e., the skeptical argument. It has been suggested that the focus on semantic correctness deflates Kripke’s arguments, leaving out his claims about justification and guidance, for instance (Kusch 2006: 62–64). Even if the skeptical conclusion can be avoided, it is held, the upshot of Kripke’s discussion is that traditional conceptions of meaning have to be rejected: Since there are no facts that serve to determine realist correctness conditions, we need to replace the realist construal of semantic correctness conditions as being judgment independent, with an anti-realist account of correctness conditions in terms of justification conditions. The normative dimension of meaning, ultimately, is to be found in the communal practice of relying on others and standing corrected (Wright 1980: 20, Hale 1997, Kusch 2006: 177–206).
However, arguments have also been made in the reverse direction, suggesting that the dialectic in fact is quite different. Since proponents of the revisionary approach rely on the idea that meaning is normative, it has been suggested, their arguments do not touch the philosopher who denies that meaning is normative and rejects the move from correctness conditions to prescriptions. That is, if the normativity constraint need not be met, and if it suffices that we appeal to facts that serve to determine semantic (realist) correctness conditions, the skeptical challenge may appear less formidable and, as a result, the revisionary response less motivated (Hattiangadi 2007: 207).
In the discussion of ME normativity so far it is assumed that the relevant norms are norms for action, prescriptions for the speaker’s use of her expressions. This, again, is how Kripke discusses the topic and how those writing on Kripke tend to construe the relevant normativity. However, as far as ME normativity goes, normative consequences might also be construed axiologically. Thus, it might be argued that semantically correct applications, by themselves, are valuable. This, too, would show that meaning is an essentially normative notion, although in a different sense than the standard one. And in this case too, the crucial question would be whether the step from (CM) to normative consequences can be motivated. Does sorting S’s applications into the semantically correct and the semantically incorrect ones, by itself imply that actions of one or the other of these kinds are valuable (Glüer 2001: 60–61)?
Another option would be to construe the rules or norms of meaning as constitutive ones (cf. section 1.2 above). Rules of meaning, the idea would be, are rules for the use of expressions that determine the meaning of these expressions. Appealing to constitutive rules thus would mean accepting what we call MD normativism: It would mean accepting that expressions have meaning because there are rules or norms in force for their use.
Meaning determining normativism (MD normativism) is the claim that meaning is essentially such that it is (at least in part) determined by norms. Prima facie, this can either mean that the supervenience base for meaning, the set of facts metaphysically determining meaning (see section 1.1 above) contains norms, or, more precisely, normative facts (cf. Wedgwood 2007, Part II; 2009), or that the principle governing meaning determination is a “normative principle” (Jackman 2004, Other Internet Resources). In the end, this might not be a substantive difference, however. A natural idea would be that a normative determination principle involves a mapping essentially mediated by norms, or normative facts. But then, placing the relevant normative facts in the supervenience base (and using one principle of determination), or construing them as part of another principle of determination (working on a supervenience base not containing any normative facts) might amount to no more than notational variation.
The single most common form of MD normativism holds that the meaning of linguistic expressions is determined by rules for their use. This idea was famously formulated by Ludwig Wittgenstein, and we shall concentrate on it in this section. Drawing an analogy between the rules of games and those of language, Wittgenstein wrote in his so-called ‘Middle Period’:
[W]ithout these rules the word has as yet no meaning; and if we change the rules, it now has another meaning (or none), and in that case we may just as well change the word, too (PG 133).
At a minimum, MD normativism claims that the following not only is essential for, but also metaphysically prior to, an expression e‘s having meaning M (for a speaker, or group of speakers, S at a time t):
(MD) e means M for S at t only if there is a rule R for the use of e in force for S at t.
But why should we think that meaning is (essentially) rule-determined? And if it is, how exactly does this work? What kind of rule could do this job? What does it mean for such a rule to be in force for a speaker, and where does this force come from? We shall take these questions up in turn.
2.2.1 Motivations for MD Normativism
Since ancient times, philosophers have observed the arbitrary, contingent nature of the connection between linguistic expressions and their meanings. Moreover, this connection seems to be somehow ‘made by us’; what could be more natural than to think that it is established by convention?
But even though conventions might be norms or rules somehow made by us, the MD normativist cannot simply claim, for instance, that it is a convention of English that ‘green’ means green. The MD normativist wants to provide an account of what meaning is, and, to be informative, such an account needs to be formulated in non-semantic terms (cf. Davidson 1982). Moreover, it does of course not follow from a relation’s being ‘arbitrary’, contingent, or even ‘made by us’, that it is conventional in any interesting sense. There are innumerable regularities in our behavior (such as moving down hallways by putting one foot in front of the other) that are neither necessities of any sort, nor due to convention. An observation that might cast some doubt on the idea that the regularities of linguistic usage are due to convention is the following: People who follow rules, or conventions, when, for instance, playing chess or driving cars on the right hand side of the road in continental Europe, can usually, upon reflection, both at least roughly formulate the relevant rule or convention and give it as their reason for acting as they did. When it comes to the semantic rules of natural language, this is strikingly far from being the case. There are various ways in which the MD normativst could try to accommodate this observation (see section 2.2.2 below), but some explanation clearly is needed.
Over and above its intuitive appeal, there are various more theoretical reasons for MD normativism. It is, for instance, plausible to think that meaning, in some way or other, is determined by the use speakers make of linguistic expressions. If meaning determining rules are rules governing the use of linguistic expressions, MD normativism provides the beginnings of an answer to the question of just how use does this. A natural thought here is that semantic rules effect a distinction between (semantically) correct and incorrect use of an expression. An expression governed by such a rule consequently is an expression that has (semantic) correctness conditions and, thus, meaning (cf. Glock 2000). If meaning determining rules moreover are prescriptions, MD normativism provides a metaphysics directly underwriting the most common form of ME normativism: ME prescriptivism.
MD normativism is often taken to provide solutions to certain classical problems of meaning determination, most prominently the “problem of error”. As we noted above (section 2.1.1), the problem of error, by itself, would seem to be a problem for naturalistic accounts of meaning determination quite independently of normativity. It might be argued, however, that it is precisely because meaning is determined normatively that any naturalistic account is bound to misconstrue semantic correctness conditions. Or it might be argued that MD normativism’s superior capacity to deal with the problem of error provides evidence for its being the right account of meaning determination.
An argument of the first kind might draw inspiration from the writings of Donald Davidson. Davidson (1970) famously argued that meaning and intentional content are determined by a constitutive principle called the “principle of charity”, while physical predicates and concepts obey constitutive principles of a nature so radically different as to prevent any reductive account of the former in terms of the latter. According to Davidson, speakers essentially are by and large rational creatures and beliefs are by their nature ‘veridical’ (Davidson 1983), that is, by and large true in the circumstances under which they are held. According to the principle of charity, the best interpretation of a speaker S therefore is that which optimises overall coherence, or rationality, and truth across S’s utterances, propositional attitudes, and intentional actions (e.g., Davidson 1973, 1974, 1991; for more on the principle of charity, see Glüer 2011, ch. 3). Because of its appeal to rationality, the principle of charity has been interpreted as a normative principle, and Davidson as a normativist (see for instance, McDowell 1984; Hornsby 1997, 87; Gampel 1997; Hurley 1998, 5; Glock 2000; Jackman 2004; Wedgwood 2007, 161ff; Kriegel 2010).
This is disputed, however; it has been argued that precisely because the principle of charity is the principle constitutive of meaning and content in Davidson, it cannot play any normative role. It determines what meaningful utterances (contentful mental states) are, not how anything should be or what anyone should do (cf. Glüer 2001; Wikforss 2001; Schroeder 2003; Engel 2008, 187ff; for a different argument to the conclusion that charity is not a normative principle, see Bilgrami 1992, 102ff.). Quite independently, the claim that rationality is essentially normative might not appear any less controversial than the claim that meaning is (cf. Schnädelbach 1990; Kolodny 2005; Broome 2007; Glüer & Wikforss 2013a).
The MD normativist might also argue, as indicated above, that normativism prevents the problem of error from arising. Such arguments can take two forms. The normativist can argue that for instance the supervenience base that non-normative dispositionalism works with needs to be restricted: It is not the whole of a speaker’s dispositions to use their terms that determines meanings, but only a certain kind of disposition and this kind can only be specified by means of its normative properties. In this vein, Wedgwood argues more generally that it is only “rational” dispositions that determine intentional content (where rationality is taken to be a normative property; cf. Wedgwood 2007, 167ff; 2009). Normative teleosemantics can be construed as making a similar move: Here, it is those dispositions realizing the biological function of the mechanism of using an expression that determine meaning (where ‘biological function’ is taken to be something normative; cf. Millikan 1990, Neander 1995).
More radically, the MD normativist can take problems such as that of error as indicating that dispositionalism misidentifies the very kind of entitities meaning supervenes on: It is not how you are disposed to use an expression that determines its meaning, but how you are supposed to use it, i.e., the norms that are in force for the use of the expression in question (cf. Glock 2000, Brandom 1994, 159). Their being in force then might, or might not, be further reducible or analyzable, but not to dispositions for the use of expressions.
Alternatively, the MD normativist might adopt an account according to which meaning determination has two components, a dispositionalist and a normativist component. Ginsborg (2011a, b; 2012) argues that to mean something by a linguistic expression, the speaker must not only be disposed to use it in a certain way but also be disposed to take the way she is disposed to use it to be “primitively appropriate” (see above, 2.1.1). Her idea is that while dispositions do suffice for determining meanings – in the sense in which meanings can be correlated with the dispositions of both the genuine speaker and the parrot or automaton – (primitive) norms are nevertheless required for genuinely meaningful speech or understanding (cf. esp. Ginsborg 2012, 138; Ginsborg 2011a, 244f). Such an account of meaning determination would be “partially reductive” (Ginsborg 2011a, 230; 249): it would combine a naturalist component with a non-semantic but normative (and minimally intentional) component. On Ginsborg’s account, however, the (primitive) normative attitudes required for genuinely meaningful use of linguistic expressions do not determine semantic correctness conditions for these expressions – that job is to be done by the speaker’s basic dispositions to use them.
There is a widespread tendency to see naturalism and normativism as incompatible in the theory of meaning determination (see also section 4 below), but from what we just said, their relation would seem to be more complicated. Prima facie, both reductive naturalism (such as, for instance, a version of teleosemantics) and non-reductive naturalism (such as, for instance, Davidsonian dispositionalism) would seem compatible with (certain forms of) MD normativism. Normativism is incompatible with reductive naturalism only if meaning is determined by normative facts or properties that are not themselves naturalistic (normative teleosemanticists, for instance, argue that the biological notion of a function is normative). Normativism is incompatible with non-reductive naturalism only if there are no non-normative facts meaning supervenes upon.
Other influential ideas behind MD normativism include Wittgenstein-inspired skepticism towards meanings as ‘Platonic entities’; in this tradition, meanings and concepts themselves are construed as products of our norms or conventions (cf. for instance, Baker & Hacker 1985, 269ff). Another idea derives from meaning’s psychological role: It has been argued that, since competent speakers are guided in their use of expressions by the knowledge of their meanings, a knowledge that is general in form, such guidance must be construed as guidance by rules (cf., for instance, Boghossian 2008, 489; see also section 2.1.2 above). The question here would be whether guidance by some state with general content is sufficient for rule guidedness (cf. Glüer & Wikforss 2010a).
2.2.2 Meaning Determining Rules or Norms
Assume that meaning is determined by rules. How exactly does this work? What kind of rule could do this job? What does it mean for such a rule to be ‘in force’ for a speaker or group of speakers?
Meaning determining rules clearly would be constitutive rules (see section 1.2 above): Meaningful use of linguistic expressions is metaphysically impossible without such rules. Moreover, meaning determining rules (usually) are supposed to determine not only that an expression has meaning, but also which meaning it has. These ideas are drawn on by a great number of philosophers, including Wittgenstein scholars such as Baker and Hacker or Glock, as well as philosophers such as von Wright, Sellars, and Searle.
However, as we saw above there are different conceptions of constitutive rules. On the traditional view, a constitutive rule is such that it ‘creates’ new kinds of action, i.e., kinds of action that could not be performed if the rule did not exist, or were not in force. Such rules typically can be brought into the following form:
(CR) In C, doing X counts as doing Y.
Searle suggests that meaning is determined by such rules (1963, 42ff). It is not obvious, however, how this would work. Rules like this cannot determine meaning by means of the line of thought sketched above: By directly effecting a distinction between correct and incorrect uses of an expression – rules of the form (CR) do not make any such distinction (cf. Glüer & Pagin 1999). Such rules might, however, determine meaning more indirectly (cf. Glock 2000). The following might be such a rule, for instance:
(CR1) In C, uttering s counts as saying that p,
where s is a sentence. It has been argued, however, that such a rule is not truly constitutive; it does not ‘create’ the possibility of performing actions of the relevant kind, i.e., saying that p. Rather, saying that p seems to be possible independently of (CR1), and (CR1) only provides one (among many possible) means of performing such an action (cf. Glüer & Pagin 1999, 218f).
It might be more promising to allow meaning determining rules to have prescriptive force. In that case, it would be possible for them to directly effect a distinction between (semantically) correct (prescribed or allowed) and incorrect (forbidden) uses. They could nevertheless be constitutive of using an expression with the determined meaning insofar as it would be impossible to so use the expression unless the prescription was in force for the speaker.
What, then, does it mean for a meaning determining rule R to be in force for a speaker S’s use of an expression e (at a time t)? Broadly, there are three main options for the MD normativist (see section 1.2 above). According to the first, using e (at t) has to be motivated by R. For R to be in force for S’s use of e, S has to follow R in the sense of attempting to do what is in accordance with R. On the second construal, S has to accept R in some sense not requiring (all) particular uses of e to be motivated by R. Both of these would plausibly seem to require S to have certain intentional state(s). But, third, R‘s being in force for S could also be construed as independent of any of S’s intentional states (with respect to R).
The laws of the state, for instance, would seem to fall into the third category; they are in force even for those individual citizens who do not accept them. Analogously, meaning determining rules might be in force in a speech community independently of an individual speaker’s acceptance of them. Many games are in the second category; they are such that even though participation requires players to accept their rules, participants nevertheless can intentionally violate these very rules within the game. For instance, intentional spearing does occur in icehockey games, and will be punished precisely because the rule against spearing is in force even for players who spear intentionally. Again, in semantics the situation might seem analogous: Speakers can intentionally say semantically incorrect things without their expressions losing or changing their meanings (cf. Railton 1999; Glüer & Pagin 1999; Glüer 1999; 2001; Wikforss 2001). Nevertheless, it might not be possible for these rules to be in force in complete independence of a whole speech community’s attitudes towards it, and even the individual speaker might need to at least in general accept such rules.
The most common idea, however, is that expressions ‘get’ their meanings by speakers’ following the rules for their use (see, for instance, Baker & Hacker 1985, 154ff, Glock 1996, 323ff); speaking meaningfully is conceived of as a form of rule-guided action. Let’s call this form of MD normativism ‘guidance normativism’.
Guidance normativism by itself is neutral on the question of whether an individual speaker could adopt, and follow, rules for her own idiolect (as, for instance, Baker & Hacker 1985, 169ff, hold), or whether it necessarily takes a community of speakers to put semantic rules into force. Many philosophers subscribe to ‘communitarianism’, however; they hold that so-called ‘solitary’ languages, i.e., languages spoken by only one speaker, are impossible. When combined with MD normativism, communitarianism usually construes meaning determining rules as conventions adopted by whole speech communities. This is often motivated by an interpretation of Wittgenstein’s rule-following considerations and the so-called ‘private language argument’ according to which these show that the notion of a mistake does not have any application outside a whole community of speakers (among others, Kripke 1982, Wright 1980: 218–220; Peacocke 1981, McDowell 1984, Williams 1999). Another motivation is provided by, among others, Dummett. Dummett argues, first, that regular use by a whole community of speakers is a condition on an expression’s having linguistic meaning, and, second, that therefore a normative attitude towards the common language is required of each individual speaker (Dummett 1991, 85). Davidson questioned both steps of Dummett’s argument; while regularity of use usually makes communication easier there is, according to him, no regularity such that, on every particular occasion, accordance with it would be either necessary or sufficient for successful communication (cf. Davidson 1986). Moreover, even if regularity were required, Davidson argued, it would not matter how it came about; communication would be possible whether or not the required regularity was a product of normative attitudes (cf. Davidson 1994; Glüer 2013 provides a survey of these discussions).
Even more radically, it has been questioned whether it is even possible to draw any substantive distinction between rule guided and merely regular behavior at this fundamental level. Yet such a distinction is crucial for guidance normativism. As Quine classically noted, on pain of vicious regress, meaning determining rules or conventions cannot be explicitly and deliberately adopted; they must somehow be “implicit” in the behavior of speakers. But then, Quine argued, we risk depriving the notion of a linguistic rule “of any explanatory force and reducing it to an idle label” (Quine 1935, 106). The crucial question thus is what the distinction between rule guided behavior and merely regular behavior amounts to when it comes to meaning determining rules.
2.2.3 Guidance by Meaning Determining Rules
Intuitively, behavior guided by an (implicit or explicit) rule R is behavior that can be explained by means of R or, more precisely, behavior that can be given a reasons-explanation involving R, an explanation in terms of the reason-providing intentional states of the agent. Examples of such an “intentional condition” on rule following would be an intention to follow R (e.g. Baker & Hacker 1985, 155; Glock 1996, 325), or some other state of accepting or internalizing R (Boghossian 2008).
Applying a traditional belief-desire model, Glüer and Pagin (1999) suggest understanding guidance by a rule R in general by means of the following practical syllogism:
(PA1) I want to do what R requires,
(B) R requires that I Φ,
(PA2) So, I want to Φ,
where (PAi) is a pro-attitude (desire, intention, acceptance), and (B) a belief. They also argue that if a meaning determining rule R for an expression e requires e to be used correctly, there is no room for such rules in the explanation of speech acts: If a speaker wants to say that p, a rule requiring them to use e correctly not only is of no help, there is no “slot” in the practical syllogism into which it would coherently fit (Glüer & Pagin 1999, 223f). It would thus seem that if an intentional condition on guidance by meaning determining rules can be integrated into a general model of reasons explanation, an alternative way of doing that is required.
Another question concerns the relation between thought (or intentional states in general) and language. On any account construing thought as dependent on language, as well as on any account construing thought and language as interdependent, and on any account according to which mental content itself is determined by rules governing mental expressions, an intentional condition on rule guidance would inevitably lead guidance normativism back into vicious regress (cf. Boghossian 1989a; 2008). For instance, if having an intentional state with a certain content is itself a matter of being guided by a content determining rule, then another intentional state is required for having the first one, and so on ad infinitum. It has therefore been argued that according to Wittgenstein there must be a basic form of rule following that is not subject to any intentional condition, but “blind” (Wright 2007). Alternatively, it has been argued that therefore the late Wittgenstein did not conceive of meaningful use of language as rule guided anymore (Glüer & Wikforss 2010a).
An independent, general argument against an intentional condition on rule guidance has been provided by Boghossian (2008, 493f): He argues that the relevant intentional state would be a state with general (prescriptive) content, and that acting under particular circumstances on an intentional state with general content always involves some sort of inference. Inference itself, however, essentially involves following a rule, and thus a regress – reminiscent of that familiar from Lewis Caroll (1895) – ensues. However, this argument crucially depends on the assumption that inference is essentially rule guided, an assumption which is at least controversial (cf. Glüer & Wikforss 2010a).
Together with the observation recorded earlier – that speakers do not usually seem to have the kind of privileged access to semantic rules that we would expect if these were action guiding in the intentional sense – considerations like these have driven some philosophers to try to locate the explanatory power of meaning determining rules elsewhere. Thus, some draw an analogy between the explanation of speech dispositions by means of systems of semantic rules and the evolutionary explanation of animal traits and behavior by natural selection. In each case, there are regularities of behavior the explanation of which is non-intentional, but which are nevertheless not merely accidental. In contradistinction to truly evolutionary explanations, explanations of speech dispositions by means of (institutionalized) systems of rules remain only quasi-evolutionary; the crucial explanans is not natural selection, but the system of rules that exists prior to the individual speaker’s acquisition of language (cf. Sellars 1954, Searle 1995). While such explanation might work well for the use an individual speaker learns to make of the expressions of an existing language, whether any distinction between rule explained and merely regular behavior has been substantiated now depends on substantiating a further distinction: that between a system of rules and one of mere regularities. To take Sellars’ example: Why would the bee dance instantiate mere regularities that receive a truly evolutionary explanation, while a human natural language instantiates a system of rules? (Cf. Glüer 2002, 173f.)
Another idea might thus be to locate meaning determining normativity in the very idea of an evolutionary explanation, in the idea of a biological function, for instance, the possession of which explains why certain dispositions or mechanisms (for speech or mental representation) are selected for, as in normative teleosemantics. Yet another possibility would be to combine computational and teleosemantic ideas for rule following at the level of mental representation. Here, a distinction between personal level rule following and sub-personal rule following could be used. Thus, it has been proposed to construe sub-personal rule following as analogous to computational rule following, and semantic rules as rules deriving from the biological functions of our cognitive apparatus (cf. Jacob 2005, 200f). Semantic rule following would then allow for truly evolutionary explanation. It has been argued that this would amount to a highly problematic dispositionalism, not about meaning, but about sub-personal rule following itself (cf. Boghossian 2008). However, if the notion of a biological function helps solve the classical problems of meaning dispositionalism, it might solve those of dispositionalism about rule-following, too. Still, the basic question recurs: What it is that distinguishes a sub-personal regularity from a performance governed by a sub-personal rule? Since not everything with a biological function would seem to be rule governed even in this sense, any account along these lines will at least need to add further elements.
2.2.4 Primitive Normativity
Ginsborg (2011a, b; 2012) suggests that the normativity of meaning can be defended by interpreting the relevant ‘ought’ in way quite radically different from that dominant in most of the normativity debates: as a “primitive ought”. Interpreted as a primitive ought, it conveys the primitively normative attitudes speakers must have towards their own uses of linguistic expressions. Having primitively normative attitudes does not require prior grasp of rules, concepts, or meanings. Moreover, the norms speakers need to be primitively conscious of do not guide or justify them in their use of expressions (Ginsborg 2011b, 170). And finally, the primitive ‘ought’ relevant to meaning cannot be explicated in terms of, or equated with, truth – to be primitively correct is more fundamental than being semantically correct: Primitive normativity is not required to determine what is semantically correct (and incorrect), but rather to “distinguish the production of a term from mere noise” (Ginsborg 2012, 132, quoting Blackburn 1984, 281), or, more generally, to determine which behaviour is “subject to normative evaluation at all” (2011a, 243, fn. 21).
Primitive normativity thus is what distinguishes the behaviour of the speaker who uses her terms with understanding from that of the parrot, or automaton. Using a term with understanding requires more than just being disposed to use it a certain way, Ginsborg argues; it requires understanding that it has a certain meaning. If a speaker for instance uses ‘slab’ to mean slab, she needs to grasp or recognize that it means slab (2012, 135). Ginsborg’s ambition is precisely to provide necessary and sufficient conditions for what it is to have this understanding.
The account of meaning determination she arrives at has two components. Since one of them is a requirement of primitive normativity, primitive normativity qualifies as a (new) kind of meaning determining normativity. In rough outline, the account looks like this:
- (G) As used by a speaker S, an
expression e has a particular meaning M iff
- S is disposed to use e in a certain way, and
- S is disposed to adopt the attitude of taking-to-be-appropriate to the set of uses to which she is disposed (cf. 2011a, 244f; 2012, 138).
If e has meaning, the first disposition suffices to determine which meaning it has. But e has meaning only if the second disposition is in place. Moreover, if both conditions are fulfilled, having the primitively normative attitude of taking the use one is disposed to make of e amounts to understanding that e means M.
These conditions are not only necessary, but sufficient for meaning, Ginsborg argues, because they allow us “to make sense of a given response being correct or incorrect” (2011a, 245), where correctness now is semantic correctness. Once these conditions are fulfilled, a particular use of e might not only be such that you “did not do what you were disposed to do, but also did not do what you were disposed to regard as appropriate” (ibid.). This, Ginsborg submits, is enough to make such a use of e into a mistake. Once these conditions are fulfilled, that is, the uses you are disposed to make of e “can retrospectively be identified as the extension of [e]” (2012, 138). And then, your primitively normative attitude amounts to understanding that e means what it does.
At the time of this update, Ginsborg’s interpretation of the normativity of meaning (and content) as primitive has not been widely discussed. As the proposal is very interesting, and indeed rather different from more established interpretations of the normativity of meaning, this no doubt will change soon. Among the questions to be asked, it seems to us, are at least the following: Is it really the case that dispositional facts cannot be quussed (see above, 2.1.1; Haddock 2012; Verheggen 2015)? And if not, can Ginsborg’s two-component account be salvaged? If the account is extended to intentional content (as Ginsborg herself hints it can, for instance in 2012, 127, fn.1) won’t that give rise to regress worries? Is it really plausible to claim that a primitively normative attitude towards the use one is disposed to make of an expression amounts to knowing (or grasping or recognizing) what the expression means? How are we precisely to understand the primitive notion of appropriateness or correctness? On the one hand, there seems to be a need for primitive and semantic correctness to coincide – if it is to be plausible that awareness of primitive correctness amounts to knowledge of meaning. As Ginsborg explains, once her conditions are fulfilled, what is primitively correct can be identified with what is in e’s extension, i.e. with what is semantically correct. On the other hand, the two notions need to be distinct – if it is to be plausible that having a primitive normative attitude does not require concepts like those of rule or truth. So what precisely is the difference between the two notions? And if they are different, doesn’t that mean that an attitude of primitively taking a use of an expression to be correct cannot amount to semantically taking it to be correct? Simply because these attitudes have different contents?
In the normativity debate the main focus has been on meaning: This is true of the Kripke discussion as well as of earlier discussions concerning the rulishness of language. However, parallel claims have also been made about mental content and recently the thesis that content is essentially normative has come into focus (McDowell & Pettit 1986, Brandom 1994, Engel 2000, Boghossian 2003, Gibbard 2003, Millar 2004, Jarvis 2012).
Content normativism claims that the following is both necessary, and essential to, a mental state M‘s having a content p:
(C) M has content p only if there is a rule, or system of rules, R in force for M.
The relevant notion of content is that of propositional content, something that can be judged, and the norms in question govern the ‘use’ of concepts. We intend the talk of propositions and concepts in this context to be uncontentious, and not depend on any specific construals of these notions. A proposition, simply, is anything that has truth conditions essentially; it is whatever the propositional attitudes are attitudes towards. And talking of “concepts” should not be understood as implying a commitment to either structured contents or to a language-like, syntactically structured medium of representation. In this sense, a concept is ‘used’ whenever a subject has an intentional mental state.
As in the case of meaning, we distinguish between CE normativity, which is neutral on the question how content is determined, and CD normativity which takes the norms to be metaphysically primary. We shall begin by discussing CE normativity.
According to CE normativity statements of the form ‘mental state M has content p’ have normative consequences. The norms are typically construed as norms of action, most commonly as prescriptions, but could also be construed axiologically. That is, the claim need not be that the relevant norms guide our use of concepts, but could just be that it is a property essential to their having content that certain mental states (true beliefs, for instance) are valuable.
As in the case of meaning, we may distinguish between more or less direct arguments. One way to provide a direct argument for CE normativity would be to proceed from the notion of correctness conditions, in analogy with the simple argument (Boghossian 2003: 85). Just as meaningful expressions have correctness conditions essentially, along the lines of (CM), so do concepts: The concept green, for instance, applies to an object x if and only if x is green. However, unlike in the case of (CM), the application relation here is just that between a concept and the objects that ‘fall under’ it. For normativity to enter some connection has to be made with the subject who employs the concepts, with her mental states.
The standard normativist strategy consists in appealing to the use of concepts in propositional attitudes, and to derive the normativity of content from that of the propositional attitudes. Thus, the relevant notion of application is suggested to be that of using the concept in a propositional attitude, in particular that of belief. Arguments for CE normativity, therefore, typically appeal to the connection between content and the propositional attitudes. We shall consider two such common arguments: one that goes via the nature of belief, and one that goes via ideas about concept grasp.
3.1.1 The Argument from Belief
The argument from belief proceeds in two steps: It is argued, first, that belief is essentially normative, and second, that there is an essential connection between belief and content such that if belief is essentially normative it follows that content is, too. Our main concern here is not with the normativity of belief, but some comments concerning the first step are required.
According to the most common proposal, the normativity of belief derives from the connection between belief and truth. It is in the nature of belief, it is held, that it aims for truth. The proposal is not merely that beliefs, essentially, have contents that are true or false, but that beliefs, essentially, are correct or incorrect as a result of the content being true or false. Belief is simply that state which derives its correctness conditions from the content (Velleman 2000, Engel 2001, 2013, Nordhoof 2002, Wedgwood 2002, 2007, 2013, Boghossian 2003, Gibbard 2003, 2005, 2012, Shah 2003, Speaks 2009).
In response, it has been argued that what is essential to belief is merely that beliefs have contents that are true or false, not that one ought to believe a content if and only if it is true. The appearance of normativity, it is suggested, derives from other sources. For instance, as epistemic agents, we seek truth. And having true beliefs is essential to fulfilling our goals. This just shows that true beliefs have an instrumental value, and fails to support the normativity of belief thesis. Moreover, it is argued, even if it is claimed that truth has a non-instrumental value, the value in question is derived from moral or other values, not from the nature of belief as such (Papineau 1999, 2013, Dretske 2000, Davidson 2001, Horwich 2013).
Questions have also been raised concerning how the norm of belief is to be understood. With respect to meaning the question arose whether (ME1) violates the principle that ought implies can. In the case of belief, a similar worry arises if the norm of belief is formulated in a parallel fashion, by proceeding from the correctness conditions of beliefs to normative consequences:
(CB) The belief that p is correct if and only if p.
(NB1) S ought to believe that p if and only if p.
The trouble is that (NB1) implies that S ought to believe everything that is true, an impossible task. This difficulty, it has been argued, is not solved by appealing to a wide-scope reading of ‘ought’ since there are values of p that are such that S could neither bring it about that p is false, nor bring it about that she believes p (Bykvist & Hattiangadi 2007: 284). The most common reaction, instead, is to weaken the norm (Boghossian 2003: 37):
(NB2) S ought to believe that p only if p.
This norm does not imply that S ought to believe everything that is true, and hence does not put impossible demands on S. However, as noted in the discussion of (ME1) above, the question arises whether (NB2) suffices to provide any real constraints on S‘s belief formation. If p is true it does not follow that S ought to believe p, and if p is false it merely follows that it is not the case that S ought to believe p – not that S ought not to believe p (Bykvist & Hattiangadi 2007: 280). In response, normativists have made the same move as in the case of meaning, and suggested that the ‘ought’ in (NB1) is replaced with a ‘may’ (Whiting 2010: 216–217, 2013b: 125). It has been objected that this is too weak since it undermines the fundamental role of the norm of truth when it comes to explaining other evidential and inferential norms (Bykvist & Hattiangadi 2013: 113–114).
It has also been suggested that the normativity of belief should be construed in terms of ‘role oughts’, and that these are not subject to the principle that ought implies can (Chrisman 2008, Feldman 2001). Each role comes with criteria of excellence and these, in turn, imply obligations: Teachers ought to be clear, parents ought to be caregiving, etc. Norms for actions, therefore, derive from norms of being. Similarly, as human beings we play the role of believers, of creatures with intentional states, and being engaged in this role we ought to do it well: We ought to believe that which is true (for instance). Hence, on this view, (NB1) is a norm of belief even if it places impossible demands on ordinary subjects. A related idea is that the relevant norms should be understood in terms of the ‘telos’ of belief: Just as a map is a map (giving a correct or incorrect picture of the world) only insofar as it is designed to represent the world, and in this sense ought to represent the world correctly, so a belief can be said to be correct or incorrect only insofar as representing the world belongs to its telos, to what it ought to do. Since this type of ‘ought’ applies to the representing objects (such as maps or beliefs) and not to agents, it is argued, they are not action-guiding and the principle that ought implies can does not apply (Jarvis 2012).
Another set of questions concerns the fact that (NB1) is an objective norm. Unlike a subjective norm, such as ‘S ought to believe that p only if S has evidence for p’, (NB1) does not engage with S‘s reasons, her beliefs and desires, and this raises the question how (NB1) can serve to guide our belief formation. In response, it has been suggested that many norms are objective norms (‘Buy low and sell high!’) and that the only consequence of (NB1) being an objective norm is that it may not be transparent to S how to obey (NB1) (Boghossian 2003: 38). However, it has been objected that the main trouble with (NB1) is not a failure of transparency. It is clear that objective norms can guide, but they do so via our beliefs, and it has been argued that this causes trouble in the case of (NB1). The trouble is two-fold. In order to be guided by (NB1), S would have to have a belief about whether p is true. This means, first, that in order to be guided by (NB1) the subject would already have had to from a belief as to whether p and hence the guidance comes too late; and, second, that whatever conclusion the subject comes to as to whether p, the norm tells her to hold that very belief (if she forms the belief that p the norm gives her a reason to believe p and if she forms the belief that not-p the norm gives her a reason to believe not-p) (Glüer & Wikforss 2009: 44).
It is therefore disputed whether (NB1) can be said to be a norm of belief, regulating our belief formation. Assuming that belief is intrinsically normative, however, the decisive question is whether this has any implications for content. Why should the fact that belief is normative imply that content is? Indeed, it has been suggested that the opposite is true since if belief is normative the appearance of normativity of content can simply be explained by appealing to the normativity of belief (Speaks 2009: 409). According to Boghossian, the normativity of content derives from the fact that there is a constitutive connection between the notion of content and the notion of belief (Boghossian 2003). This is so, he argues, since we could not grasp the notion of content without first grasping the role contents play in belief. Moreover, Boghossian argues, although contents play a role in other attitudes as well, there are reasons to think that the concept of belief is conceptually primary: For instance, S could not have the concept of desire without first having the concept of belief (ibid: 42–43). If so, the normativity of belief supports CE normativity.
The claim that the concept of belief is primary to that of desire can be questioned. Thus, there is empirical evidence from developmental psychology that children acquire the concept of desire prior to acquiring that of belief (Wellman 1993). It has also been argued that belief and desire are conceptually interdependent (Miller 2008). More importantly, even if it can be shown that the concept of belief is primary to that of desire, and of the other propositional attitudes, the question arises whether indeed one could not grasp the concept of content without grasping that of belief. Prima facie, grasping the concept of a propositional attitude such as belief is rather distinct from grasping the concept of content, since it involves the idea of taking up an attitude towards content.  Moreover, Boghossian is committed to the strong claim that opponents of content normativity fail to grasp the concept of content (or, alternatively, that they operate with a different concept).
An alternative strategy would be to avoid the appeal to conceptual entailments and argue that there is a metaphysical connection between mental content and belief such that if belief is essentially normative, content is. Such an argument may be more or less direct, going via more or less contentious assumptions about mental content. For instance, versions of conceptual role semantics imply that there is an essential link between mental content and belief as do versions of informational theories of content (Dretske 1981, Fodor 1990), although the latter are typically coupled with a non-normativist account of belief. Another line of reasoning appeals to the idea that there is a constitutive connection between grasping a concept, understanding a content, and using it in the propositional attitudes.
3.1.2 Use in Keeping with Content
To possess a concept, it is sometimes suggested, is to have the capacity to use the concept in various propositional attitudes. Since it is essential to the propositional attitudes that they stand in certain rational interconnections with one another, it is argued, this essential normativity transfers to concepts and contents. Possessing a concept, grasping it, incurs a commitment to use the concept ‘in keeping with its content’, in the various propositional attitudes. If the speaker fails to do so, she has misused the concept in question (Millar 2004, McDowell & Pettit 1986, Gibbard 2012: chapter 6).
This argument runs parallel to the argument provided by Millar in the case of meaning. Even if that argument is accepted, however, the question arises whether it can be applied to concepts and content, since the notion of failing to use a concept in ‘keeping with its content’ appears more problematic than the notion of failing to use a word in accordance with its meaning (McGinn 1984: 146–147, Millar 2004: 180–181). It is relatively unproblematic to speak of understanding the meaning of an expression (or misunderstanding it), but in the case of concepts there is nothing corresponding to the expression. To ‘understand’ a concept is simply to possess it, to use it in thoughts. Hence there seems to be little or no room for the idea that S misunderstands a concept either. If S reasons as if she possesses the concept ancient rather than the concept arcane, it would seem to follow not that there is any misuse of concepts but that she has another concept.
One strategy is to distinguish between possession conditions and attribution conditions (Peacocke 1992: 27–33). This separates the conditions that determine S‘s concepts from conditions for the attribution of the concept to S. As a consequence, there is a potential gap between how S uses the concept, her grasp of it, and how it should be used if she were to use it in keeping with its content. To illustrate the distinction, it is common to appeal to Tyler Burge’s discussion of how social factors, under certain conditions, serve to determine content (Burge 1979, Peacocke 1992: 29, Millar 2004: 181–188). Burge gives an account of concept attribution that goes via word meaning. To be attributed the concept arcane, on this view, it suffices that S uses the expression ‘arcane’ by and large correctly, ‘in keeping with its content’ – if she is committed to her community practice of using the corresponding expression ‘arcane’, and this practice determines that ‘arcane’ expresses arcane. What determines her concept, thus, is not merely facts about her use and dispositions to stand corrected, but facts about the use of the term in the wider practice. It follows that speakers typically have an incomplete grasp of the concepts they think with and, as a result, tend to misuse these concepts.
Leaving aside the controversial question of whether we can separate possession conditions of concepts from attribution conditions, it might be asked whether Burge’s social externalism can be employed to support CE normativity. Burge’s argument depends on the idea that the individual is committed to the community practice (Burge 1979: 94–95, 101–102, Millar 2004: 182). But if the normativity in question is made conditional on the individual’s commitment to the community, it does not follow that content is essentially normative. After all, an individual who is not thus committed would still have concepts. (Equally, in the case of the experts, the suggested normative dimension would seem to drop out.) What would seem to be required, rather, is an argument to the effect that the concept expressed is necessarily determined by the community practice, independently of S‘s commitments.
Another argument for content normativity based on incompleteness of understanding derives from Burge (1986). Burge suggests that meaning or content characterizations, such as Sofas are artifacts to be sat upon, have a normative function in our practices: They set standards that guide our thinking. However, Burge argues, such characterizations can be rationally doubted, even by the experts; they are objectively right or wrong, independently of our practices (ibid: 704–707). It follows that content is ultimately not determined socially but by the nature of the objects that we causally interact with, and that there are “intellectual norms that govern thinking about objective matters” (ibid: 697). This argument from externalism therefore does not depend on the assumption that individuals are committed to the community practice. Instead, it depends on a version of physical content externalism applied to all kind terms (not just the natural kind terms), combined with the assumption that metaphysical necessities should be construed as norms (see Wikforss 2003).
Arguments from concept grasp, again, typically appeal to the idea that there are rationality constraints on concept attributions. As noted in the discussion of ME normativity, the question has been raised whether the idea that there are such constraints coheres with normativism. It has been suggested that this question is particularly pressing in the case of content. When it comes to meaning, there is the option of attributing meaning errors and explaining the error by appealing to the subject’s mistaken conception of the meaning of an expression, thereby rationalizing her reasoning and actions. In the case of concepts, this option is not available, since the error is said to occur at the level of content. It would either have to be argued that the error can be rationalized some other way, or the claim that there are rationality constraints on content attributions would have to be rejected (see Brown 2004, Wikforss forthcoming-b).
Like MD normativism, CD normativism is a claim about the foundations of intentional content: Intentional content is metaphysically determined, or constituted, by rules or norms. Since the relevant norms or rules govern intentional mental states, the CD normativist needs to find a kind of state plausibly subject to rules or norms that by the same token determine its content. Because of its intimate connection with truth, knowledge, and inference, belief is the natural candidate. Both truth and inferential connections in turn are intimately connected with content.
Thus, there are three main candidates for CD norms or rules, two objective and one subjective:
(NB1) S ought to believe that p iff p.
(NB3) S ought to believe that p iff S knows that p.
(NB4) S ought to believe that p iff it is rational for S to believe that p.
Note, that (NB1), (NB3), and (NB4) each operate with a different underlying concept of correctness; if belief is defined by its “aim”, it can therefore be defined by only one them. Moreover, these notions of correctness can differ even extensionally, i.e., give different verdicts regarding the correctness of individual beliefs. Nevertheless, if conceived of as prima facie norms, there is nothing incoherent in supposing them all to be in force for belief simultaneously.
The idea is that beliefs have contents only if (one or more of) these rules are in force and, moreover, that their being in force is constitutive of the contents they have. And again, a rule R‘s being in force can roughly be interpreted in three ways: As requiring the subject to follow R, to accept R in a sense not requiring (general) following, or as independent of the subject’s attitudes and intentional states towards R (see above, 1.2; 2.2.2).
As in the case of meaning, the most common idea on the market is that the rules constitutive of content are rules that subjects having contentful mental states need to follow. Thinkers inspired by traditions such as pragmatism and/or Wittgensteinian anti-platonism might also require these rules to be, in some sense, of our own making (Baker & Hacker 1985, Brandom 1994). Let us, again, call the version of CD normativism that requires rule following “guidance normativism”. Since the idea of being guided by objective norms is problematic for norms like (NB1) and (NB3) (see above, 3.1), guidance normativists often conceive of the relation between their favorite objective norm and (NB4) in particular ways: If the objective norm is given priority, one suggestion is that it is followed by means of following the subjective rules (Boghossian 2003). If the subjective rules are seen as basic, objective ones can be explained by means of them in some way or other. For a normative inferentialist like Brandom, for instance, this is the question of the relation between normative inferential role and truth conditional content, and he tries to show that the latter can be analysed in terms of the former. Gibbard (2005) suggests that, in general, objective oughts can be reduced to subjective ones. Other options for the guidance normativist are to conceive of (NB4) as the basic norm for belief, or to construe the nature of belief as given by both (NB4) and (NB1) (Wedgwood 2007, 162) or (NB3).
Candidates typically given for CD rules are rules supposed to govern (rational) reasoning. These can be rules of theoretical, as well as of practical reasoning: Prime examples are inference rules such as modus ponens or the law of non-contradiction, and the rule that, in the absence of background belief to the effect that the senses are not to be trusted in the given situation, a belief that p is to be formed on the basis of a perceptual experience as of p. The principles of rational decision making and those of epistemic rationality (as, for instance, formalized in decision theory or Bayesian epistemology) are further examples. Purely formal rules would arguably not suffice for general content determination; normative inferentialists such as Brandom (1994; 2000) or Peregrin (2008) therefore include norms governing material implication among the content determining rules. Brandom typically describes the relevant norms as norms determining what a thinker is “committed” and “entitled” to in holding a particular attitude towards a particular content.
The plausibility of guidance normativism, be it with respect to meaning or content, depends on whether it can account for the difference between rule following and mere accordance with the relevant rules. It has been argued by several authors that CD normativism, on pain of vicious infinite regress, cannot put any intentional condition on rule guidance (Boghossian 1989a; 2008; Glüer & Wikforss 2009, see also above, 2.2): If another intentional state M2 is required to make the formation an intentional state M1 into a rule-guided performance and, thereby, give it its content, yet another intentional state M3 will be required to give M2 its content. And so on, ad infinitum.
A pragmatic conception of rule guidance might therefore seem to be required. The single most elaborate such conception is Brandom’s normative version of inferentialism (Brandom 1994). To avoid regresses, Brandom takes norms implicitly “instituted” by our practices to be basic and proposes a pragmatic phenomenalism about such norms. Phenomenalism is the claim that objective “deontic statuses” are to be explained in terms of our normative attitudes. Something’s being correct, that is, is to be explained in terms of the attitude of taking it to be correct. Therefore, the norms in question are “in some sense creatures of ours” (1994, 626). Nevertheless, Brandom explicitly aims at securing, and explaining, the “objectivity of concepts” (1994, xvii). Commentators such as Rosen (1997) and Glüer and Wikforss (2009) therefore interpret Brandom as offering a realist account of content, not some form of expressivism (as other commentators, such as Gibbard (1996), attribute to Brandom). Brandom aims at reducing the intentional to the normative, while holding the normative itself to be irreducible. In this sense, it is “norms all the way down” (1994, 44; 625). Ultimately, being correct is to be explained in terms of being correctly taken to be correct.
General questions that have been raised about this project include the question of whether it ultimately can secure the possibility of objective concepts or contents, contents the truth of which is independent of our attitudes. It has been argued that since normative statuses are explained by means of further normative statuses, pragmatic phenomenalism cannot tell us anything informative about how we make or “institute” the basic norms implicit in our practices (cf. Rosen 2001, Hattiangadi 2003). In a similar vein, it has been questioned that pragmatic phenomenalism manages to account for the difference between mere accordance with these rules and “instituting” them; if for any normative status to be instituted by an implicit norm a further normative status already needs to be so instituted, an infinite regress of (implicit) norms might ensue despite the pragmatist nature of the proposal (cf. Hattiangadi 2007, 197; Glüer & Wikforss 2009, 60ff). This regress might not be vicious if the project is interpreted as an expressivist one, however.
Even if guidance normativism would ultimately not be able to sustain a substantive difference between following a content determining rule and mere accordance with it, one might still hold on to the claim that there are contentful intentional states only if the rules of rationality are in force for them. Such force might require acceptance, but not (general) guidance, or it might be completely independent of the attitudes of thinkers. Insofar as acceptance itself is intentional, however, CD normativism might prove viable only if the force of the relevant rules or norms is construed as completely independent of the attitudes of the thinkers. Some relevant ideas as to how such rule following might be understood were already discussed above, at the end of section 2.2.
The idea that the normative in some sense is not part of nature goes back at least to Kant (see, for instance, Critique of Pure Reason (1781), A 547). Already Hume (in the Treatise (1739–1740)) argued against the metaethical naturalist that ought cannot be derived from is – to try to do so would be to commit a so-called “naturalistic fallacy”. With the “open question argument”, Moore (in Principia Ethica (1903)) added a weapon to the anti-naturalist’s arsenal also against giving naturalistic accounts of moral evaluations: According to the open question argument, there is no naturalistic (set of) concept(s) analytically equivalent to the moral concept of goodness, since no matter what naturalistic definition is given, the question whether all and only things satisfying it are good still makes sense. Much of recent normativism about meaning/content continues in this anti-naturalist tradition; many normativists about meaning/content hold that the essential normativity of meaning/content makes at least (fully) reductive naturalism untenable.
This is certainly how many have construed Kripke’s Wittgenstein; it is part of his skeptical campaign against semantic facts in general that such facts cannot be reduced to whatever precisely is allowed in a naturalistic supervenience base for meaning/content. As we have seen above (section 2.2), matters are rather more complicated here, though. On the one hand, it is a matter of dispute among teleosemanticists, for instance, whether the biological concept of a function is a normative concept, or not. On the other, it is clearly possible to endorse the claim that meaning/content supervenes upon non-semantic, non-normative facts without thereby being committed to reductive naturalism. In between, there is quite some room, for instance for partially reductive accounts construing meaning/content as determined by a dispositional and a non-semantic, but normative component.
Nevertheless, it seems clear that if there is an argument of the general, a priori kind Kripke’s skeptic would need, it is supposed to come from normativism (cf. Boghossian 1989a, 509; Wikforss 2001, 203; Hattiangadi 2007, 64). Such an argument could take a weaker, intensionalist, and a stronger, extensionalist, form (cf. Boghossian 1989a, 532ff): The stronger argument concludes that no reductive naturalist account of meaning/content will be extensionally correct: For any meaning/concept, such an account will either include objects in its extension that, intuitively, do not belong there, or exclude objects from its extension that, intuitively, do belong there, or both. As we saw above (section 2.2.1), this “problem of error” is a problem for many naturalistic accounts of meaning/content, but as such it does not yet have anything to do with normativity. The normativist could, however, argue that it is precisely because of their essential normativity that no naturalistic account of meaning/content can be extensionally correct. The weaker argument grants extensional correctness, but argues that no naturalistic reduction will get the intension of the notion of meaning/content right; it will inevitably miss the normative character of what is semantically correct, its deontic or axiologic characteristics.
Either way, these are at most argument templates; it seems fair to say that at this point in time, the case from normativism against reductive naturalism about meaning/content has not yet been fully made. It has been suggested that the semantic normativist look to metaethics at this point; arguments in the tradition of Hume and Moore might well be adaptable to their case (cf. Miller 1998, 188ff; Hattiangadi 2007, 38ff; Gibbard 2012; Zalabardo 2012). As Hattiangadi argues, the semantic normativist’s case might then prove hostage to whatever controversial assumptions these arguments rely on (motivational internalism, for instance, might be such an issue), thus removing normativism further from being the pre-theoretical constraint on acceptable accounts of meaning/content that Kripke’s skeptic meant it to be.
Normativism about meaning/content might thus exclude (fully) reductive naturalism about meaning/content, but it should be noted that adopting normativism would not seem to be the only option for the anti-reductivist (cf. Mulligan 1999, 136f; Glüer & Wikforss 2009, 63ff). What the normativist construes as norms or rules of meaning/content, principles such as (CM) or inferential rules such as modus ponens, might also be construed in a very different way: As, or in analogy with what Frege called “laws of truth” (Frege 1918: 30). In the same vein, Husserl called the ‘laws of logic’ “ideal” (Husserl 1913: 56)). These ‘laws’ are neither prescriptions for thinking, nor nomological generalities of our psychology. Their ‘validity’ or necessity is sui generis; if anything, it is what we might today call metaphysical.
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- Jackman, H. 2004. “Charity and the Normativity of Meaning,” Presented at the Pacific Division of the APA (March 2004) [Preprint available from the author.]
- PhilPapers page on normativity of meaning and content, ed. by Indrek Reiland (Rice University).