The term “naturalism” has no very precise meaning in contemporary philosophy. Its current usage derives from debates in America in the first half of the last century. The self-proclaimed “naturalists” from that period included John Dewey, Ernest Nagel, Sidney Hook and Roy Wood Sellars. These philosophers aimed to ally philosophy more closely with science. They urged that reality is exhausted by nature, containing nothing “supernatural”, and that the scientific method should be used to investigate all areas of reality, including the “human spirit” (Krikorian 1944, Kim 2003).
So understood, “naturalism” is not a particularly informative term as applied to contemporary philosophers. The great majority of contemporary philosophers would happily accept naturalism as just characterized—that is, they would both reject “supernatural” entities, and allow that science is a possible route (if not necessarily the only one) to important truths about the “human spirit”.
Even so, this entry will not aim to pin down any more informative definition of “naturalism”. It would be fruitless to try to adjudicate some official way of understanding the term. Different contemporary philosophers interpret “naturalism” differently. This disagreement about usage is no accident. For better or worse, “naturalism” is widely viewed as a positive term in philosophical circles—only a minority of philosophers nowadays are happy to announce themselves as “non-naturalists”. This inevitably leads to a divergence in understanding the requirements of “naturalism”. Those philosophers with relatively weak naturalist commitments are inclined to understand “naturalism” in a unrestrictive way, in order not to disqualify themselves as “naturalists”, while those who uphold stronger naturalist doctrines are happy to set the bar for “naturalism” higher.
Rather than getting bogged down in an essentially definitional issue, this entry will adopt a different strategy. It will outline a range of philosophical commitments of a generally naturalist stamp, and comment on their philosophical cogency. The primary focus will be on whether these commitments should be upheld, rather than on whether they are definitive of “naturalism”. The important thing is to articulate and assess the reasoning that has led philosophers in a generally naturalist direction, not to stipulate how far you need to travel along this path before you can count yourself as a paid-up “naturalist”.
As indicated by the above characterization of the mid-twentieth-century American movement, naturalism can be separated into an ontological and a methodological component. The ontological component is concerned with the contents of reality, asserting that reality has no place for “supernatural” or other “spooky” kinds of entity. By contrast, the methodological component is concerned with ways of investigating reality, and claims some kind of general authority for the scientific method. Correspondingly, this entry will have two main sections, the first devoted to ontological naturalism, the second to methodological naturalism.
Of course, naturalist commitments of both ontological and methodological kinds can be significant in areas other than philosophy. The modern history of psychology, biology, social science and even physics itself can usefully be seen as hinging on changing attitudes to naturalist ontological principles and naturalist methodological precepts. This entry, however, will be concerned solely with naturalist doctrines that are specific to philosophy. So the first part of this entry, on ontological naturalism, will be concerned specifically with views about the general contents of reality that are motivated by philosophical argument and analysis. And the second part, on methodological naturalism, will focus specifically on methodological debates that bear on philosophical practice, and in particular on the relationship between philosophy and science.
- 1. Ontological Naturalism
- 2. Methodological Naturalism
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A central thought in ontological naturalism is that all spatiotemporal entities must be identical to or metaphysically constituted by physical entities. Many ontological naturalists thus adopt a physicalist attitude to mental, biological, social and other such “special” subject matters. They hold that there is nothing more to the mental, biological and social realms than arrangements of physical entities.
The driving motivation for this kind of ontological naturalism is the need to explain how special entities can have physical effects. Thus many contemporary thinkers adopt a physicalist view of the mental realm because they think that otherwise we will be unable to explain how mental events can causally influence our bodies and other physical items. Similar considerations motivate ontologically naturalist views of the biological realm, the social realm, and so on.
It may not be immediately obvious why this need to account for physical effects should impose any substantial naturalist constraints on some category. After all, there seems nothing a priori incoherent in the idea of radically unscientific “supernatural” events exerting a causal influence on physical processes, as is testified by the conceptual cogency of traditional stories about the worldly interventions of immaterial deities and other outlandish beings.
However, there may be a posteriori objections to such non-natural causal influences on the physical world, even if there are no a priori objections. We shall see below how modern scientific theory places strong restrictions on the kinds of entities that can have physical effects. Given that mental, biological and social phenomena do have such effects, it follows that they must satisfy the relevant restrictions.
Note how this kind of argument bites directly only on those categories that do have physical effects. It places no immediate constraints on categories that lack any such effects, which arguably include the mathematical and modal realms, and perhaps the moral realm. We shall return to the question of whether there are any further reasons for ontologically naturalist views about such putatively non-efficacious categories in sections 1.7 and 1.8 below.
There is an interesting history to modern science’s views about the kinds of things that can produce physical effects (Papineau 2001). It will be worth rehearsing this history in outline, if only to forestall a common reaction to ontological naturalism. It is sometimes suggested that ontological naturalism rests, not on principled grounds, but on some kind of unargued commitment, some ultimate decision to nail one’s philosophical colours to the naturalist mast. And this diagnosis seems to be supported by the historical contingency of ontologically naturalist doctrines, and in particular by the fact that they have become widely popular only in the past few decades. However, familiarity with the relevant scientific history casts the matter in a different light. It turns out that naturalist doctrines, far from varying with ephemeral fashion, are closely responsive to received scientific opinion about the range of causes that can have physical effects.
A short version of this history runs like this: (1) the mechanistic physics of the seventeenth century allowed only a very narrow range of such causes; (2) early Newtonian physics was more liberal, and indeed did not impose any real restrictions on possible causes of physical effects; (3) however, the discovery of the conservation of energy in the middle of the nineteenth century limited the range of possible causes once more; (4) moreover, twentieth-century physiological research has arguably provided evidence for yet further restrictions.
Let us now rehearse this story more slowly.
(1) The “mechanical philosophers” of the early seventeenth century held that any material body maintains a constant velocity unless acted on, and moreover held that all action is due to impact between one material particle and another. So stated, the mechanical philosophy immediately precludes anything except impacting material particles from producing physical effects. Leibniz saw this clearly, and concluded that it discredited Descartes’ interactive dualism, which had a non-material mind influencing the physical world (Woolhouse 1985). (Of course, Leibniz did not therewith reject dualism and embrace the physicalist view that minds are composed of material particles, but instead opted for “pre-established harmony”. Views which avoid ontological naturalistic views of the mind by denying that mental events have any physical effects will be discussed further in section 1.6 below.)
(2) At the end of the seventeenth century Newtonian physics replaced the mechanical philosophy of Descartes and Leibniz. This reinstated the possibility of interactive dualism, since it allowed that disembodied forces, as well as impacts, could cause physical effects. Newtonian physics was open-ended about the kinds of forces that exist. Early Newtonians posited fundamental mental and vital forces alongside magnetic, chemical, cohesive, gravitational and impact forces. Accordingly, they took sui generis mental action in the material world to be perfectly consistent with the principle of physics. Moreover, there is nothing in the original principles of Newtonian mechanics to stop mental forces arising autonomously and spontaneously, in line with common assumptions about the operation of the mind (Papineau 2001: Section 7).
(3) In the middle of the nineteenth century the conservation of kinetic plus potential energy came to be accepted as a basic principle of physics (Elkana 1974). In itself this does not rule out fundamental mental or vital forces, for there is no reason why such forces should not be “conservative”, operating in such a way as to compensate losses of kinetic energy by gains in potential energy and vice versa. (The term “nervous energy” is a relic of the widespread late nineteenth-century assumption that mental processes store up a species of potential energy that is then released as kinetic energy in action.) However, the conservation of energy does imply that any such special forces must be governed by strict deterministic laws: if mental or vital forces arose spontaneously, then there would be nothing to ensure that they never led to energy increases.
(4) During the course of the twentieth century received scientific opinion became even more restrictive about possible causes of physical effects, and ruled out any sui generis mental or vital causes, even of a law-governed and predictable kind. Detailed physiological research, especially into the operation of nerve cells, gave no indication of any physical effects that cannot be explained in terms of basic physical forces that also occur outside living bodies. By the middle of the twentieth century, belief in sui generis mental or vital forces had become a minority view. This led to the widespread acceptance of the doctrine now known as the “causal closure” or the “causal completeness of the physical”, according to which all physical effects have fully physical causes.
This historical sequence casts light on the evolution of ontologically naturalist doctrines. In the initial seventeenth-century mechanical phase, there was a tension, as Leibniz observed, between the dominant strict mechanism and interactive dualism. However, once mechanism was replaced by a more liberal understanding of forces in the second Newtonian phase, science ceased to raise any objections to dualism and more generally to non-physical causes of physical effects. As a result, the default philosophical view was a non-naturalist interactive pluralism which recognized a wide range of fundamental non-physical influences, including spontaneous mental influences (or “determinations of the soul” as they would then have been called).
In the third phase, the nineteenth-century discovery of the conservation of energy continued to allow that sui generis non-physical forces can interact with the physical world, but required that they be governed by strict force laws. Sui generis mental and vital forces were still widely accepted, but an extensive philosophical debate about the significance of the conservation of energy led to a widespread recognition that any such forces would need to be law-governed and thus amenable to scientific investigation. We might usefully view this as a species of ontological naturalism that falls short of full physicalism. Mental and other special forces were still sui generis and non-physical, but even so they fell within the realm of scientific law and so could not operate spontaneously. (As many commentators at the time recognized, this weaker form of naturalism already carried significant philosophical implications, particularly for the possibility of free will.)
In the final twentieth-century phase, the acceptance of the casual closure of the physical led to full-fledged physicalism. The causal closure thesis implied that, if mental and other special causes are to produce physical effects, they must themselves be physically constituted. It thus gave rise to the strong physicalist doctrine that anything that has physical effects must itself be physical.
In support of this understanding of the twentieth-century history, it is noteworthy how philosophical arguments in favour of physicalism began to appear from the 1950s onwards. Some of these arguments appealed explicitly to the causal closure of the physical realm (Feigl 1958, Oppenheim and Putnam 1958). In other cases, the reliance on causal closure lay below the surface. However, it is not hard to see that even in these latter cases the causal closure thesis played a crucial role.
Thus, for example, consider J.J.C. Smart’s (1959) thought that we should identify mental states with brain states, for otherwise those mental states would be “nomological danglers” which play no role in the explanation of behaviour. Or take David Lewis’s (1966) and David Armstrong’s (1968) arguments that, since mental states are picked out by their causal roles, and since we know that physical states play these roles, mental states must be identical with those physical states. Finally, consider Donald Davidson’s (1970) argument that, since the only laws governing behaviour are those connecting behaviour with physical antecedents, mental events can only be causes of behaviour if they are identical with those physical antecedents. At first sight, it might not be obvious that these arguments require the causal closure thesis. But a moment’s thought will show that none of these arguments would remain cogent if the closure thesis were not assumed, and it were thus left open that some physical effects (the movement of matter in arms, perhaps, or the firings of the motor neurones which instigate those movements) were not determined by prior physical causes at all, but by sui generis mental causes.
Sometimes it is suggested that the indeterminism of modern quantum mechanics creates room for sui generis non-physical causes to influence the physical world. However, even if quantum mechanics implies that some physical effects are themselves undetermined, it provides no reason to doubt a quantum version of the causal closure thesis, to the effect that the chances of those effects are fully fixed by prior physical circumstances. And this alone is enough to rule out sui generis non-physical causes. For such sui generis causes, if they are to be genuinely efficacious, must presumably make an independent difference to the chances of physical effects, and this in itself would be inconsistent with the quantum causal closure claim that such chances are already fixed by prior physical circumstances. Once more, it seems that anything that makes a difference to the physical realm must itself be physical.
It will be worth being explicit about the way the causal closure principle supports physicalism. First we assume that mental causes (biological, social, …) have physical effects. Then the causal closure principle tells us that those physical effects have physical causes. So, in order to avoid an unacceptable proliferation of causes for those physical effects (no “systematic overdetermination”), we need to conclude that the mental (biological, social, …) causes of those effects are not ontologically separate from their physical causes.
However, even if this general line of argument is accepted, there is room for differing views about exactly what its denial of ontological separateness requires. Let us agree that causes are “events” (or “facts”) that involve instantiations of properties. So, if some special cause is not ontologically separate from some physical cause, the property instantiations that it involves cannot themselves be ontologically separate from the property instantiations involved in the physical cause. At this point, however, there are divergent views about how tight a constraint this imposes.
One school holds that it requires type-identity, the strict identity of the relevant special properties with physical properties. On the other side stand “non-reductive” physicalists, who hold that the causal efficacy of special causes will be respected as long as the properties they involve are “realized by” physical properties, even if they are not reductively identified with them.
Type-identity is the most obvious way to ensure the non-separateness of special and physical causes: if exactly the same properties comprise the special and physical cause, the two causes will themselves be fully identical. Still, type-identity is a very strong doctrine. Type identity about thoughts, for example, would imply that the property of thinking about the square root of two is identical with some physical property. And this seems highly implausible. Even if all human beings with this thought must be distinguished by some common physical property of their brains—which itself seems unlikely—there remains the argument that other life-forms, or intelligent androids, will also be able to think about the square root of two, even though their brains may share no significant physical properties with ours (Fodor 1974, Bickle 2013).
This “variable realization” argument has led many philosophers to seek an alternative way of reconciling the efficacy of mental and other special causes with the causal closure thesis, one which does not require the strict identity of non-physical and physical properties. The general idea of this “non-reductive physicalism” is to allow that instantiations of a given special property will always be grounded in or metaphysically determined by instantiations of physical properties, but to add that these “realizing” physical properties might be different in different cases. So, for example, any being who thinks about the square root of two will do so in virtue of instantiating some physical properties, but these can be different physical properties in different cases—in one human being it may be one set of neural arrangements, in another a different set, and in other life forms it might involve nothing like neural properties at all.
There are various more detailed ways of filling out this idea of non-reductive physicalism. A common feature is the requirement that special properties should metaphysically supervene on physical properties, in the sense that any two beings who share the realizing physical properties will necessarily share the same special properties, even though the physical properties which so realize the special ones can be different in different beings. This arguably ensures that nothing more is required for any specific instantiation of a special property than its physical realization—even God could not have created your brain states without thereby creating your feelings—yet avoids any reductive identification of special properties with physical ones. (This is a rough sketch of the supervenience formulation of physicalism. For more see Stoljar 2015.)
Some philosophers object that non-reductive physicalism does not in fact satisfy the original motivation for physicalism, on the grounds that it does not really reconcile the efficacy of mental and other special causes with the causal closure thesis (Kim 1998, Robb and Heil 2014: Section 6). According to non-reductive physicalism, special properties are not type-identical with any strictly physical properties, even though they supervene on them. And this then seems to imply that any given special cause will be distinct from the physical cause that realizes it, since it involves the instantiation of a different property. (The property of thinking about the square root of two is definitely a different property from the neural property that realizes it in me, say, since another being could share the former property without sharing the latter.)
The opponents of non-reductive physicalism then insist that this gives us an unacceptable proliferation of causes for the physical effects of special causes after all—both the physical cause implied by the causal closure thesis and the distinct special cause. In response, advocates of non-reductive physicalism respond that there is nothing wrong with such an apparent duplication of causes if it is also specified that the latter metaphysically supervene on the former.
The issue here hinges on the acceptability of different kinds of systematic overdetermination (Bennett 2003). All can agree that it would be absurd if the physical effects of special causes always had two metaphysically independent causes. Plugging this into the causal closure argument for physicalism, we can conclude that there can be no metaphysically independent non-physical causes (such as Cartesian dualist mental causes) for effects that already have full physical causes. However, even if “strong overdetermination” by two ontologically independent causes is so ruled out, this does not necessarily preclude “weak overdetermination” by both a physical cause and a metaphysically supervenient special cause. Advocates of non-reductive physicalism argue that this kind of overdetermination is benign and consistent with the causal argument’s denial of strong overdetermination, since now the two causes are not metaphysically distinct—the special cause isn’t genuinely additional to the physical cause (nothing more is needed for your feelings than your brain states).
Some recent writers have explored a different way of upholding the causal efficacy of non-reduced mental and other special causes. Where the “benign overdetermination” option says certain effects have a special cause as well as a physical cause, these writers urge that some effects have a special cause instead of a physical cause.
Suppose a pigeon pecks at crimson tiles. Is the pecking caused by the specific shade, crimson, or the more generic colour, red? The natural answer is that it depends. If the pigeon pecks only at crimson tiles, and not at other shades of red, then it is the crimsonness that is causing the pecking; but if the pigeon pecks at any shade of red, it is the redness. Examples like these have led a number of writers to require that causes be proportional to their effects (Yablo 1992; Menzies 2008; List and Menzies 2009, 2010). We should attribute the effect to that property that is specific enough to suffice for it, but no more specific than that.
This suggests that sometimes special causes and not their physical realizers might be responsible for physical effects. Suppose I want to hail a taxi, and that this desire is realized by some brain state, and that I then wave my arm. It seems that it will then be the desire that is proportional to the waving, not the brain state, in that I would still have waved my arm if my desire had been differently realized, though not if I hadn’t had the desire at all.
Some will say that in such cases the desire causally explains the waving, but that it is still the brain state that causes it. This thought appeals to the intuition that real causal relations are always constituted by basic physical interactions, by bits of matter bumping into each other. But this intuition is not decisive, and a number of theoretical considerations speak against it. For instance, the “difference-making” account of causation developed by James Woodward implies that generic properties often eclipse their more specific realizations as causes (Woodward 2005), as does the view that causation is a relatively macroscopic phenomenon whose temporal asymmetry is analogous to the temporal asymmetries of thermodynamics (Loewer 2007, Papineau 2013).
It is worth observing that physicalists who advocate this kind of downwards special causation are in some danger of sawing off the branch they are sitting on, in that they now seem to be advocating counter-examples to the causal closure of the physical. If my arm’s waving is caused by my desire and not by my brain state, it would seem to have a mental cause and not a physical cause, and thus run counter to the closure thesis that every physical effect has some fully physical cause. Since the original rationale for embracing physicalism was supposed to be science’s discovery that the physical realm is causally closed, this may seem to leave physicalists in an awkward position.
However, even if the examples of “downwards” causation do undermine the thesis of the causal closure of the physical, it may still be possible to rework the original argument for physicalism in terms of closure under nomological determination, rather than causal closure. Nothing in the idea of proportional causation threatens the idea that modern physics shows that all physical effects (or their chances) are fully nomologically determined by physical antecedents, even if they aren’t always caused by them. And this in itself argues that metaphysically independent special causes would imply an unacceptable strong overdetermination of physical events.
Some philosophers take there to be compelling arguments against the view that conscious states are metaphysically constituted by physical states. This rejection of physicalism about conscious properties certainly has the backing of intuition. (Don’t zombies—beings who are physically exactly like humans but have no conscious life—intuitively seem metaphysically possible?) However, whether this intuition can be parlayed into a sound argument is a highly controversial issue, and one that lies beyond the scope of this entry. A majority of contemporary philosophers probably hold that physicalism can resist these arguments. But a significant minority take the other side.
This minority has a number of options. One is to hold that conscious properties are "epiphenomenal" and do not exert any influence on brain processes or subsequent behaviour (Jackson 1982, 1986; Chalmers 1996). Another is to embrace the "overdeterminationist" view that the physical results of conscious causes are always strongly overdetermined , both by their normal physical antecedents and by the metaphysically independent conscious causes (Mellor 1995, Kroedel 2015). Still, neither of these positions is attractive. They require us to posit odd causal structures, either involving a species of effects that are never themselves causes, or a species of effects that are always strongly overdetermined. Given that nature displays no other examples of such causal structures, general principles of theory choice would seem to argue against both epiphenomenalism and overdeterminationism.
In consequence, a yet further option has become increasingly popular among those who are persuaded that consciousness must transcend the physical realm. This is the Russellian monist option that locates conscious properties among the basic categorical properties that play the dispositional roles described by physical science. This option has the virtues of separating consciousness from the world described by physics without positing any special causal structures operating in the brain (Alter and Pereboom 2019).
It is an interesting question whether Russellian monism is necessarily opposed to physicalism rather than a special case of it (Montero 2015, Brown 2017). In any case, we should note that Russellian monism is designed to conform to the causal (or determinational) closure of the physical realm, as indeed are epiphenomenalism and overdeterminationism. It is striking that nearly all contemporary views of the mind-brain relations are naturalist at least to the extent that they respect this closure thesis. Strongly interactionist views that allow the conscious mind to make an independent difference to the physical world have few defenders nowadays (but see Lowe 2000, 2003; Steward 2015).
G.E. Moore’s well-known “open question” argument is designed to show that moral facts cannot possibly be identical to natural facts. Suppose that the natural properties of some situation are completely specified. It will always remain an open question, argued Moore, whether that situation is morally good or bad (Moore 1903).
Moore took this argument to show that moral facts constitute a distinct species of non-natural fact. However, any such non-naturalist view of morality faces immediate difficulties, deriving ultimately from the kind of causal closure thesis discussed above. If all physical effects are due to a limited range of physically-grounded natural causes, and if moral facts lie outside this range, then it follow that moral facts can never make any difference to what happens in the physical world (Harman 1986). At first sight this may seem tolerable (perhaps moral facts indeed don’t have any physical effects). But it has awkward epistemological consequences. For beings like us, knowledge of the spatiotemporal world is mediated by physical processes involving our sense organs and cognitive systems. If moral facts cannot influence the physical world, then it is hard to see how we can have any knowledge of them.
The traditional non-naturalist answer to this problem is to posit a non-natural faculty of “moral intuition” that gives us some kind of direct access to the moral realm (as explained in Ridge 2014: Section 3). However, causal closure once more makes it difficult to make good sense of this suggestion. Presumably at some point the posited intuitive faculty will need to make a causal difference in the physical world (by affecting what people say and do, for example). And at this point the causal closure argument will bite once more, to show that a non-natural intuitive faculty would implausibly imply that some of our actions are strongly overdetermined by two metaphysically independent antecedents.
Moral non-naturalism has had something of a revival in recent years, with defenders including Russ Shaffer-Landau (2003), Ralph Wedgwood (2007), Derek Parfit (2011) and David Enoch (2011). Still, the challenge of accounting for our access to non-natural moral facts remains, and it is debatable whether any of these writers has found a satisfactory alternative to a causally problematic faculty of intuition. Perhaps the most developed suggestion is Enoch’s (2011) appeal to the indispensability of non-natural moral facts to moral reasoning, a line of argument that is analogous to Hilary Putnam’s case for non-natural mathematical objects, to be discussed in the next section below. But Enoch’s appeal arguably faces many of the same general objections as Putnam’s argument, as well as objections specific to the moral realm (see Leng 2016).
In light of the difficulties facing moral non-naturalism, most contemporary moral philosophers opt instead for some species of naturalist view. We can divide the naturalist options here into two broad categories: irrealist and realist. Irrealist moral naturalists aim to account for moral discourse by offering naturalist accounts of the social and linguistic and practices that govern it, but without supposing that moral utterances report on moral facts with a substantial independent existence (Joyce 2015). By contrast, naturalist moral realists agree with moral non-naturalists that substantial moral facts exist, but seek to locate them in the natural realm rather than in some sui generis non-natural realm (Lenman 2014).
Both these broad categories have further sub-divisions. Among the irrealists, we can distinguish explicitly non-cognitivist views like emotivism and prescriptivism which deny that moral judgements express beliefs (Hare 1952, Blackburn 1993, Gibbard 2003) from cognitivist views that accept that moral judgements do express beliefs but deny a substantial reality to the putative facts to which they answer; and among the latter cognitivist views we can distinguish error-theoretic fictionalist options which view moral judgements as simply false (Mackie 1977, Kalderon 2005) from projectivist options which hold that moral discourse is sufficiently disciplined for its judgements to qualify for a species of truth even though they do not report on independently existing causally significant facts (Wright 1992, Price 2011).
Naturalist moral realism also comes in different varieties. In recent debates two versions have figured prominently; “Cornell realism”, which includes moral facts among the causally significant facts but resists their type-reducibility to non-moral facts (Sturgeon 1985, Boyd 1988), and “moral functionalism” which is happy to equate moral facts with straightforwardly descriptive facts (Jackson 1998).
Any kind of moral naturalist realist needs to reject Moore’s open question argument. There are two alternatives here. One is to insist that Moore’s posited openness is relatively superficial, and that there is no principled barrier to inferring moral facts a priori from the non-moral natural facts, even if such inferences will sometimes require a significant amount of information and reflection. The other is to argue that the constitution of moral facts by non-moral natural facts is an a posteriori matter, akin to the relation between water and H2O, and that therefore Moore’s openness only points to a conceptual gap, not a metaphysical one (Ridge 2014: Section 2).
This sub-section has focused on morality. But there are other topics which arguably involve matters of value, such as aesthetics, the normativity of theoretical and practical reason, and so on. The constraints placed on theories of moral facts by naturalist considerations will apply, mutatis mutandis, in these areas too, militating against theories that posit non-natural value-bearing facts and in favour of naturalist alternatives, of either a realist or irrealist stripe.
Mathematics raises many of the same issues for ontological naturalism as morality. Mathematical claims typically involve a commitment to abstract objects like numbers and sets, eternal entities outside space and time. This might seem cogent at first sight, but once more epistemological difficulties quickly arise. Abstract objects can have no effects in the spatiotemporal world. How then can spatiotemporal being like ourselves come to know about them?
However the mathematical case does not fully parallel the moral one. One of the options in the moral case was naturalist realism, which reads moral claims as about natural facts which play causal roles in the spatiotemporal world. However, given the explicit commitment of mathematical claims to abstract objects without spatiotemporal location, this option does not seem available in the mathematical case (but see Maddy 1990). So we seem required to choose between non-naturalist realism about non-spatiotemporal mathematical entities or naturalist irrealism.
As in the moral case, non-naturalist realism faces epistemological challenges, to which one response is to posit a faculty of intuition which gives us access to the abstract mathematical realm. Kurt Gödel arguably favoured a view along these lines (Parsons 1995). However, once more this only seems to push the problem back. There seems no good way for the posited faculty to bridge the causal gap between the abstract and the spatiotemporal realms without generating implausible overdetermination.
An alternative version of non-naturalist realism aims to vindicate mathematical and modal claims as essential parts of our best overall theories of the world. According to this line of thought, defended by Hilary Putnam, our empirically best-supported scientific theories commit us to mathematical entities; ergo, we are entitled to believe in such entities (Putnam 1971).
However, it is contentious whether our best-supported empirical theories do commit us to abstract mathematical entities. The most prominent version of naturalist irrealism about mathematics, Hartry Field’s fictionalism, disputes precisely this claim. According to Field, we can construct “nominalist” versions of scientific theories that avoid commitment to abstract mathematical objects yet are explanatorily superior to the “platonist” alternatives. Field argues that we do not have to regard mathematics itself as literally true in order to understand its use in science and other applications. Rather it can be viewed as a “useful fiction” which facilitates inferences between nominalistic scientific claims, but is not itself implicated in our most serious beliefs about the world (Field 1980, 1989).
Not all philosophers of mathematics are convinced that Fieldian nominalizations are available to replace all scientific references to abstract mathematical objects. In particular, some have argued that certain explanations of nominalist facts make essential reference to abstract objects (Baker 2005, Batterman 2010). In response, others have sought to show that there are in fact good nominalist explanations of the facts in question (Daly and Langford 2009, Butterfield 2011, Menon and Callender 2013). In any case, it is not clear that Field’s metaphysical stance requires a full execution of his nominalizing programme, as opposed to a case for its cogency: difficulties in constructing nominalist theories can always be attributed to limitations of human ingenuity rather than the reality of abstract mathematical objects (Leng 2013).
Perhaps the most popular contemporary alternative to fictionalism is the version of non-naturalist realism offered by the neo-Fregean thesis that abstract mathematical beliefs can be justified as analytic truths that follow from logic and certain meaning stipulations. The idea has been most fully developed in connection with arithmetic, where Crispin Wright has shown how Peano’s postulates can be derived within the framework of second-order logic from nothing except the Humean principle that the same number attaches to equinumerous concepts. According to Wright, this principle can be viewed as an implicit definition of our concept of number. If this is right, then it has indeed been shown that arithmetic, and therewith the existence of numbers as abstract objects, follows from logic and definition alone (Wright 1983, Hale and Wright 2003). There has also been some attempt to extend the programme to mathematical analysis (Shapiro 2000, Wright 2000).
One query that might be put to this programme is whether the Humean principle and analogous assumptions can really be viewed as analytic definitions. If they commit us to numbers and other abstract objects whose existence cannot established without them, then they are arguably doing more than definitions should. A related issue is whether the overall neo-Fregean position is properly viewed as realist. From its perspective, the role of abstract mathematical objects in the overall scheme of things seems to be exhausted by their making our mathematical statements true; given this, it might seem better to classify it as a species of irrealism (MacBride 2003).
To complete this discussion of ontological naturalism, let us briefly consider the realm of modality, understood as the subject matter of claims that answer to something more than actuality. Modality raises many of the same issues as mathematics, but the topic is complicated by the prior question of the content of modal claims, and in particular about whether they quantify over non-actual possible worlds. Whereas there is little dispute about the initial semantic analysis of mathematical claims—they purport to refer to abstract numbers, sets, functions and so on—there is somewhat less unanimity about the possible worlds analysis of modal claims (Nolan 2011b).
To the extent that modal claims do quantify over possible worlds, the ontological points made about mathematics apply well here too. Since non-actual worlds do not inhabit our spatiotemporal realm, an ontologically naturalist realism seems to be ruled out from the start. The remaining alternatives are irrealism or non-naturalist realism. The former alternative has been explored in recent years by modal fictionalists (Rosen 1990; Nolan 2011a). The options under the latter heading meet the same epistemological challenges as in the mathematical case: brute intuition faces causal problems; it is contentious whether we should take our best scientific theories to commit us to possible worlds; and, if modal knowledge is to be analytically a priori, on the model of mathematical neo-Fregeanism, then it is not obvious that it can take us to knowledge of possible worlds construed realistically.
In what follows, “methodological naturalism” will be understood as a view about philosophical practice. Methodological naturalists see philosophy and science as engaged in essentially the same enterprise, pursuing similar ends and using similar methods.
Among philosophers of religion, “methodological naturalism” is sometimes understood differently, as a thesis about natural scientific method itself, not about philosophical method. In this sense, “methodological naturalism” is the view that religious commitments have no relevance within science: natural science itself requires no specific attitude to religion, and can be practised just as well by adherents of religious faiths as by atheists or agnostics (Draper 2005). This thesis is of interest to philosophers of religion because many of them want to deny that methodological naturalism in this sense entails “philosophical naturalism”, understood as atheism or agnosticism. You can practice natural science in just the same way as non-believers, so this line of thought goes, yet remain a believer when it comes to religious questions. Not all defenders of religious belief endorse this kind of “methodological naturalism”, however. Some think that religious doctrines do make a difference to scientific practice, yet are defensible for all that (Plantinga 1996). In any case, this kind of “methodological naturalism” will not be discussed further here. Our focus will be on the relation between philosophy and science, not between religion and science.
What exactly is involved in adopting a methodologically naturalist attitude to the relation between philosophy and science? In order to focus what follows, let us understand methodological naturalism as the specific claim that philosophy and science are both concerned to establish synthetic knowledge about the natural world, and moreover to achieve this by a posteriori investigation.
Methodological naturalists will of course allow that there are some differences between philosophy and science. But they will say that these are relatively superficial, a matter of focusing on different questions rather than any radical difference of approach. For one thing, philosophical questions are often distinguished by their great generality. Where scientists think about viruses, electrons or stars, philosophers think about spatiotemporal continuants, properties, causation or time, categories that structure all our thinking about the natural world. Another common feature of philosophical questions is that they involve some kind of theoretical tangle. Our thinking supports different lines of thought that lead to conflicting conclusions. Progress requires an unravelling of premises, including perhaps an unearthing of implicit assumptions that we didn’t realize we had.
For both these reasons, philosophical issues are rarely resolved by new observational data. The normal philosophical predicament is that we have all the observational data we could want, but aren’t sure of the best way of accommodating them. Still, methodological naturalists will urge, this doesn’t mean that a posteriori synthetic theories are not the aim of philosophy. A theory produced by unravelling the theoretical tangles surrounding some general category can still be an a posteriori synthetic theory, even if no new observational findings went into its construction.
From the methodological naturalist perspective, then, philosophical views are synthetic claims that answer to the overall tribunal of a posteriori observational evidence. The obvious objection to this view, however, is that it does not accord with philosophical practice. In particular, it seems in tension with the central role that intuitions play in philosophy. The typical way to assess philosophical views is arguably to test them against intuitive judgements about possible cases, not against a posteriori observational data. So, for example, the description theory of names is challenged by our intuitions about Kripke’s imagined counterexamples, the tripartite theory of knowledge by our intuitive reactions to Gettier cases, and so on. At first pass, this certainly suggests that philosophy is centrally concerned with the analysis of everyday concepts, not the construction of synthetic theories: it is using intuitions about possible cases to uncover the structure implicit in our concepts. The reliance on intuitions thus argues that, far from delivering synthetic a posteriori knowledge, philosophy uses a priori methods to deliver analytic conclusions.
Methodological naturalists can respond to this challenge at a number of points. For one thing, they can ask whether intuitions really do play a central role in philosophy. For another, they can query whether, even if they do, they are really a priori intuitions. And finally, they can dispute whether, even if the intuitions are a priori, they are genuinely analytic. It will be convenient to consider these different responses in reverse order.
One influential strand in contemporary philosophy is quite explicit in claiming that analytic intuitions play a central role in philosophy. Inspired by David Lewis, and led by Frank Jackson and David Chalmers, this is widely known as the “Canberra Plan”. On this conception, philosophy starts with an initial analysis of concepts employed by everyday thought, such as free will, say, or knowledge, or moral value, or conscious experience. Once this stage has been completed, philosophy can then turn to “serious metaphysics” to demonstrate how a limited number of ingredients (for example, physical ingredients) might satisfy these everyday concepts. This second stage is likely to appeal to synthetic a posteriori scientific knowledge about the fundamental nature of reality. But the purely analytic first stage, according to the Canberra plan, also plays an essential part in setting the agenda for the subsequent metaphysical investigation.(Jackson 1998, Braddon-Mitchell and Nola 2009, Chalmers 2012.)
An initial question about this programme relates to its scope. It is by no means clear that all, or indeed any, philosophically interesting concepts can be subject to the relevant kind of analysis. Jackson himself assumes that pretty much all everyday concepts can be analysed as equivalent to “the kind which satisfies such-and-such folk assumptions”. But it is arguable that many everyday concepts are not so constituted, but rather have their semantic contents fixed by observational, causal or historical relations to their referents.
Still, we can let this point pass. Even if we suppose, for the sake of the argument, that a range of philosophically interesting everyday concepts do have their contents fixed in the way the Canberra programme supposes, there are further objections to its understanding of philosophical method.
Let us look a bit more closely at the posited initial agenda-setting stage of the Canberra programme. Upon closer examination, it is not clear that this makes any essential appeal to analytic knowledge. Defenders of the Canberra plan characteristically explain their strategy in terms of “Ramsey sentences” (e.g., Jackson 1998: 140). Suppose \(T(F)\) is the set of relevant everyday assumptions involving some philosophically interesting concept. For example, F may be the concept belief, and the assumptions in T may include “characteristically caused by perceptions”, “combines with desires to generate actions”, and “has causally significant internal structure”. Then the Ramsey sentence corresponding to \(T(F)\) is “\(\exists!\Phi (T(\Phi))\)”. For the concept belief, this would say: there is some unique kind that is characteristically caused by perceptions, combines with desires to generate actions, and has causally significant internal structure.
The Canberra suggestion is then that, once we have articulated the relevant Ramsey sentence, we will be in a position to turn to serious metaphysics to identify the underlying nature of the F that plays the relevant role.
However, if this is the Canberra procedure, then there is no reason to think of it as appealing to analytic knowledge at any stage. A Ramsey sentence of the kind at issue says that there actually exists some entity satisfying certain requirements (there is a kind of state that is caused by perceptions …). Sentences like this make eminently synthetic and falsifiable claims. It is not a matter of definition that humans actually have internal states that play the causal role associated with the concept of belief. The Canberra strategy thus seems no different from the prescription that philosophy should start with the synthetic theories endorsed by everyday thought, and then look to our more fundamental theories of reality to see what, if anything, makes these everyday theories true. This seems entirely in accord with methodological naturalism—philosophy is in the business of assessing and developing synthetic theories of the world.
The crucial point here is that Ramsey sentences don’t define concepts like belief, but eliminate them. They give us a way of saying what our everyday theories say without using the relevant concept (there is a kind of state that is caused by perceptions …) If we want definitions, then we need “Carnap sentences”, not Ramsey sentences (Lewis 1970). The Carnap sentence corresponding to “\(\exists!\Phi(T(\Phi))\)” is “If \(\exists!\Phi(T(\Phi)\), then \(T(F)\)”. (If there is a kind of state that is caused by perceptions …, then it’s belief.) Carnap sentences can plausibly be viewed as akin to stipulations that fix the reference of the relevant concepts, and to that extent as analytic claims that can be known a priori. But this certainly does not mean that Ramsey sentences, which make substantial claims about the actual world, are also knowable via a priori analysis. (Note how you can accept a conditional Carnap sentence even if you reject the corresponding unconditional Ramsey sentence. You can grasp the folk concept of belief even if you reject the substantial folk theory of belief.)
Can’t defenders of the Canberra programme argue that it is the analytic Carnap sentences that are crucial in setting philosophical agendas, not the synthetic Ramsey sentences? But this seems wrong. We will want to know about the fundamental nature of belief if we suppose that there is a kind of state that is characteristically caused by perceptions, and so on. That is certainly a good motivation for figuring out whether and how the fundamental components of reality might constitute this state. But the mere fact that everyday thought contains a concept of such a state in itself provides no motivation for further investigation. (In effect, the function of a Carnap sentence is to provide a shorthand for talking about the putative state posited by the corresponding Ramsey sentence. It is hard to see how any important philosophical issues could hang on the availability of such a shorthand.)
To emphasize the point, consider the everyday concept of a soul, understood as something that is present in conscious beings and survives death. This concept of a soul can be captured by the analytic Carnap sentence: “If certain entities inhabit conscious beings and survive death, then they are souls”. Accordingly, this Carnap sentence will be agreed by everybody who has the concept of soul, whether or not they believe in souls. Yet this Carnap sentence will not per se raise any interesting metaphysical questions for those who deny the existence of souls. These deniers won’t start wondering how the fundamental constituents of reality realize souls—after all, they don’t believe in souls. It is only those who accept the corresponding Ramsey sentence (“There are parts of conscious beings that survive death”) who will see a metaphysical issue here. Moreover, the Ramsey sentence will pose this metaphysical issue whether or not it is accompanied by some analytic Carnap sentence to provide some shorthand alternative terminology. In short, the methodological naturalist can insist that anybody interested in “serious metaphysics” should start by articulating the substantial existential commitments of our folk theories, as articulated in their synthetic Ramsey sentences. Any further analytic conceptual commitments add nothing of philosophical significance.
The point generalizes beyond the contrast between Ramsey and Carnap sentences. On reflection, it is hard to see why any purely definitional analytic truths should matter to philosophy. Synthetic everyday truisms can certainly be philosophically significant, and so their articulation and evaluation can play an important philosophical role. But there is no obvious motive for philosophy to concern itself with definitions that carry no implications about the contents of reality.
It is worth noting that not all philosophers who advertise themselves as engaging in “conceptual analysis” are committed to the idea that this involves analytic a priori knowledge. In many cases philosophers who describe themselves in this way go on to explain that in their view “conceptual analysis” is a matter of articulating synthetic claims and assessing them against a posteriori evidence. A particularly clear version of this picture of conceptual analysis is offered by Robert Brandom (2001). Similarly, recent advocates of “conceptual engineering” are explicit that in their view “concepts” embody substantial commitments which are open to criticism on a posteriori grounds (Cappelen 2018, Cappelen, Plunket and Burgess 2019). In the end, it is not clear what differentiates “conceptual analysis” in this sense from the a posteriori assessment of theories. In any case, this species of conceptual analysis seems perfectly consistent with methodological naturalism. (See also Goldman 2007.)
Other philosophers are also explicit that “conceptual analysis” issues in synthetic claims, but simultaneously regard it as a source of a priori knowledge (e.g. Jenkins 2008, 2012). This combination of views is less straightforward. In particular, it seems open to the traditional query: how is such synthetic a priori knowledge possible? If some claim is not guaranteed by the structure of our concepts, but answers to the nature of the world, then how is it possible to know it without a posteriori evidence?
Yet other philosophers distance themselves from talk of conceptual analysis, but even so feel that philosophical reflection is a source of synthetic a priori intuition (Sosa 1998, 2007). They too would seem to face the traditional query of how synthetic a priori knowledge is possible.
In this context, Timothy Williamson has recently argued that the traditional distinction between a priori and a posteriori knowledge is less than clear-cut, and in particular that it breaks down in connection with the intuitions on which philosophers rely. In Williamson’s view, there is a distinctive philosophical method in which intuitive judgements play a central role, but there is no warrant for classifying the relevant intuitions as a priori rather than a posteriori (Williamson 2013).
However, it is arguable that this does not so much address as by-pass the underlying question. Perhaps philosophical intuitions are not best classified as clearly “a priori”. But, if philosophy’s distinctive methodology relies on synthetic intuitions, this still seems to call for some explanation of their reliability.
Doubts about the reliability of philosophical intuitions have been amplified over the past few years by the findings of “experimental philosophy”. Empirical studies have indicated that many central philosophical intuitions are by no means universal, but rather peculiar to certain cultures, social classes and genders (Knobe and Nichols 2008, 2017). This variability of intuitions is in obvious tension with their reliability. If different people have opposed philosophical intuitions, then it cannot be that intuitions of this kind are always true.
Timothy Williamson has responded to this challenge from experimental philosophy by suggesting that, while the intuitions of ordinary people on philosophical matters might be unreliable, those of philosophers in particular can be trusted. In his view, a proper philosophical training winnows out mistaken philosophical reactions (2007: 191; 2011). However, this position still seems to call for a positive explanation of how synthetic philosophical knowledge might be established without a posteriori evidence, even if it is restricted to trained philosophers.
The possibility of such an explanation is not of course to be dismissed out of hand. There is no contradiction in the idea of experience-independent access to synthetic truths. After all, until the eighteenth century no modern philosopher doubted that God had bestowed on us powers of reason that would enable us to arrive at perception-independent knowledge of a range of synthetic claims. Even if few contemporary philosophers would still appeal to God in this context, there are other possible mechanisms that could play an equivalent role. It is not to be ruled out that our biological heritage, for example, has fixed a range of beliefs in us whose reliability owes nothing to our individual ontogenetic experience. Indeed there is a case for viewing certain aspects of our cultural heritage as playing a similar role, imbuing us with certain beliefs whose justification rests on ancestral rather than individual experience.
However, it is one thing to point to the general possibility of biological and cultural mechanisms constituting experience-independent sources of reliable knowledge, another to show that such mechanisms operate within philosophy. Even if there are areas of thought which rest on such foundations, this does not show that the intuitions of philosophers in particular have a similar backing. Moreover, there is arguably direct reason to doubt that they do. It is not just the intuitions of everyday people on philosophical matters that have a poor track record. The same applies to philosophers through history. It is not hard to think of deep-seated intuitions appealed to by past philosophers that have since been discredited. (A purely mechanical being cannot reason; space must be Euclidean; an effect cannot be greater than its cause; every event is determined; temporal succession cannot be relative.) In the next section we will see that there is reason to suppose that this unreliability is intrinsic to the nature of philosophy.
The challenge to philosophical intuitions is clear enough. Either they are analytic, in which they contain no substantial information, or they are synthetic, in which case they are of dubious reliability. Given this, a number of philosopher of naturalist inclinations advocate a revisionary attitude to philosophical method. Philosophy should turn away from intuitions, and instead engage directly with proper observational evidence. (Kornblith 2002, Knobe and Nichols 2008.)
However, this is not the only possible reaction. We would do well to remember that intuitions arguably plays a role in science as well as philosophy. The history of science displays a number of important thought experiments, like Galileo’s analysis of free fall, or the Einstein’s argument against the completeness of quantum mechanics. And intuition functions here very much as it does in philosophy. The scientist imagines some possible situation, and then makes an intuitive judgement about what would happen.
In such cases, it is clearly not mere analytic definitions that are at issue. An eminently synthetic claim—say, that heavier bodies fall faster—is undermined by a contrary intuition—if a big and small body are tied together, they will be heavier than the big one, but will not fall faster. This thought is clearly not guaranteed by concepts alone, but by synthetic assumptions about the way the world works.
Still, this kind of example still faces the second horn of the dilemma about intuitions. If the intuitions involve substantial synthetic claims, why should we take them to be reliable? The historical track record of intuitions is scarcely any better in science than in philosophy. In both realms it would seem wiser to avoid unreliable intuitions and engage directly with observational evidence.
However, there is a way of understanding the role of intuitions in both science and philosophy that evades this worry. Instead of viewing them as designed to elicit authoritative judgments to which philosophical theories must defer, they can instead be seen as devices which help us to articulate our implicit assumptions when we are threatened with paradox and have difficulty finding a solution.
Recall a point made at the beginning of our discussion of methodological naturalism. Philosophical problems are typically occasioned by some kind of theoretical tangle. Different but equally plausible lines of though lead us to conflicting conclusions. Unraveling this tangle requires that we lay out different theoretical commitments and see what might be rejected or modified. A useful heuristic for this purpose may well be to use intuitions about imaginary cases to uncover the implicit synthetic assumptions that are shaping our thinking. This can help us better to appreciate our overall theoretical alternatives, and assess which gives the best overall fit with the a posteriori evidence.
This perspective on philosophical thought experiments shows why we should positively expect many of the intuitions they elicit to prove wanting. Perhaps there are contexts outside philosophy where various kinds of a priori intuitions can be relied upon. But if philosophical problems typically arise because we are unsure about what exactly is amiss in the overall set of synthetic claims we bring to the world, then it would seem only to be expected that the fault will often lie in the implicit intuitions driving our judgements about cases.
It is worth noting that this often happens with scientific thought experiments too. Galileo’s intuition that light bodies fall as fast as heavy ones was vindicated by subsequent physics. But the verdict can also go the other way. For example, the assumption behind the Einstein’s argument against the completeness of quantum mechanics is nowadays rejected. But this certainly did not mean that his thought experiment was worthless. On the contrary, it led J. S. Bell to the derivation of the eponymous inequality whose experimental confirmation ruled out local hidden variable theories.
It is not hard to think of similar philosophical cases. The worth of philosophical thought-experiments does not always require that the intuitions they elicit are sound. Consider the classic Lockean set-up where someone’s memories are transferred to a new body. We all have an intuition that the person goes with the memories, not the old body, as evidenced by our reactions to the many fictions which trade on just this kind of scenario. But few philosophers of personal identity would nowadays hold that this intuition is decisive in favour of Lockeanism. Again, consider the intuition that conscious properties are ontologically distinct from physical ones, as displayed in our immediate reaction to zombie scenarios. Here too, few would suppose that these intuitions by themselves decide the case. Still, even those who reject Lockeanism and dualism will allow that reflection on memory-switching and zombie cases has played a crucial role in clarifying what is at issue in the debates. The evocation of intuitions by philosophical thought experiments is important, not because they provide some special kind of a priori evidence, but simply because they need to be made explicit and assessed against the overall a posteriori evidence.
This perspective on thought experiments shows that there is a sense in which recent developments within “experimental philosophy” can be viewed as complementing traditional armchair methods. In the previous section we saw that some of the findings of experimental philosophy carry the implication that everyday intuitions are not generally reliable. But in addition to this “negative” message, there is also room for experimental philosophy to make a positive philosophical contribution, even in cases where there is no variation in intuitions.
Careful experimental probing can helpfully augment traditional armchair methods as a way of identifying the structure of implicit assumptions that drive intuitive judgments about test cases. Sometimes thought experiments may be enough. But in more complicated cases systematic questionnaires and surveys may well be a better way of identifying the implicit cognitive structures behind our philosophical reactions.
Note that experimental philosophy, even when viewed in this positive light, is at most an addition to our philosophical armoury, not a new way of doing philosophy. For once we have sorted out the intuitive principles behind our philosophical judgements, whether by armchair reflection or empirical surveys, we still need to assess their worth. Even if the claim that we think a certain way is supported by hard empirical data, this doesn’t make that way of thinking correct. That can only be shown by subjecting that way of thinking itself to proper a posteriori evaluation.
Methodological naturalism fits more naturally with some areas of philosophy than others. It is perhaps not hard to understand, at least in outline, how work in areas like metaphysics, philosophy of mind, meta-ethics and epistemology might be aimed at the construction of synthetic theories supported by a posteriori evidence. But in other philosophical areas the methodologically naturalistic project may seem less obviously applicable. In particular it might be unclear how it applies to those areas of philosophy that make claims about mathematics, first-order morality or modality.
One possibility would be for methodological naturalists to make exceptions for these areas of philosophy. It would still be a significant thesis if methodological naturalism could be shown to apply to a number of central areas of philosophy, even if some specialist areas call for a different methodology.
This final subsection will address two issues raised by this suggestion. The first relates specifically to the idea that modal claims constitute a specialism within philosophy. Perhaps mathematical investigation and even first-order moralizing can be regarded as specialist subfields within philosophy. But it is arguable that a concern with the modal realm runs through all of philosophy. If so, then a challenge to the naturalist status of modal claims will threaten the naturalist status of all philosophy.
The second issue will be more directly about the methodologically naturalist status of the three areas mentioned—including mathematics and morality, along with modality. How far do methodological naturalists need to allow that mathematics, morality and modality constitute exceptions to their position in the first place?
On the first issue, Bertrand Russell said
[A philosophical proposition] must not deal specially with things on the surface of the earth, or with the solar system, or with any other portion of space and time. … A philosophical proposition must be applicable to everything that exists or may exist. (1917: 110)
However, one can agree with Russell that philosophy automatically has implications for the modal realm (“everything that … may exist”), without accepting that the aim of philosophy is to explore the modal realm as such. We need to distinguish here between an interest in claims which, as it happens, have modal implications, on the one hand, and an interest in those modal implications themselves, on the other. It is uncontentious that most of the claims of interest to philosopher have modal implications. But it does not follow from this that most of philosophy is interested in the modal realm itself.
Philosophy is largely concerned with claims about identity and constitution, claims which as it happens will be necessary if they are true. When philosophers ask about knowledge, names, persons, persisting objects, free will, causation, and so on, they are seeking to understand the identity or constitution of these kinds. They want to know whether knowledge is the same as true justified belief, whether persisting objects are composed of temporal parts, and so on. And so any truths they might establish about such matters will inevitably be necessary rather than contingent, and so carry implications about a realm beyond the actual.
But the fact that p implies necessarily p does not mean that anyone who is interested in the former must be interested in the latter, any more than someone who is interested in John’s age being 47 must be interested in its being a prime number.
This makes room for methodological naturalists to insist that most primary philosophical concerns are synthetic and a posteriori, even if they imply additional modal claims which are not. Natural science provides a good analogy here. Water is H2O. Heat is molecular motion. Stars are made of hot gas. Halley’s comet is made of rock and ice. Since all these claims concern matters of identity and constitution, they too are necessary if true. But science is interested in these synthetic a posteriori claims as such, rather than their modal implications. Chemistry is interested in the composition of actual water, and not with what happens in other possible worlds. Methodological naturalists can take the same line with philosophical claims. Their focus is on whether knowledge is actually the same as true justified belief, or whether persisting objects are actually composed of temporal parts—issues which they take to be synthetic and a posteriori—and not with whether these truths are necessary—issues which may well have a different status.
Let us now turn to the second issue flagged above. How far do methodological naturalists in fact need to allow that modality—and mathematics and first-order morality—do have a different status from the synthetic a posteriori character they attribute to philosophy in general?
The issues here are by no means clear-cut. In sections 1.7 and 1.8 above we saw how the arguments for ontological naturalism placed general constraints on the epistemological options in these area. By and large, these constraints tend to favour naturalism about philosophical method. There is no question of exploring these epistemological issues fully here, but some brief comments will be in order.
For mathematics and modality, the epistemological possibilities were restricted to irrealism and ontologically non-naturalist realism. In the moral case, there were again irrealist options, and also ontologically naturalist realisms that identified moral facts with causally significant spatiotemporal facts.
For those who endorse irrealist options in any of these areas, there would seem to be no tension with methodological naturalism. After all, irrealist analyses deny that there is any substantial knowledge to be had in mathematics, modality or morality, and so will not think of object-level claims in these areas as themselves contributing to philosophy. (This is consistent with thinking that a meta-understanding of the workings of mathematical, modal or moral discourse is important to philosophy; but then there seems no reason why such a meta-understanding should be problematic for methodological naturalism.)
Similarly, there seems no reason why the naturalist realist options in the moral case should be in tension with methodological naturalism. The details deserve to be worked through, but on the face of things we might expect knowledge of causally significant spatiotemporal moral facts to be synthetic and a posteriori.
This leaves us with non-naturalist realist accounts of mathematical and modal knowledge. As we saw earlier, the best options here appeal to the neo-Fregean programme of grounding knowledge of the mathematical and modal realms in a priori analytic principles. If this programme could be vindicated, then it would indeed violate the requirements of methodological naturalism. But, as observed earlier, it seems at best an open question whether analytic principles have the power to take us to realist knowledge of the mathematical and modal realms.
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