Notes to Mental Disorder (Illness)

1. In some traditions, madness and particularly melancholy, have been valorized, and recently, such disorder is celebrated in a literature on mad pride, as well as in particular first person memoirs (see Rashed 2019). Similar acknowledgment is associated with the so-called neuro-diversity model, in contrast to the medical one, within which the manifestations of mental disorder are neither worse, nor better, but merely atypical. (And as Ginger Hoffman has illustrated, no findings from neuroscience can adjudicate between these different conceptions (Hoffman 2019).

2. Somewhat confusingly, the sub-group “neurocognitive disorders” within orthodox classifications still refers to cognitive function narrowly construed (APA 2013: 591).

3. With recent renaming (now, “somatic symptom disorders”), it is required that as well as somatic symptoms, diagnostic criteria include significant mental distress, and observable impairment (APA 2013).

4. That in writing about madness, Aristotle seems to have envisioned something like our contemporary observations is evidenced in references to apparently delusionally-motivated actions: the slave who ate the liver of his fellow, and the man who sacrificed and ate his mother (Nicomachean Ethics, book 7, 1148b25–30, quoted by Harcourt 2013: 49).

5. With debated exceptions, the disorder categories employed today were not recognized before their nineteenth century classification (Berrios & Porter 1995).

6. These emphases on the embodied, embedded and enactive subject, familiar from the feminist theory of the 1980s and 1990s, have echoes in a range of new fields, including ethno-psychiatry (Kirmayer et al. 2015).

7. Foucault’s account is challenged in Shorter’s history of psychiatry, for example Shorter (1997).

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Jennifer Radden <>

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