Mental Disorder (Illness)

First published Wed Feb 20, 2019; substantive revision Sun May 7, 2023

Mental disorder (earlier entitled “illness” or “disease”), is ascribed to deviations from normal thoughts, reasoning, feelings, attitudes, and actions that are by their subjects, or by others, considered socially or personally dysfunctional and apt for treatment. Schizophrenia, depression, obsessive-compulsive disorder, substance abuse, and mania are examples. The concept of mental disorder plays a role in many domains, including medicine, social sciences such as psychology and anthropology, and the humanities, including literature and philosophy. Philosophical discussions are the primary focus of the present entry, which differs from the entry on Philosophy of Psychiatry in noting several different approaches—not only those of the philosophy of science and mind, but also those arising from phenomenological and social theory traditions.

As a category, mental disorder is not well fitted to the part it plays in contemporary psychiatry, since it is often misunderstood, and variously interpreted. Although widely judged to be forms of disorder, conditions such as those listed above have not all always been so understood (Porter 2002). Even when deemed to be disorder, moreover, that status has frequently indicated ethical, as much as other deficiency (Irwin 2013). Such reminders direct our attention to contemporary medical psychiatry’s sometimes uncompromisingly neurobiological, and avowedly value-free “medical model”, with its incumbent analogies and assumptions, and to the general question of how the taxa of psychiatric classifications are to be viewed as objects of natural science. This model has received intensive and continuing philosophical analysis and critique, including by those denying these conditions are deficiencies at all. And along with issues arising from cognitive psychology and the neurosciences, such foundational matters make up much of the following entry. Because of their focus on ideas central to the philosophy of mind and ethics, such as the relation of mind to body, responsibility, agency and identity, analyses of mental disorder have extensive implications for those fields. As clinical phenomena, they also reflect an inescapable, everyday, societal reality, giving theoretical inquiries additionally urgent practical, moral, and legal, implications.

1. Terminology

The language here is highly contentious. There are exceptions, but in a long history mental disorders or illnesses have been referred to as “evil”, and “willful error” or, at the very least, regarded as unwelcome misfortune.[1] And with some regularity, conditions like those listed in the current diagnostic and classificatory manual of the American Psychiatric Association (DSM-5 [APA 2013]) and or the International Statistical Classification of Diseases and Related Health Problems (ICD-11 [WHO 2020]) have been provided new classificatory titles and terminology, such revisions often solely aimed at reducing negative and stigmatizing associations. Authors cited in what follows use “mental disorder”, “psychiatric disability”, “psychiatric disorder”, “mental illness”, “madness”, “psychopathology”and “neuro-atypicality”. Controversy attaches to these terms, as it does to particular diagnostic labels (such as “schizophrenia”). Because some would question whether these mental differences are forms of illness or disorder at all, the more neutral but rarely used, “mental difference” perhaps better accommodates each side of this controversy, so the choice of “disorder” here is for its greater familiarity, and not intended to promote a disorder or illness view.

Three changes of language require special attention. With increasing frequency, the term “illness” in “mental illness” has been replaced by “disorder”, apparently without a consistent rationale beyond avoiding explicitly medical associations. In a parallel recent trend “the cognitive” and “cognition” are sometimes introduced as equivalents or replacements for “the mental”. This new language around “cognition” collapses the earlier faculty psychology divisions of affection and cognition: as much as doxastic states, emotions are “cognitive”.[2] Finally, increasing use of “mental and behavioral”, sometimes shortened to “behavioral” (as in “behavioral health”), reflects substantive changes, such as the inclusion of addictions in the class of disorders, and a preference for precisely measurable symptoms over subjective report.

Unless otherwise indicated, the expression “mental disorder” replaces “mental illness” in what follows, and refers not only to more “mental” conditions like psychoses and affective disorders, but also to “behavioral” conditions such as addictions and personality disorders. Frequently, the shift from ’mental’ to “cognitive” also indicates allegiance to substantive theoretical tenets. Here, however, “cognitive” and “cognition” are used only as terms of art within particular theoretical analyses.

2. Folk Psychology, Conceptual Analysis, and Science

Both common sense folk psychology and medical psychiatry employ concepts of mental disorder or illness, engendering confusion. (“Depression” refers to roughly the same mood states and attitudes, for example, used by a professionals or non-professionals.) Inconsistencies arising at the boundaries, where mental disorders meet other kinds of disorder, add ambiguity. Rather than traditionally mental symptoms, for example, “hysterical” (“psychosomatic”, “somatoform”, “functional” or “conversion”) syndromes exhibit bodily maladies and dysfunction ( Scull 2009). Yet they remain mental disorders in common understanding, and have long found a place in standard psychiatric classifications.[3] Also anomalous, some conditions with apparently mental symptoms are the causal product of what are, indisputably, diseases of and damage to the brain. (Delusions following cerebral hemorrhage are an example.) They are judged to be neurological rather than psychiatric complaints, and excluded from the class of mental disorders according to both everyday conceptions, and diagnostic taxonomies. Similarly, although perception is widely judged a mental capacity, some conditions affecting sight, such as blindness, are absent from diagnostic classifications.

There are different views about the conceptual relationship between everyday and more clinical language about mental disorder, and philosophers and others have approached this matter according to varying foundational assumptions. Both commonsense psychology and conceptual analysis reflecting it, are part of what Rachel Cooper calls a broadly “descriptive” project, which engages linguistic intuitions (Cooper 2020). Opinions vary as to the value and importance of the resulting characterizations. Some insist that the concept of mental disorder employed in psychiatry’s conception and classification of disorders is too closely allied to the parallel concepts in folk psychology. According to Dominic Murphy, acceptance of inconsistent folk psychological categorizing is ill-suited to the properly scientific taxonomic task which, because it is tied to the hope for a theory of the “hidden structure” of the taxonomic domain, seeks causal explanation (Murphy 2012). Without a principled and systematic way to identify the class of mental disorders, these concerns suggest, any disorder taxonomy that is presently employed will likely prove inaccurate, and indicate that the out-moded, folk psychological category of mental disorder will eventually be rendered otiose.

More conservatively, others have urged the practical importance of maintaining the category of mental disorder (Brülde & Radovic 2006). Everyday language and the traditional classifications built around it have provided a common framework for research and clinical practice; and with any further blurring of the boundaries between mental disorders and the brain damage and disease treated by neurologists, demarcations of professional competence would be lost. Fear of over-diagnosis, of granting too much power to medical psychiatry and the psychopharmacology industry, and of relinquishing to experts decisions about mental health and conceptions of eudaimonia more appropriately resolved by non-scientists, have all challenged the societal place occupied by medical psychiatry (see §10).

It is not only for such considerations of practicality and custom that common sense concepts have been supported. Some analyses adhere to an account of mind and mental processing employing mentalist terms and normative presuppositions inapplicable within an exclusively neuro-physical framework (see §4, §5, and §8). Others regard mental disorders as socially constructed entities, the existence and classification of which are inextricably tied to societal and interpersonal features of the world (see §10).

A meta-taxonomy of these varying foundational assumptions includes intersecting issues: what mental disorders are; how much we can presently know about them; and different approaches to their analysis. Thus, in one set of contrasts, objectivist (or naturalist) accounts hold that as empirically discoverable items mental disorders can be provided value-free description, while evaluativist (or normative) analyses deny the possibility of such description (discussed in §8.1). Revisionists, prepared to relinquish all current concepts, disagree with conservatives favoring the retention of (at least some) traditional categories. And, in a final sorting, the nature of mental disorder will be sought either through a posteriori scientific research based in neurocognitive science, or through conceptual analysis derived in part or whole from social and cultural norms.

3. The Mental in Mental Disorder

In a once-common practice, mental or “functional” disorders were diagnosed just when no somatic traits were evident. Such language is now explicitly disavowed, eclipsed by a growing recognition that all disorders involve bodily states ( APA 2013: 309; O’Leary 2021). Still, the “mental” in mental disorder is variously construed.

3.1 Internal Causes and Downstream (Symptomatic) Manifestations

On traditional, two-part models from cell pathology, dysfunctional organic processes internal to the individual are manifested in, and causally responsible for, more readily observable signs and symptoms; collectively, these two parts make up the disease. Applied to mental disorder, certain of those underlying processes have been delimited as mental by appeal to the traditional categories of faculty psychology (perception, affection, cognition, memory, and so on). For example, hallucinations represent dysfunctional perceptual capabilities, mania and depression disturbed affect regulation, and delusions defective cognitive processing. A disorder is thus determined to be mental as distinct from physical if its internal causes involve psychological faculties (Wakefield 1997). Other accounts ascribe disordered mentality not to underlying features but to effects on the subject’s social and personal functioning (Rashed & Bingham 2014). For example, it is because her states of sadness and self-doubt result in absenteeism, that the person with depression seeks medical help (see §4.2). More holistic and “biopsychosocial” accounts combine these features (see Nordenfelt 1995; Davies & Roache 2017; Bolton & Gillett 2019; O’Leary 2021).

On two-stage accounts both internal and outwardly-observed features form integral parts. (At least this is true of mental disorders that are prototypical, according to George Graham [2013].) Internal and more readily observable features are each included in the DSM definition of mental disorder:

a syndrome characterized by clinically significant disturbance in an individual’s cognition, emotion regulation, or behavior, that reflects a dysfunction in the psychological, biological or developmental processes underlying mental functioning. (APA 2013: 20, emphasis added)

The different positions on mental disorder just sketched—emphasizing internal conditions, observable manifestations (or “symptoms”), and both—are discussed in Section 4. Each position exhibits vulnerabilities. Accounts stressing inherent features regularly rely on hypothetical entities or processes, expecting that out of future discoveries will emerge knowledge of causal mechanisms presently hidden from view. (This position has a long history; for a thoroughgoing version, see Murphy 2012.) Often accounted for by its status as a new science, this faith has been sorely tested, thus far, by confused classifications, apparently ill-grounded research, and other liabilities, as well as incomplete models of mental dysfunction (see §4 and §6). If these impediments can be overcome, emphasis on internal causes may be expected to yield powerful explanatory models, laying the ground for incalculably valuable, targeted interventions and effective prevention and treatment. (See entry on Philosophy of Psychiatry). Placing emphasis on disabling or dysfunctional observable symptoms has comparable vulnerabilities. One setting’s dysfunctional mental symptom may be another’s normal, admired, or useful trait; and mental disorder must be distinguished conceptually from deviance, as well as from normal responses to the losses and setbacks that are our common human experience (these issues are discussed in §4, §8, and §10).

3.2 The Mark of the Mental

In some philosophical accounts including those stemming from phenomenological traditions, the mental is distinguished by particular features: it bears a special relationship to conscious awareness, and to persons, for example, or may be taken to exhibit the distinctive “aboutness” or intentionality exclusive to mental attitudes (see §5). Similarly, some theorizing emphasizes the reasons-responsiveness of all human thought and action, by which disorder can alone be explained and understood (Campbell 2013; Thornton 2007; Summers & Sinnott-Armstrong 2019).

Explanations in cognitive psychology have taken several different forms over the years: information processing models, which themselves were made up of computational processes and representations; connectionist networks; and, more recently, directly neural accounts. Moreover, philosophical reconstructions of cognitive psychology and cognitive science must be distinguished from the cognitive psychology practiced by psychologists—although little discussion of “the mental” occurs in either. Instead, focus is on the cognitive when, as was pointed out earlier, the “cognitive” subsumes capacities, states, and processes that used to be considered non-cognitive, such as sensations and emotions. Widespread acceptance of these shifts in much theoretical and research writing on mental disorder has gone some way toward eclipsing more philosophical concepts of mind and the mental, even though commonsense cognitive capacities, which are understood to involve intentionality, remain the starting point of the research program of cognitive science, and branches of cognitive psychology and cognitive neuroscience address traditionally “mental” processes such as reasoning and consciousness.

The focus of cognitive psychology usually lies with computation and representation. Mental/cognitive states (representations) depict features of the outside world (as well as other mental states and abstract entities), and mental/cognitive processes operate on those inner symbols, transforming and manipulating them (see Von Eckardt 1993; Friedenberg & Silverman 2011; Cratsley & Samuels 2013, and the entry on Cognitive Science). Although demarcated by the faculties known as “mental”, the realm of the cognitive is typically construed as properties or processes with a causal role in determining behavior, or behavioral capacities, that offer no resistance to naturalistic characterization (Chalmers 1996). Candidates for a distinctive “mark of the cognitive” are debated—but so is the need for one ( see Varga 2018; Allen 2017).

3.3 Metaphysical Implications

Mental disorders are conditions or states attributed to persons, but this need entail neither that they are entirely non-physical in nature, nor that they must (or even can), be explained in solely neuro-scientific terms. Maintaining the separation between mental and physical disorders is compatible with some forms of weak physicalism, allowing that mental or psychological processing involved in functions such as perception, reasoning and memory, are realized in the workings of the brain (see Schaffner 2016; Jefferson 2021 and the entry on health). Problems of both supervenience and emergence theories have been seen to argue towards the holistic “naturalistic dualism” entailed in a biopsychosocial model (Bolton & Gillett 2019; O’Leary 2021).

4. The Disorder in Mental Disorder

Depression and anxiety, the schizophrenias, obsessions, compulsions and the like are core instances of mental disorder, but psychiatric classification acknowledges many other conditions as well. From such a large and apparently heterogeneous collection, the broad category may best be judged a family resemblance one. Indeed, through a different historical or cultural lens, the assembled variations known today as mental disorders would likely appear incoherently arbitrary. Yet, spurred by essentialist expectations (and out of concern about the unwarranted “medicalization” of normal states and behavior), the quest for a unifying conception of mental disorder (illness, or disease) has persisted within philosophical research. Characteristic features have been identified, including disunity, irrationality, the presence of suffering and disability, several forms of dysfunction, and even adaptive function. Proposed formal analytic definitions are illustrated in Section 4.4.

4.1 Disunity and Irrationality

Works of ancient philosophy are focused more on the psyche’s health (or eudaimonia) than its illness. Nonetheless, there are hints that just as a unified soul is one that is healthy (as well as rational and virtuous), a soul lacking unity will be disturbed, or mad. Offering an account of the harmonious soul, whose rational and non-rational elements achieve unity, Aristotle leaves us a picture of the warring and fractured state of an unhealthy soul, for example.[4] The emphasis on disunity is here tied to the vices and irrationality: a fully unified soul is virtuous and rational, a dis-unified one vicious and irrational in its unhealthy divisions. And, while adhering to a different account of the passions and a more knowledge-based and Platonic analysis of vice, this link with the vices and virtues is also characteristic of the subsequent Stoic analyses (Irwin 2013). A conception of mental illness as psychic disunity (as well as an association between health, rationality and virtue) reoccurs in later philosophy (in Spinoza, for example), and in psychoanalytic traditions. Within present-day disorder descriptions, some symptom clusters readily fit the classical emphasis on disunity (addictions, and bipolarity, for example); others, including most personality disorders, are less easily depicted in such terms (see Worrell & Denham 2016).

As a characteristic attributed to mental disorder irrationality or “unreason” has been linked to emphasis on order and logic during the “Age of Reason”. Together with the emergence of empirical science, this emphasis is seen to have laid the foundation for our contemporary psychiatric categories and theories.[5] In the present day, cultural norms and intuitive folk psychology assign the boundaries of mental disorder, and these intuitions conflict about some particular conditions (addictions, and disorders of personality, for example). Yet disturbed or disabled doxastic states and capabilities remain core examples of disorder, over which intuitive agreement is strong. Characterized by incomprehensibly disordered thought, failure to adjust beliefs in response to new evidence, inconsistencies between thought and action, and delusional convictions, psychosis and psychotic thought patterns are regularly judged prototypical features of mental disorder. So the rationalistic analysis of disorder corresponds—but only to a reduced version of the presently sprawling overall category.

Forms of doxastic irrationality are still the mainstay of much policy and legal analysis about mental disorder. Assessments of criminal responsibility, of fitness to stand trial, and of the capacity to undertake binding contracts, for example, are expressed in terms of the defendant’s ability to know and understand (Reznek 1987; Robinson 1996, 2013; Adshead 2008). Ostensibly, construing mental disorder as a want of rationality has been weakened by evidence from behavioral economics showing that holding and acting on well-grounded and reasons-responsive beliefs occurs rarely in the general population, and common prejudices and superstitions seem barely distinguishable from clinical delusions with respect not only to their prevalence but to the way they are adopted and maintained (Bortolotti 2009, 2013, 2020).

Confidence that a want of rationality defines mental disorder is similarly eroded if, understood as effective social function and personal flourishing, mental health lies in traits such as unwarranted optimism, and the distorting tendency to emphasize, and remember, success over failure experiences in “positive illusions”(Taylor & Brown 1988; McKay & Dennett 2009; Jefferson et al. 2017). Along these lines, some illusions, delusions, and hallucinations have recently been acknowledged to be “perfectly acceptable, sometimes praiseworthy ways of being hopeful, committed to imagining and enacting a better world for oneself and others…making moral and meaningful lives”(Flanagan & Graham 2017: 309)

But as this indicates, whether disorder is usefully characterized as a want of reason also depends on guiding, normative conceptions of mental health or eudaimonia, and on the role of reason in those conceptions—not merely on facts of the matter, or on consequentialist reasoning.

4.2 Suffering and Disability

Other depictions of disorder rely on one or both of the groups of traits around suffering, distress and psychic pain, on the one hand, and, on the other hand, disability, incapacity and personal or behavioral dysfunction. These are the features noted in a series of influential prefatory remarks in the diagnostic and statistical manuals (the DSMs and ICDs). The wording of the fifth edition of the DSM introduces a disjunction:

Mental disorders are usually associated with significant distress or disability in social, occupational, or other important activities. (APA 2013 emphasis added)

A very similar passage from the ICD-11 is comparably qualified:

“Disorder”…is…a clinically recognizable set of symptoms or behavior associated in most cases with distress and with interference with personal functions. (WHO 2020, emphasis added)

Psychodynamic or psychoanalytic presuppositions may posit underlying distresses that are masked, or submerged within the psyche; and the elusive phenomenology of some conditions suggests the presence of nameless existential anxieties hidden from awareness (Ratcliffe 2008, 2017). But such explanations aside, distress has been widely regarded as a ubiquitous feature of disorder. In symptom-focused accounts laying stress on the consequences of the syndrome, distress becomes prominent as a form of disabling dysfunction (Stein et. al. 2010). Instead of separate criteria (and either singly or jointly sufficient for disorder, as in the respective DSM and ICD definitions above), suffering and dysfunction are conjoined on a “distress-impairment” analysis, where disorder status is assigned with (and defined as) distress that is “unmanageable or disabling” (Bolton 2013). The plausibility of this analysis increases with what have been called “distress related conditions”, such as depression and anxiety, that are “more constitutive of the illness” (Bolton 2012: 10; see also §4).

To accommodate exceptions that seem neither distressing nor disabling (such as manic states), mental disorder is sometimes characterized not by distress and dysfunction but by raised risk of such outcomes (Gert & Culver 2004). But risk of disorder is not disorder, and risk language invites troubling ethical issues around over-diagnosis and false positives ((Schwartz 2008; Stein et al. 2010; Bolton 2013; Broome, Fugar-Poli, & Wuyts 2013; Radden 2018).

Loosely understood, moreover, distresses such as these are an inescapable part of the human condition and normal responses to life’s vicissitudes. When and whether normal (and even appropriate) suffering reflects pathology has long been the source of philosophical—and societal—disagreement (Wilkinson 2000; Horwitz & Wakefield 2007). In the discussions of “normal sadness” that accompanied the revision of a fifth edition of the DSM, the grief exclusion that had (temporarily) exempted from diagnosis the suffering around mourning and grief, was challenged, its proposed elimination charged with “medicalizing” or “pathologizing” normal and appropriate human feelings (Zachar 2014; Wakefield 2012, 2020). The separation of normal from pathological distress will be indicated by distress emanating from the disorder itself, rather than from other contingencies. But presently, distresses resulting from the stigma and discrimination that follow diagnosis and treatment, as well as a host of other, frequently negative, consequences in jarring and alarming disruptions to personal lives, selves, and relationships, prove difficult to disentangle (Tekin 2011).

Some predict that biological markers will eventually allow us to distinguish distress that is a symptom of depression, for example, from that which is a normal response to external contingencies (Horwitz & Wakefield 2007). Such biomarkers may be welcomed by those decrying over-diagnosis, although an evaluative interpretation as to whether, and when, such biomarkers occur in healthy and unhealthy form will be required.

Some argue that the subjective experience of distress and the extent of impairment of the person’s day-to-day functioning are intrinsic properties of disorders like depression: conceptually, disorder attributions are made on the basis of “consequences of the syndrome as they manifest for the subject” (Rashed & Bingham 2014: 245). Psychological symptoms may constitute a mental disorder, even as it is caused by biological or social factors. In the absence of known biomarkers, depression is attributed based on psychological symptoms alone; and were known biomarkers present without evidence of any psychological symptoms, our intuitions suggest, disorder attribution would be withheld. These intuitions may shift with time, it is recognized, depending on how most people and most psychiatrists now understand, define, diagnose, and treat, depression. But today at least, disorder would be attributed on the basis of the symptoms of depression with or without biomarkers. (See Cooper 2020).

Analyses characterizing felt distress as a property constitutive of some given psychiatric condition (such as depression), are also compatible with recent models focused on the causally interconnected statistical networks making up symptom clusters. These clusters are depicted as reinforced through feedback loops that serve to rope together assorted symptoms independent of any underlying, antecedent, common, cause. In the case of depression, a range of symptoms arise from diverse sources and, through their looping interactions, form, worsen, and maintain the disorder as a relatively stable entity and conceptual whole (Kendler, Zachar, & Craver 2011; Borsboom & Cramer 2013; Borsboom 2017).

Symptom-focused accounts may combine suffering with disability, as was noted. But a conception in terms of what the affected person is prevented from doing, or unable to do as well as others, captured in the ideas of disability, impairment, incapacity and personal or behavioral dysfunction, offers an alternative characterization that can acknowledge disorders without apparent personal suffering (notably mania, some personality disorders, and some addictions).

Dysfunction and disability have been allied, or treated as rough equivalents; but sometimes disability is placed in opposition to dysfunction. Instead of construed as internal to the person, disabilities are often represented as conditional impairments, dependent on context (including physical and social arrangements). They impose limitations on the person’s ability to perform everyday activities and participate as more typically-abled people do and, on this view, call for appropriate accommodation analogous to ramps for those using wheelchairs (Oliver 2004; Polvora 2011). The analogies linking psychiatric with other disabilities may not be complete, however, nor can accommodations be achieved as easily as installing ramps (see Amundson & Tresky 2007; Rashed 2019).

Like disability, the deviance eliciting societal censure and condemnation is also placed in contrast to dysfunction, although efforts to further characterize that contrast have thus far been incomplete (Aftab & Rashed 2021).

4.3 Dysfunction in Two Stage Analyses

Dysfunction forms a central element of the most widely discussed analytic definition of mental disorder, introduced in Section 3. The notion of dysfunction applies in two distinct ways in Wakefield’s harmful dysfunction analysis, one way avowedly objective, and the other not (see §4.4). In the first, dysfunction occurs in some part or parts of a bodily or neural system. That dysfunction in turn causes dysfunction in some part or parts of the individual’s social and personal system (grounding the normative judgment of harmfulness). The first kind of dysfunction permits non-evaluative description, it is supposed.

The characteristic dysfunction of mental disorder is here part of a standard, idiopathic model, as we saw, with these disabling traits understood as the symptomatic, causal manifestations of an underlying, pathological process. The appropriateness of that model for psychiatric conditions has received persistent critique (see §10.1). Recent challenges rest on the persuasiveness of network models (introduced in §4.2), where symptomatic dysfunction does not emanate from some disabled inner mechanism, but instead emerges piecemeal from interacting experiences that cumulatively build clusters of disabling symptoms out of feedback loops (Kendler, Zachar, & Craver 2011; Borsboom & Cramer 2013). In support of this alternative model is accumulating evidence from the social sciences that a range of factors combine to bring about disorder: individualistic risk factors, but also aspects of the broader context in which the individual finds herself (Bolton 2010; Kirmayer, Lemelson, & Cummings 2015). A more fundamental critique rejects the dysfunction analysis of disorder, favoring instead a madness-as-strategy account which draws strength from adaptionism (Garson 2022; See Section 4.4).

4.4 Formal Definitions

Eschewing a more formal definitions, analyses such as the “distress-impairment” one introduced earlier rely on prototypical cases (see Graham 2013, for example), or point to intrinsic vagueness that must thwart such efforts (Keil, Keuck & Hauswald 2017). Others are more ambitious, proposing analytic definitions in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions and even encompassing other medical conditions as well as mental disorders. (For those stressing the inseparability and interdependence of mental and bodily disorder, no important distinction is acknowledged between mental and physical disorders [Pârvan 2015].) (i)–(vi) below are a sample of these efforts. More recent definitions reflect increasing recognition that the diversity of the category must frustrate efforts at a covering definition.

  1. A disease is the absence of normal function of a mechanism or process in a person that detracts from the person’s survival or reproduction (Boorse 1977). More recent elaborations on this early version of the definition emphasize biological function and statistical normality, so that on a bio-statistical theory, diseases are internal states that depress a functional ability below species-typical levels (relative to age and sex) (Boorse 1997). Critiques of this definition have challenged its aspiration to be value free; its introduction of an arbitrarily selected reference class; and its failure to honor the accepted distinction between “disease” with its implied defectiveness, and mere difference (Bolton 2008).
  2. A condition is a mental disorder if and only if (a) the condition causes some harm or deprivation of benefit to the person as judged by the standards of the person’s culture, and (b) the condition results from the inability of some internal mechanism to perform its natural function, wherein a natural function is an effect that is part of the evolutionary explanation of the existence and structure of the mechanism (Wakefield 1992, 1997). Critiques of this definition occur later in this section and in Section 5. In addition, definitions in evolutionary theoretic terms introduce a category of innate risk factors that is belied by the way natural, social, and individual factors are inextricably interwoven in disorder (Bolton 2008). And the formulation relies on unsubstantiated, empirical assumptions about the way natural selection underlies natural function (Lilienfeld & Marino 1995; Murphy & Stich 2000). The relativism in (a) above has been challenged (Gert & Culver 2004: 421; Bolton 2008). And rather than exhibiting dysfunction, at least some mental disorders may be explained relationally, by traits that are mismatched in the person’s context, due to their developmental or evolutionary features (Garson 2015).
  3. A mental malady is a condition of a person, other than his rational beliefs and desires, such that he is suffering, or at increased risk of suffering, an evil (death, pain, disability, loss of freedom or opportunity, or loss of pleasure), in the absence of a distinct sustaining cause (Gert & Culver 2004). The concept of a sustaining cause is unacceptably vague and inclusive, permitting conditions to count as disorders that are not, intuitively, disorders at all (Murphy 2012). For example, some disorders leave permanent, non-pathological alterations in the character that outlast any immediate stressors.
  4. A condition is pathological if and only if it is an abnormal bodily/mental condition that requires medical intervention and that harms standard members of the species in standard conditions (Reznek 1987: 163–4). For criticisms of this definition’s appeal to baseline population norms, and to medical intervention, see comments on (i), (ii) and (iv) above. Reference to required medical intervention fails to acknowledge risks of over-medicalization and over-diagnosis and invokes concerns over enhancement. (See Savulescu, ter Meulen, & Kahane 2011.)
  5. Diseases involve deprivation, but a disease is a depriving relation rather than a depriving entity, depending on the patient for its existence…the person is not conceived as ontologically diminished or defective because it suffers the deprivation. Drawing on Augustine’s ontology of disease, bodily integrity, and the human person, Alexandra Pârvan argues that disease stands in ontologically necessary connection with the patient as person. (From this is derived a treatment approach based on how the person relates to the disease, and a goal of reconfiguring the person as deprived but not diminished [Pârvan 2015, 2016].) This account is limited inasmuch as it requires adherence to its Augustinian ontology.
  6. Mental disorders are biological kinds whose effects lead to harmful consequences … more natural kinds of mental disorders (e.g. schizophrenia, bipolar disorder) are biological kinds primarily underwritten by biological mechanisms. More artificial kinds (e.g., hysteria, voyeuristic disorder) are social kinds primarily underwritten by social mechanisms. (Tsou 2022:10).
  7. at least some of the forms (of madness) … are strategies for solving problems, coping with aspects of the environment, regulating one’s mental economy … the creative problem-solving activity of the human mind, or God’s stern but benevolent hand, or the healing impetus of nature, or an evolutionary adaptation, a purpose-driven process, a well-operated machine … (Garson 2022:10). If neuropsychiatry ever succeeds in identifying the defective mechanisms it seeks, Garson’s analysis must be weakened. Moreover, it seems vulnerable to some of the accusations of complexity-defying oversimplification that have dogged other adaptationist just-so stories.

5. Phenomenological Approaches

The symptoms of mental disorder are primarily, if not exclusively, states about which their subject can claim a sort of authority. (Since in describing these states subjects can intentionally or unintentionally mislead, such loosely phenomenological [or “experience-near”] reports—however necessary—may nonetheless present epistemic limitations as data (Kontos 2016).) Psychology can provide reliable behavioral assessments of disorder, and indicate its presence through laboratory performance tests. But no mental disorder is thus far independently verifiable (though blood tests or scans, for example). First person reports play a special part in understanding such disorder for the clinician, or for the researcher, and those establishing philosophical analyses are similarly beholden (Flanagan 2011; Varga 2015). Carl Jaspers’ General Psychopathology, which combines close, clinical description with the method and presuppositions of existential and phenomenological thinkers such as Husserl and Heidegger, has been widely discussed. This pairing of clinical and philosophical knowledge makes him one of the undisputed originators of the research field known as the philosophy of psychiatry and psychopathology (Jaspers1913 [1963]).) Confusingly, not every loosely “phenomenological” clinical approach focused on the patient’s experience and report adheres to all of the tenets of the philosophical discipline of Phenomenology derived from these traditions, however (see Parnas & Sass 2008).

The phenomenological strand of philosophical analysis influenced by thinkers like Husserl and Heidegger remains focused on immediate, first person report (for example, self-experience in psychosis (Parnas & Sass 2008; Madeira, Pienkos, et al. 2019)); disordered temporal experience (Fuchs 2005, 2013); delusional states (Parnas & Sass 2008; Gallagher 2005, 2013); and affective disturbances (Ratcliffe 2008; Ratcliffe & Stephan 2014; Jacobs et. al. 2014)). In these traditions neither psychology nor psychopathology are empirical sciences in the usual sense because they involve distinctive forms of explanation. Arising within nineteenth century social science, the hermeneutical approach involving meanings calls for Verstehen (understanding), a distinctive, interpretive way of apprehending human action. (See Jaspers 1913 [1963]; Phillips 2013,Wiggins & Schwartz 2011; Spitzer & Uehlein 1992.) These differences of approach bring differing orientations towards fundamentals, and writing following German and French traditions has been placed in contrast to the “Anglo-empiricist” approach judged more influenced by empirical science, and showing greater emphasis on objectivity and measurement (Mullen 2011; see also Gergel 2012).

These differences bring contrasting theories about psychology as science. Whether, bypassing diagnostic categories and medical disease models entirely, symptoms and the subjective life of the patient should be the main or even sole locus of attention, is one (Stanghellini 2004); another is whether the experiences associated with psychosis, particularly, must be categorically divorced from more typical psychological processes (Sass 2001; Parnas & Sass 2008). Emphasizing the unique challenges imposed by interpretation in psychiatry, Somogy Varga has argued for a hermeneutics distinctive to psychiatry that is grounded in ideas about the self-interpreting aspect of human beings, “mental disorder” thus standing in an asymmetrical relation that is supervenes on our self identities (Varga 2015).

There is disagreement over the correct application of phenomenological method (Mishara 2007; Sass, Parnas, & Zahavi 2011). But psychopathology likely offers a challenge so great as to call for a range of approaches (Ratcliffe 2011; Wiggins and Schwartz 2011; Gallagher 2013). Attempts have also been made to combine phenomenological with empirical approaches: Matthew Ratcliffe’s work on affective states employs social research methods, for example (Ratcliffe 2008; Ratcliffe & Stephan 2014). And efforts to tie in phenomenological theorizing with findings in neuroscience have yielded the hybrid methodology of phenomenological clinical neuroscience advocating an initial study of subjective experience to only then be probed for its underlying neurobiology (Mishara 2007: 34).

The merging of empirical and phenomenological methodologies is also readily supported by the tenets of embodied and enactive cognition. Conceptions of the embodied, embedded, and sense-making enactive mind bring emphasis on the way, shaped by perceptual experience, consciousness and the first person perspective form the basis of all mental processing (Varela, Thompson, & Rosch 1991; Durt, Fuchs, & Tewes 2017; Di Paolo & De Jaegher 2017). Applied to mental disorder, this departure from classical cognitivist assumptions and analogies suggests that at least some disorder grows out of disturbances in embodied interaction with the environment, and not from dysfunctions occurring in high-level cognitive mechanisms (Drayson 2009; Stanghellini 2004, 2016; Maiese 2016).[6]

6. Classification

While Section 3 focused on what might separate mental from non-mental disorders, and Section 4 was concerned with how to separate disordered from non-disordered states, Section 6 addresses another aspect of classification: controversies over how different types of putative mental disorders should be distinguished from one another. These controversies, like so many about psychiatry, span the disciplines of medicine, science (including neuroscience and psychology) and philosophy.

The diagnostic and statistical classificatory manuals and international disease classifications (DSMs and ICDs) share broad features in providing a categorical scheme of separate mental disorders: each disorder is idiopathic in arising at least in part from morbid factors within the person, and each is identified “descriptively”, using polythetic (disjunctive) criteria to be employed with clinical observation of individual patients (including their self-report). Aside from serving the institutions providing services, their uniformity is aimed to enhance inter-diagnostician reliability; and research based on these reliable classifications, it had been hoped, should eventually allow validation of the categories, although failure to achieve this promised yield in research findings has been conspicuous, and partly motivated the revised research domain criteria (RDoC), described later in this section.

Following early work by Carl Hempel (1961) that depicted psychiatry’s claim to scientific status as depending on the value neutrality of its classifications, much philosophical discussion of classification has been entirely critical, conceding little usefulness to the approach, skeptical of the promise of validity, doubtful of its methodology and claims to scientific authority, un-persuaded by the categorical system employed, as well as its individualistic and idiopathic emphasis, and dubious over its claim to being, or being able to be, value-free. Philosophical analysis has often been focused on particular symptom descriptions, disregarding or disavowing the diagnostic categories of which they are presumed to be clinical manifestations, in some cases introducing and employing revised categories such as “distress related conditions” (Bolton 2012), “body image disorders”(Morris 2013), and “real hallucinations” (Ratcliffe 2017). Others have accepted the entities so classified (Sass, Zahavi, Frith and colleagues, for example).

Criticisms of DSM and ICD classifications have addressed their research purposes and usefulness, categorical approaches and supposed value-neutrality. (The claim to value neutrality is discussed in Section 8. These classifications recognize the presence of many overarching values, including the methodological ones implicit in their goals of achieving validity and reliability. But further, unsupportable values (such as homophobia and misogyny) have been identified as well.)

6.1 Research Purposes and Usefulness

Even by those within psychiatry, it has been widely concluded that as tools for research, the prevailing classifications are flawed, producing findings that tend to be inconsistent, non-replicable, non-specific, or ambiguous, with the categories involved exhibiting problems of construct and predictive validity, as well as imprecise phenotypic definitions, widespread heterogeneity, and extensive comorbidity (Cuthbert & Insel 2013; Poland 2014; Poland & Von Eckardt 2013; Tsou 2021). In partial defense of DSM-type classifications, Elizabeth Lalumera points out that mental disorders may correspond to theoretically informed and thus far incompletely understood concepts, in contrast to descriptive conceptions sufficient for identification practices in diagnosis and care (Lalumera 2016)

Research-related concerns have led to the issuance of new, dimensional criteria by which the research domain is to be approached (Revised Domain Criteria, or RDoC). Separate units of analysis (genes, cells, circuits, self reports, etc.) are each employed in specific research domains (such as positive and negative valence systems, cognitive systems, systems for social processes, and arousal/regulatory systems), and the intersections of units of analysis with research domains produce segments of a spectrum linking normal and atypical features. Whether RDoC’s goals are entirely compatible has been questioned, but the aim here is to promote both more accurate research and more effective treatments (Cuthbert & Insel 2013; Perring 2016; Morris, Sanislow et. al. 2022). And while answering some of the concerns about the earlier classificatory model, RDoC has in its turn been criticized: for its conception of validity; its assumptions about the uniformity of normal distributions; its continuing acceptance of clinical and medical presuppositions assigning disorder to the individual rather than the broader social context; its finding little place for personal agency, and assuming a traditional, individualistic and autonomous model of self challenged by today’s philosophical analyses. (See essays in Poland & Tekin 2017; Tabb 2019.)

6.2 Categorical and Dimensional Approaches

Psychiatric classifications have often adhered, entirely or in part, to a nineteenth century, Kraepelinian model, where each disease is a discretely bounded entity, made up of a symptom cluster emanating from underlying organic states or processes within the individual patient. But the applicability of this model to mental disorder has been challenged. Some would replace its idea of validity (involving a relation between classificatory name and underlying disease) with the statistical concept of predictive or prognostic validity, which proceeds without reference to underlying causes. Rather than discretely bounded, many disorders appear to be continuous with normal states, and in an interpretive and definitional choice, over which the data remains ambiguous, mental disorders arguably represent no more than tails of normal distributions of particular traits in the general population – although the uniformity of these normal distributions has also been questioned (Zachar 2014;Poland & Tekin 2017; Machery 2017).

Some diagnostic conditions (post-traumatic stress disorder, most unarguably) apparently arise from their subject’s surrounding social, economic, and cultural context. Even those with more claim to idiopathic genetic, neurological, or biological causes as predisposing factors are recognized to exhibit a course more strongly influenced by environmental and epigenetic than any fixed inherent factors – thus putting further pressure on the “common cause” hypothesis, whereby a syndrome is explained by a single inherent feature or set of features (Borsboom & Cramer 2013). Solely internal, organic states and processes, and genes, cannot alone explain all, and probably any, diagnostic disorders.

With their hypothesized common causes awaiting discovery, categorical analyses present problems (such as the risk that allied symptoms may not prove to emanate from a single common cause). But dimensional approaches make more evident the so-called boundary problem (Rashed 2021) of where to assign the line between normal variation and disorder. Theoretically, the “common cause” in categorical analyses serves as an anchor uniting the often disparate and variable observable symptoms making up a given disorder. (It is a feature that justifies the nomological approach of diagnostic classifications.) Aside from this theoretical solution, categorical models are similarly beset by boundary (fuzzy edges) problems. The presence of disorder is preceded and followed by a halo of prodromal and postdromal symptoms, over which clinical (and everyday) judgements are often unresolved. These boundary issues remain regardless of the model adopted. In an explicitly normative attempt to resolve an aspect of the boundary problem as it occurs in social and political contexts, Mohammed Rashed employs criteria governing recognition of social identities as a guide to pathological status (Rashed 2019, 2021).

Expanding with each new addition, the collection of disorders enumerated and described in psychiatric classifications has prompted alarm over the boundaries of mental disorder, the erosion of normal, mentally healthy states and variations, and the inappropriate role played by medical psychiatry and, finally, science, in dictating norms of healthy psychic functioning. Philosophical criticisms of “medicalization” emphasize the increasing influence of neuroscience in transforming cultural expectations and diminishing individual agency, and the power over psychological norms exhibited by the psychopharmacological industry (Phillips 2009, 2013; Rose & Abi-Rached 2013; Moncrieff 2008; Sadler 2005 , 2013, Whitaker & Cosgrove 2015).

In contrast to these commonly-voiced apprehensions about over-medicalization, there remains the persistent charge of under-diagnosis and under-treatment of those with diagnosable mental disorder, often attributed to stigma, and to the socioeconomic status of under-served communities. Epidemiological findings about the incidence of disorder, as distinct from its diagnosis, are notoriously insufficient, however, quite apart from a want of independent biomarkers, due to self-stigma and fear of discrimination, for example, but also to distorting placebo effects, and to research methods misleadingly susceptible to false positives (Jopling 2009; Horwitz & Wakefield 2007; Poland & Von Eckardt 2013)). The actual epidemiological data remains opaque and equivocal, leaving these contrary speculations unresolved and likely unresolvable.

The DSM and ICD diagnostic classifications have been remarkably influential worldwide: today, they appear almost immovably permanent. But viewed within their broader moral, political, and social context, which includes psychiatry’s apparently uneven provision of effective treatment, the appropriate stance to adopt towards them, as Christian Perring has pointed out, remains critical and skeptical (Perring 2016: 87).

7. Natural Kind Status

Philosophers of science have explored whether all or some mental illnesses might be classified as natural kinds, the claim made about particular diagnostic categories or symptom clusters (depression, schizophrenic disorder, and autism, for example), as well as about separate symptoms (Cooper 2007; Samuels 2009; Tsou 2021). With recognition that even the category of biological species would not meet an essentialist criterion for natural kind status, a “homeostatic property cluster” account of natural kinds has been proposed (Ellis 2001; Cooper 2007; Murphy 2012; Samuels 2009). (See entry on Species.) A natural kind must be able to ground explanations and inductive inferences, and enable effective human intervention. Linked by shared causal properties such as genes, on this view, their homeostatic aspect ensures that property clusters making up separate disorders (or symptoms) will remain stable enough to behave the same way in response to the same conditions, due to a similarity-generating mechanism explaining their co-occurrence. (See essays in Kincaid and Sullivan 2014.)

Psychological categories may resemble biological species in some respects. But differences here have often been seen as profound, as three examples will demonstrate. (i) Some have taken psychological categories to represent a different order of being, as we saw in Section 5, with its own distinctive forms of causal explanations (Jaspers 1913 [1963]; Bolton 2008; Wiggins & Schwartz 2011; Kusters 2016). (ii) Others point out that psychological categories can alter, and eventually even be altered by, the persons they classify, forming “interactive” kinds through such looping effects. Indeed, mental disorders have been denied the status of natural kinds because instability in their properties results when they have been classified and labeled (Hacking 1995). And (iii), some have tried to show that the relation between mental illnesses and biological kinds differs according to the role played by values in establishing the taxa of mental illness (Wakefield 1992; this claim is discussed in §8). None of these differences has gone un-criticized. A thoroughgoing mind to brain reductionism would reject (i). About (ii), it has been pointed out that the classification of biological species is also subject to the instability wrought by looping effects (Khalidi 2010). And similarly, it has been argued in response to (iii) both that values also enter into the classification of biological species, and that once we reach the categories of interest in this analysis, non-evaluative traits form the observable taxa of such species (Cooper 2007).

Although the diverse ends to which disorder taxonomies can be put argue against finding a single answer about the kind status of mental disorders, focus on the purposes served by disorder language and categories has proven fruitful, here. (i) Mental disorders have been assigned to a category of “practical kinds”, where membership in this class depends on some external criterion that is pragmatically relevant in the clinical context, such as a certain degree of functional impairment, and remains unrelated to the underlying structure of the kind (Zachar 2014). Moreover, they may be further classified according to their status as dimensional, discrete, and fuzzy kinds, and there is little reason to suppose that each and all conform to any one of these (Haslam 2002, 2014). (ii) Whether or not they exhibit the stability required of classifications into true natural kinds, these disorders do possess the properties relevant, and sufficiently stable, to guide clinical treatment, Şerife Tekin illustrates, using the lack of illness awareness (“insight”) common in patients with some diagnoses (Tekin 2016).

8. Values and Mental Disorder

Values have unfailingly played a part in the way mental disorders are classified, conceptualized, experienced as personal diagnosis, and treated. Philosophical accounts differ over the possibility of a value-free science of psychiatry (these are considered in §8.1). Values also affect societal and personal attitudes towards disorder and diagnosis, in ways that are more immediate, considerably more urgent, and morally consequential (see §8.2). Some of these issues are dealt with in bioethical research directed specifically towards psychiatry (§8.3).

8.1 Evaluativism (Normativism) and Objectivism (Naturalism)

Present day conceptions, classifications, and attributions of mental disorder contain many values, some explicit, others implicit, some moral, others non-moral. Unacceptable bias has been repeatedly identified, exemplified in categories such as homosexuality (with its homophobia), pre-menstrual syndrome (unwarrantedly assigning disorder status to normal function), masochistic personality disorder (pathologizing misogynist gender roles), and oppositional defiant conduct disorders (exhibiting racial bias) (Sadler 2005, 2013; Potter 2014; Poland 2014, Gagné-Julien). As in all medicine, the prefixes of “illness”and “disorder,” like “disease,” already declare values such as the preference for health over ill-health. A theory of values based medicine (VBM) emphasizes that values over mental health are particularly contentious, requiring distinctive forms of negotiation in clinical practice (Fulford 2004, 2014).

The central philosophical question is whether moral values are inescapably attached to the conceptualization and classification of mental disorders at the level of theorizing, forming an inherent part of their definition. Such “evaluativism” (“normativism”, or “constructivism”) is placed in contrast to “objectivism” (“naturalism”), which seeks a value-free account of mental disorder. Debates over these questions have long dominated philosophical research on mental disorder, many played out around attempts to define mental disorder in ways that are value-free (see §4).

As was shown (§4.4), philosophical definitions aiming to avoid all values appeal to allegedly value-neutral statistical norms, and adaptive function, respectively. The vulnerability in Boorse’s (1997) statistical definition, where normal function is determined according to the person’s reference class identified by such criteria as age, and sex, lies both with assigning the appropriate reference class, a process that re-introduces values, and at the point on a continuous distribution curve where deviance from the mean is granted the status of dysfunctional (Bolton 2008). Recognizing that a trait may be dysfunctional in evolutionary terms without being disvalued, and disvalued without being evidence of dysfunction, Wakefield’s two-part definition explicitly accommodates the evaluative element marking the category. This attempt to provide a naturalistic and value free evolution-based account of “function” and “dysfunction” has been subject to a range of damaging objections, including the claim that with its preference for evolutionary fitness, biological dysfunction is not, as promised, value neutral, even in the first half of the definition. Discerning what would be the maximal response in terms of perpetuating the species represents another of these objections, since no agreed-upon conclusion about this can be drawn in a value-neutral, or perhaps any, way. (See Murphy & Stich 2000; Faucher & Forest 2021; Garson 2022.) Critiques of more general disease definitions are also applicable mental disorder. (See Powell & Scarffe 2019.)

Evaluativism and objectivism are customarily depicted as incompatible contraries, although the different domains where claims about disorder occur (including ordinary usage; conceptually clean versions of “health” and “disease”; the operationalization of dysfunction, and the justification for that operationalization), indicate need for a more nuanced analysis of the role of values in health and disease (Kingma 2014). The broad contrast between evaluativism and objectivism has also been resisted for other reasons. Judgments about mental disorder need not be entirely arbitrary and subjective as long as those values are taken to be real features of the world along the lines of McDowell’s secondary property value realism, for example. In this relaxed naturalism, objectivism merely means requiring no special subject for the disciplining, conception, and framing of judgments, and providing a contrast between correct and incorrect, or truth and falsity, for the relevant judgments (Thornton 2007).

8.2 Societal and Personal Attitudes Towards Disorder and Diagnosis

The present discussion concerns evaluations that are primarily negative, although as we saw earlier, positive evaluations arise in traditions valorizing madness, and many in the neuro-diversity movement insist that autism spectrum and other mental disorders are unexceptional human variations analogous to differences of gender, which ought to be granted respectful accommodation, not clinical treatment. (See Hoffman 2019; Chapman & Carel 2022.) Negative social attitudes towards observable disorder have led to stigma, self-stigma, and discrimination (Hinshaw 2009). The madman and madwoman have been the subject of fear, misunderstanding, disparagement and condemnation, their failings exaggerated and humanity denied (Gilman 1985). With modernity, care and protection apparently replaced earlier, moralistic and neglectful arrangements. (The reforms’ real effects and costs remain an unsettled matter of historical debate.[7] ) At the same time formal exceptions and protections, such as the insanity defense, recognized mental disorder as an exculpating excuse for wrongdoing and negligence. Despite such attitudinal change, however, these issues around responsibility remain contentious and unresolved (Pouncey & Lukens 2010; Singh, Sinnott-Armstrong & Savulescu 2013; Schramme 2014).

The effect of diagnoses on those so distinguished has been demonstrated to be extensive, often personally transformative, and usually not benign. The extent of these effects has drawn research attention to first-person report, and to the eloquent madness memoirs increasingly available for study. It has led to theorizing within formal philosophical writing, and also within the rhetoric of social movements and identity-focused political interest groups (see §10). The Recovery movement, for example, stresses the way the self and identity are diminished by diagnosis, which erodes and occludes equally important and more positive, attributes making up the whole person. (See Davidson 2013.) Critiques of diagnosis place emphasis on its dehumanizing and “objectifying” effects that, magnified by stigmatizing societal attitudes, engender self-stigma ( Hoffman & Hansen 2017; Hinshaw 2009; Thornicroft 2006). More recently, however, social media and our hyperconnected contemporary existence are seen as issuing in a less stigmatizing and discriminatory world, where some particular disorder diagnoses form social identities (Sulik 2011).

8.3 Psychiatric Bioethics and Neuroethics

Societal attitudes towards mental disorders, added to features associated with such disorders themselves, have given rise to a bioethics differing in emphasis from that addressing ethical issues in most of general medicine. Widespread stigma about such disorder raises extra privacy and confidentiality issues, for example. Because of the powerful and disruptive effects of the experience of disorder, conceptions of disorder, and its treatment are often linked to the self and identity of the subject in distinctive ways (Tekin 2019). The compromised perceptual, affective, and reasoning capabilities that at least temporarily mark severe disorder are seen to jeopardize the widely-valued traits of rational autonomy, responsibility, and coherent and unified personhood, leading to challenges over agency and decisional capacity (Radoilska 2012; Sadler, Fulford, & van Staden 2015). And most significantly, treatment regularly employs coercive methods.

These coercive practices are judged of serious moral concern. For example, coercive treatment seems to jeopardize rights proclaimed by the United Nations Convention on the Rights of Persons with Disabilities (2006). Important philosophical issues here include whether there are person-centered and more paternalist principles that would respectively obviate, and justify, coercive treatment; how to define coercion; what constitutes valid consent; and links between coercion and stigmatizing consequences (Kallert, Mezzich, & Monahan 2011; Szmukler 2016; Cratsley 2019; Pouncey & Mertz 2019). Recent theorizing addresses “mental disorder exceptionalism” (different treatment for mental and physical conditions), proposing tests for everyone with reduced capacity, regardless of cause (Szmukler & Dawson 2011).

Aside from legal and moral liability, disorders affecting volition (in addictive and compulsive behavior) have been considered in light of the moral capacities associated with attributing full adult responsibility. Efforts to ground the intuition that sufferers from these conditions are less than fully responsible agents have appealed to “deep self” and also “reasons responsiveness” theories of responsibility. Neither theory alone has been found to readily accommodate the collection of symptoms associated with this group of disorders (Schramme 2014; Summers & Sinnott-Armstrong 2019).

The related field of neuroethics explores developments and prospects in neuroscience possessing increased urgency, or distinctive relevance, for psychopathology. (See Bluhm, Jacobson, & Maibom 2012; Roskies 2007; Glannon 2015; Caruso & Flanagan 2018.) For example, encroachment on “mental privacy” can be expected to disproportionately affect those with stigmatized genders, disorders and symptoms; and a future can be envisioned in which the semantic authority of first person symptom descriptions is undermined by diagnoses independently verified through imaging or other technologies (Maibom 2012). More generally, this new knowledge seems likely to foster a trend from the treatment of disorder to its prediction based on observed risk factors, which in turn permits initiatives such as the identification and treatment of early onset, “prodromal” conditions in younger subjects (children and youth), likely affecting identity development and self-management (Broome, Fusar-Poli, & Wuyts 2013; Whitaker & Cosgrove 2015; Radden 2018). (See entries on Philosophy of Neuroscience, and Neuroethics.)

Responsibility concepts, together with those around personhood, autonomy, diminished capacity and individual rights, make up an inescapable aspect of the broad field of psychiatric ethics. Areas of recent research concern responsibility and blame. Attitudes of blame are customarily treated as an appropriate sequel to assigning responsibility (Watson 2004), but Hanna Pickard uncouples responsibility from blame. At least for the apparently willful behavior of those diagnosed with disorders affecting agency, she argues, the proper stance for the care-giver is grounded in an empathic attitude that assigns responsibility without blaming, because it is one most conducive to improvement and recovery (Pickard 2011).

Closely related responsibility issues involve the personality disorders which, due to their long-recognized relationship to more normal character weaknesses, and their evidently dimensional nature, sit uneasily within psychiatric classifications (Sinnott-Armstrong 2008; Pickard 2011, 2016). One DSM grouping (cluster B personality disorders, including borderline, narcissistic and antisocial), are better approached using persuasion, and methods reminiscent of the “moral treatment” of earlier times, Louis Charland argues (Charland 2004).

Philosophical challenges to customary moral, ethical, and medical presuppositions introduced in this section have been influenced by, and are difficult to separate from, critiques of medical psychiatry that have taken place not only within academe, but also beyond it. These are discussed in Section 10.

9. Particular Psychopathologies

While often more ambitious and encompassing, philosophical attempts to define or characterize mental disorder have also provided finer-grained analyses.(See chapters in Fulford, Davies et al., 2013; Moseley & Gala 2016; and Tekin & Bluhm 2019.) Beyond research into the symptom clusters classified as the schizophrenias, that are widely regarded as candidates for some kind of natural kinds status, analyses have been offered for anorexia and other eating disorders (Gadsby 2017a, 2017b, 2020;Bordo 1993; Giordano 2005, 2019; Svenaeus 2013; Morris 2013; Tan, Hope & Stewart 2003, Tan, Stewart, Fitzpatrick & Hope 2010; Radden 2021); addiction (West 2006; Poland & Graham 2011; Flanagan 2017; Vohs & Heatherton 2000; Holton & Berridge 2013; Foddy & Savalescu 2010; Summers 2015; Lewis 2015; Levy, 2006, 2011, 2013; Kennett 2013; Sripada 2018; Westin 2020; Glacken, Roberts & Krueger 2021; Pickard 2016); anti-social personality disorder (Sinnott-Armstrong 2008; Adshead 2013; Roskies 2003; Schramme 2014; Levy 2007;Kennett & Fine 2008; Maibom 2014; Justman 2021); depressive and manic-depressive conditions (Varga 2016; Bluhm 2011; Bluhm, Jacobson & Maibom 2012; Horwitz & Wakefield 2007; Wakefield 2012; Bolton 2013; Hoffman & Hansen 2017; Ratcliffe & Stephan 2014; Browne 2018; Radden 2013; Radoilska 2012; Biegler 2011; Fuchs 2001, 2005, 2013); scrupulosity, Obsessive-Compulsive and other volitional disorders (Glas, 2013; Szalai 2016; Summer & Sinnott-Armstrong 2019); anxiety (Horwitz & Wakefield 2012); autism spectrum conditions (Adams 2013; Baron-Cohen, Lombardo & Tager-Flusberg 2013); disorders of dissociation (Worrell & Denham 2016; Maiese 2016); Defiant Disorder (Potter 2014); Borderline Personality Disorder (Potter 2009) and Premenstrual Dysphoric Disorder (Gagné-Julien 2021).

The category of psychosis, employed for extreme states of disorder affecting perceptual capabilities (in hallucinations) and reasoning (in delusions and other cognitive defects) have received considerable philosophical attention. With almost unfailing consequences for their subject in clinical, legal, social, and personal settings, the severity of hallucinations and delusions serves to distinguish them from many of the general controversies about disorder noted thus far. The incidence of and pathology associated with hallucinations has been questioned, as has their origins, and phenomenology (Leudar & Thomas 2000; Ratcliffe 2017; Henriksen, Raballo, & Parnas 2015). And delusions have attracted the particular attention of philosophers for their incomprehensibility, and challenge to theories about meaning, language, belief, and intention (Coltheart & Davies 2000; Fletcher & Frith 2009; Bortolotti 2009, 2020; Miyazono 2019; Evans 2022). They have also been the impetus for important collaborative work between several sciences: in addition to being psychiatric disorders delusions occur as symptoms of neurological diseases of and injury to the brain, and as such have been subject to considerable empirical study. Philosophical research on delusions primarily addresses issues their intelligibility; their status in relation to more normal doxastic states; and their place in explanatory models.

The intelligibility of delusions remains contested. Delusions are expressed using unexceptional syntax, and some involve content that, while inaccurate or implausible, is entirely comprehensible. These, Jaspers insisted, are secondary delusions; primary delusions, in contrast, are distinguished by their meaninglessness: attributing meaning to them is a misapplication of the hermeneutic approach (Jaspers 1913 [1963]; Gorski 2012). Others have adopted the position that all delusions are meaningless utterances (Berrios 1991), and findings in brain science have been employed to confirm that (Gerrans 2014). In contrast, it is argued that delusions are always comprehensible, but only within a context that includes the person’s whole life, ideas and values, and recognizing non-literal interpretation (Bentall 2004; Wickham & Bentall 2016, Mullen & Gillett 2014; Glover 2014; Jeppsson 2021; Gipps 2022).

Delusions are belief-like, but disagreements arise over whether they are beliefs, imaginings, an incomplete form of one of these two, or a distinct hybrid form. The doxastic position (delusions are beliefs) must somehow accommodate that compared to typical beliefs, delusions are not responsive to countervailing evidence, and are only weakly behavior guiding. (See Flores 2021 and entry for Delusions.) Associated more with imagining than with believing, these same features have led to the assertion that delusions are imaginings mistakenly identified as beliefs (Currie & Ravenscroft 2002; Broome & Bortolotti 2009), or the hybrid concept of “bimagining” (Egan 2009).

Increasingly, explanations of delusions are multi-factorial. Influential early models that grew out of research on single-themed delusions resulting from brain damage, such as Capgras, hypothesized two deficiencies: an initiating aberrant experience or perception due to brain dysfunction, combined with some failure of the system of “belief fixation” by which initial beliefs are critically reviewed in light of other information (Davies et al. 2001; Davies & Davies 2009; Young 2011). The second factor in such “two factor” theories is faulty inference, and is on some accounts distinguished by degree alone from common forms of reasoning error such as attribution bias (Bentall 2004). On “prediction error” models, perceptual aberrations conflict with prior (Bayesian) expectations when accompanied by reasoning bias, giving rise to delusions (Stone & Young 2007; Mishara & Corlett 2009). The “polythematic” and complex delusions more often seen in the psychiatry clinic, that are partially driven by social and environmental factors, present significant challenges for cognitive science, since they involve the higher cognitive systems that apparently resist modular analysis and decomposition.

10. Anti-psychiatry, Feminist Theory, Post- and Critical- Psychiatry, Neurodiversity and Identity Politics

10.1 Anti-psychiatry

“Anti-psychiatry” has come to stand for ideas from mid-twentieth century thinkers such as Thomas Szasz, R.D. Laing, and Michel Foucault. Many of these involved social and political critiques and calls to action, with real-world consequences that have been linked to deinstitutionalization, human rights movements, and a shift towards more autonomy-focused mental health care. In English language theorizing Szasz and Laing rejected the appropriateness of analogizing particular “problems in living” (Szasz) with medical disorders, insisting that misapplication of the medical model to mental health was emblematic of the overreach of the medical establishment. The practices and discourses within society and its institutions making up the era’s episteme are depicted historically by Foucault, the focus on the exercise of psychiatric power that, arising with modern science, is increasingly exerted through mechanisms of protection, surveillance, and control. With modernity, on this account, power is no longer brute force. Instead, it takes a more diffused and subtle form that imperceptibly disciplines and controls not only bodies, but selves (Foucault 1965, Bracken & Thomas 2010, 2013; Rose 2010; Iliopoulos 2012). Foucault’s sweeping ideas remain central to the “post psychiatry” and “critical psychiatry” that have emerged during the beginning of the twenty-first century.

10.2 Feminist Theory

Interwoven with these ideas from the start have been critiques from feminism and feminist theory. These include acknowledgment of the women’s actual, unwarranted, institutionalization, as well as emphasis on harms of disempowerment and silencing (Kristeva 1987 [1989]), and of epistemic injustices (Dotson 2011; Kidd, Spencer & Carel 2022; and see entry on Feminist Social Epistemology). In a legacy affecting mental disorder even today, binary conceptualizations have assigned women and the feminine to illogicality, emotionality, subjectivity, the bodily, and madness, in contrast to men’s more valued traits (G. Lloyd 1984; Potter 2009). Feminist thinkers have focused on the medicalization of women’s normal traits, as well as research neglect and distortion of gender-linked disorders; separate and unequal treatments; the mental health vulnerabilities associated with traditional women’s roles and identities; and diagnosis and treatment understood as tools of patriarchal social control (Russell 1995; Ussher 2011; Gagné-Julien 2021).

Feminism has consistently rejected traditional causal explanations of women’s disorder derived from allegedly natural biological predispositions, pointing instead to the effects of women’s oppressive socialization and to the consequences of devaluing women’s characteristics and abilities (Bluhm 2011). Similarly, it has emphasized the embodiment, and relationality, of the self and avoided the methodological individualism associated with psychiatric medicine (Bluhm, Jacobson, & Maibom 2012). Influenced by social theory and phenomenological approaches, more recent work focuses on the intersection of gender with marginality, invisibility, non-normativity and oppression in lived experience (Nissim-Sabat 2013; Zeiler & Folkmarson Käll 2014).

10.3 Post and Critical Psychiatry

Objections to the modernist presuppositions of psychiatry also take issue with the model by which disorder reflects flawed brain mechanisms or processes, serving to enhance the status of psychiatry and disempower those diagnosed with disorder (Bracken & Thomas 2005, Iliopoulos 2012). The new brain sciences will magnify this disempowerment, it is argued, with the agency and authority previously attributed to persons replaced by a bio-scientific “management of the mind” (Phillips 2009, 2013; Rose and Abi-Rached 2013). A more recent descendant of mid-twentieth century writing is the collection of concerns known as critical psychiatry: critiques of the influence of the pharmacological industry (Phillips 1996, 2013; Moncrieff 2008; Whitaker & Cosgrove 2015; Karp 2017); a discourse around mental disorder that, influenced by hermeneutics, aims to be more sensitive to the meaning of symptoms (Bracken & Thomas 2010); and the promotion of a more equal and collaborative relationship between carers and those they treat (Double 2006; Cohen & Timimi 2008).

Associated with these ideas is growing recognition of the unique expertise of “service users” or “survivors” for understanding mental disorder, and the importance of its inclusion for research (Faulkner & Leyzell 2000; Gergel 2012; Cooper 2017; Bueter 2018). These innovations have been analyzed appealing to critical theory, narrative research methods, the impediments to representational authority, and the co-production of knowledge (Voronka 2016; Russo & Sweeney 2016).

10.4 Neurodiversity

As the most recent among this range of broadly ‘anti psychiatry’ positions, neurodiversity offers a coherent account and has come of age within a cultural episteme that seems hospitable to it. Mental differences, it asserts, are equally natural and valuable, and no one type of functioning is more correct or valid than another. Analogies are drawn with differences of gender, ethnicity and culture, including analogies involving social power inequalities. From its ready application to disorders on the autism spectrum, efforts have been made to apply the neurodiversity position more broadly, including to the symptoms of schizophrenia. (See Chapman 2019, Chapman & Carel 2022.)

10.5 Identity Politics

Claims arising from political movements made up of recipients of psychiatric care call for a seat at the policy-makers’ table; representational authority in the co-production of knowledge based on first person experience of psychiatric symptoms and treatment; attention to complaints of unjust treatment by the “survivors” of diagnosis and care; equality of mental with other disabilities, and or mental with other medical conditions; recognition of neuro-atypicality from proponents of a neurodiversity model of disorder (Ortega 2009; Polvora 2011); and from “mad pride”, the claim that madness is an attribution from which to draw strength and cultural identity. Largely neglected until now within psychiatry or philosophical writing, the claims of mad pride have recently been critically evaluated and related to the social theory of philosophers like Honneth and Taylor (Rashed 2019, 2021).

11. Future Prospects

Where might we expect philosophical work on mental disorder to go from here? One issue must be what role or roles remain for conceptual approaches and commonsense psychology, and for the related tug of war over who decides mental health – modern science, and the merciless dictates of evolutionary biology, or some richer eudaemonic vision? Even granted the authority to determine ideals of mental health, philosophers would encounter hard questions. How to relinquish evaluative thinking in view of liberal traditions around responsibility and self identity? How generously to attribute normalcy and diversity, rather than deficiency, and how to navigate at the boundary of disorder and risk? New ways to understand, verify and ameliorate mental disorders together with big data on their incidence and circumstances, and the challenges introduced by the new hyperconnectedness and biomedicalization of society can only augment and extend such questions, perhaps in directions barely dreamed of.


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Other Internet Resources


Several colleagues offered suggestions about earlier drafts of this entry, for which I am extremely grateful: Edward Harcourt, Lisa Bortolotti, Jeff Poland, Derek Bolton, Somogy Varga, Kelso Cratsley, John Sadler, George Graham, Alexandra Pârvan, Şerife Tekin, and Christian Perring. My special thanks for invaluable comprehensive critique are owed to Ginger Hoffman and two anonymous readers assigned by the Encyclopedia.

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