Notes to Mereology

1. The term was coined in 1927 by Leśniewski (see below), probably as a variant of the term ‘merology’ originally used to indicate the field of anatomy concerned with body fluids and elementary tissues; see Simons (1997: n. 4). In some literature, ‘mereology’ is also used with reference to work in General Systems Theory (not covered by this entry) devoted to the study of system decomposition, as in Mesarović et al. (1970). See also Winther (2011).

2. For detailed treatments of Husserl's formal theory of parts and wholes, see Sokolowski (1968), Smith and Mulligan (1982), Simons (1982), Null (1983), Blecksmith and Null (1991), Fine (1995b), and Casari (2000, 2007). On Brentano's theory, see Baumgartner and Simons (1993) and Baumgartner (2013).

3. A detailed exposition of Leśniewski's mereology may be found in Simons (1987: 64–81). For comprehensive surveys, see also Luschei (1965), Clay (1981), Miéville (1984), Gessler (2005), and Urbaniak (2013: ch. 5), as well as the entry on Leśniewski. A simplified version of Leśniewski's mereology was presented in Tarski (1937).

4. An early version of the Calculus was developed in ch. 4 of Leonard's (1930) dissertation (written under Whitehead's supervision) and was presented under the same title by Leonard and Goodman at the 1936 meeting of the Association for Symbolic Logic in Cambridge, MA. For a comprehensive account, see Eberle (1970) and Breitkopf (1978). For an historical reconstruction, see Cohnitz and Rossberg (2006: ch. 4) and Rossberg (2009). On Whitehead's precursory work, see Simons (1991b).

5. Actually, the original Calculus of Individuals had variables for classes; a class-free, purely nominalistic version of the system appeared later in Goodman (1951). On the link between mereology and nominalism, see Eberle 1970. For a recent characterization, see Meyers (2014).

6. In the literature, the parthood relation is often represented by non-alphabetic symbols supporting infix notation, such as ‘≤’ or ‘<’ (the notation used in Leonard and Goodman 1940 and favored by Simons 1987) and the like. The same applies to the non-primitive mereological relations defined in the remainder of this entry. For instance, proper parthood is sometimes symbolized as ‘≪’ (but also, again, as ‘<’), overlap as ‘○’, disjointness as ‘⥍’, ‘≀’, ‘†’, ‘|’, or ‘)(’, etc. This has resulted in a plethora of different notations that is both overwhelming and confusing, as no canonical choice has been settled upon. Here we stick to the safer practice of sacrificing all infix notation in favor of ordinary, mnemonic upper-case letters (single or compound), with the only exception of the identity predicate.

7. This choice of logic is not without consequences. Particularly when it comes to the mereological operators of sum, product, etc. defined in Sections 4.2–4.4, a free logic would arguably provide a more adequate background (see Eberle 1970, Simons 1991), as would a logic equipped with the apparatus of plural quantification (Lewis 1991). However, here we shall go along with the simplifications afforded by the assumption of a classic logical background (with descriptive terms treated à la Russell).

8. The labels follow Varzi (1996) and Casati and Varzi (1999, ch. 3).

9. That this is just a matter of “choosing a suitable primitive” is confirmed by the fact that in 1920 Leśniewski himself provided an alternative axiomatization of Mereology based on ‘P’ (see 1927–1931, ch. VII). It should be noted, however, that throughout his writings Leśniewski used ‘part’ (część) in the sense in which we are using ‘proper part’ (PP). His word for our use of ‘part’ (P) was ‘ingredient’ (ingredyens), apparently following a suggestion by Lucjan Zarzecki. See Leśniewski (1916, §2).

10. The version of the Calculus of Individuals presented in Leonard’s (1930) dissertation used yet another primitive, corresponding to the sum operator defined in (40i) below (with i=3). The idea of using ‘D’ as a primitive may also be found in Leśniewski, who provided an axiomatization of Mereology based on this predicate—in his terminology: ‘exterior’ (zewnętrzny)—already in 1921; see (1927–1931, ch. X).

11. Up to the Winter 2012 edition. References to this entry in the literature may be affected by the current revision.

12. Thanks to Paolo Maffezioli for helpful comments on this point.

13. In the literature, (P.4) is sometimes called ‘Weak Supplementation’, in contrast to the Strong Supplementation principle (P.5) discussed in Section 3.2. This is also Simons's terminology. (To be precise, Simons's formulation of (P.4) uses ‘PP’ also in the consequent, as in (P.4′) below, but in a standard setting the difference is immaterial owing to the reflexivity and transitivity of P.)

14. Strictly speaking, one may draw a distinction between the matter of which an object is made (feline tissue, clay) and the specific portion or lump of matter that actually constitutes the object; see Chappel (1973), Laycock (1975), Grandy (1975), Burge (1977), and H. Cartwright (1979) for some classic works on the distinction and the entry on the Metaphysics of Mass Expressions for a comprehensive survey. We shall ignore the details here, but see Zimmerman (1995), Koslicki (1999), Barnett (2004), Kleinschmidt (2007), Donnelly and Bittner (2008), Laycock (2011), and Tanksley (2010) for some recent discussion relevant to the cases at issue.

15. (P.6) is sometimes called the ‘Remainder Principle’. See e.g. Simons (1987: 88).

16. On this point, I am thankful to Anthony Shiver and Aaron Cotnoir for helpful discussion.

17. In Whitehead (1920: 76) the axiom is initially assumed to hold only for finite events, but the restriction is dropped in “reading over the proofs” (pp. 197–198).

18. Both terms go back to Leśniewski and are used interchangeably in most current literature. Some authors, however, use ‘sum’ specifically for the notion corresponding to (392) (or its infinitary extension (522) discussed below) and ‘fusion’ for the notion corresponding to (393) (or (523)). See e.g. Gruszczyński and Pietruszczak (2010) and Gruszczyński (2013).

19. Given Reflexivity and Transitivity, the definiens in (391) is equivalent to

   Pxz ∧ Pyz ∧ ∀w((Pxw ∧ Pyw) → Pzw).

This is how the notion of a sum1 is sometimes defined in the literature, for ease of comparison with sum2. For definitions that do not presuppose Transitivity, see Pietruszczak (2014).

20. If the condition is not satisfied, the sum may not exist, in which case the standard treatment of descriptive terms that we are assuming implies that the corresponding instances of the principles that follow are false. Strictly speaking, (41)–(47) should therefore be in conditional form. For instance, (41) should read

   ξxxx = x +i x.

On this understanding, we use the non-conditional form for perspicuity. Ditto for (50)–(51) below.

21. Again, given Reflexivity and Transitivity, the definiens in (521) is equivalent to

   ∀ww → Pwz) ∧ ∀v(∀ww → Pwv) → Pzv).

22. Actually, Tarski's result refers to a stronger version of GEM in which infinitary sums are characterized using explicit quantification over sets, rather than schematic formulas. This is of course a relevant difference, in view of Cantor's (1891) theorem. For set-free formulations which, like those considered here, strictly adhere to a standard first-order language with a denumerable supply of open formulas, the correct way of summarizing the algebraic strength of GEM is this: Any model of this theory is isomorphic to a Boolean subalgebra of a complete Boolean algebra with the zero element removed—a subalgebra that is not necessarily complete if Zermelo-Frankel set theory with Choice is consistent. See Pontow and Schubert (2006), Theorem 34, for details and proof.

23. Actually, the axioms appear in the 1956 English translation but not the French 1929 original. For details, see Betti (2013).

24. June 2003 edition. The inaccuracy was corrected in the Spring 2009 edition.

25. Some authors use ‘universalism’ for the narrower thesis that every collection of distinct material objects compose a further material object (see e.g. Effingham 2011b). In the general sense represented by (P.15), universalism is also known as ‘conjunctivism’ (Van Cleve 1986, Chisholm 1987), ‘collectivism’ (Hoffman and Rosenkrantz 1999), or ‘maximalism’ (Simons 2006); other authors speak more generally of ‘unrestricted composition’ (Lewis 1986), or the ‘general fusion principle’ (Casati and Varzi 1999), or simply the ‘fusion principle’ (Heller 1990). In the presence of U, the principle is also closely related to the ‘doctrine of arbitrary undetached parts’ attacked by van Inwagen (1981), though, again, the latter doctrine is limited to the material content of occupiable regions of space.

26. Of course, which mereological principles should hold remains controversial, and may depend on the specific de dicto account one endorses. See e.g. Donnelly (2014: 56ff) on the status of the Unrestricted Sum2 principle.

27. Strictly speaking, Parsons relies on the notion of a sum1, hence unrestricted minimal upper bounds, but the argument applies also under the other construals of that notion examined in Section 4.2.

28. Strictly speaking, Smith works with a notion of (concrete) part that involves a double world-time index, but for the simple principles under discussion here both indices can be omitted as irrelevant.

Copyright © 2016 by
Achille Varzi <>

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