The Metaphysics of Mass Expressions

First published Thu Nov 8, 2012; substantive revision Fri Jul 22, 2022

A man might lose an appendix and some blood in surgery, but it seems wrong to say that there is a thing he lost in addition to the appendix. After a child destroys her sandcastle, there is one less thing in the world, but no less sand. One can count cakes, but not cake. Split a large portion of water in half and you will be left with what you started with—water. Split a computer monitor in half and you will not be left with a monitor or monitors.

These examples point to a ubiquitous but elusive conceptual distinction between stuff and things. Paradigmatic examples of stuffs are wood, water, hydrogen, and iron. Less paradigmatic stuffs include beer, salsa, and butter. The most general physical stuff-kind is matter. The concept of stuff is even more general than matter. Concepts such as ectoplasm, justification, or phlogiston may refer to spiritual or abstract stuff. ‘Things’ or ‘objects’ refer, most paradigmatically, to medium-sized entities such as tables and cables, pears and bears, and rocks and socks.

Philosophical explorations of the distinction have generated a number of interesting questions in philosophy of language and metaphysics. The linguistic distinction between what are called mass expressions (e.g., ‘lead’, ‘the water in the tub’) and count expressions (e.g., ‘two horses,’ ‘the horse in the barn’) is believed to be important in examining the metaphysical stuff/thing distinction. In this entry we will be more concerned with nominal mass expressions (e.g., ‘the water in the tub’, ‘the gold in his teeth’), as opposed to predicative mass expressions (e.g., ‘the statue is lead’). While there are many issues in this area, we will be focused on the following kind of questions: Are things illusory, the world consisting, most fundamentally, of stuff alone? Or is stuff just a certain kind of thing or things? Is all apparent talk about physical kinds of stuff really veiled talk about individual concrete portions of matter, or is matter per se an irreducible part of the furniture of the world?

The present essay articulates the foregoing questions, and surveys various answers to them.

In Section 1 we will explore the metaphysical distinction between stuff and things, and examine the linguistic data used to make the mass-noun/count-noun distinction, and show how it has been used to motivate the metaphysical distinction. In Sections 2 and 3, we will survey different answers to our main target question: “what do nominal mass expressions refer to?” Lastly, after examining the linguistic data and the metaphysical theories, in Section 4 we will examine whether the metaphysical stuff/thing distinction is well-motivated by the linguistic mass/count distinction, and whether the latter is up to the tasks assigned to it by metaphysicians.

1. Introduction

1.1 ‘Thing Theory’

The relatively orthodox reactions to ‘stuff’ (or ‘matter’) as opposed to ‘things’ in contemporary analytic metaphysics is to either ignore stuff, reduce stuff to things, or eliminate stuff from one’s ontology. These reactions are required by the previous embrace of what we could call ‘Thing Theory.’ Thing Theory, very roughly, is the view that (excluding properties and relations)[1], all concrete existents are either things fundamentally, or reducible to fundamental things.

Peter Strawson, in his influential Individuals claims “Anything whatever can be introduced into discussion by means of a singular, definitely identifying substantival expression … anything whatever can be identifyingly referred to … Anything whatever can appear as a logical subject, an “individual.’”[2]

In Quine’s influential Word and Object he speaks about “limning the true and ultimate structure of reality,” (1960, 221) and according to him, for an object to exist is for it to be necessarily quantified over in an idealized and regimented logical language used to truly and comprehensively describe the world. And he claims that the values of the variables of such a theory will only range over sets and physical objects, so “as far as he is concerned … only physical objects and sets really exist,” and, it must be noted, both objects and sets, even if the latter are abstract, are all regarded as ‘things’ or ‘objects’[3]

And, from a recent abstract of a book chapter, we have the terse “the world is a world of objects” (Heil 2003, Ch. 15). This family of views goes back to Aristotle’s Metaphysics Zeta and the Categories. (See the section on substance, matter, and subject in the entry on Aristotle’s metaphysics for details.)

But if the world is a world of things, what are they in general? What things, individuals, or objects are is itself a controversial and murky matter, and goes beyond the purview of this article (for more, see these related entries: object, ordinary objects, sortals, substance). Related terms in philosophy for ‘thing’ are substance,[4] primary substance, particular, concrete particular, existent, being, entity, substratum, term, and so on. For the purposes of this entry, we will take a rather minimalistic view of thinghood. We will regard a thing or object as whatever satisfies this definition:

(Thinghood) x is a thing or object if and only if:
  1. x falls under some F, and F is singular. [Furthermore, the plural “the Fs” is well-formed and does not refer to kinds (e.g., in ‘the wines of France’).]
  2. x can be unqualifiedly counted as one. [i.e., x can take ‘one’ as an unqualified numerical determiner, without recourse to measurement, ‘packaging’, or partitive phrases (e.g., ‘one dog’, versus ‘one gallon of water’ or ‘one water molecule’).] (See Laycock 2006, chapter 2)
  3. x is concrete (i.e., x is not a universal, property, relation, or abstract entity).

And now, using the notion of Thinghood, a minimalist Thing Theory can be captured as follows:

Whatever exists is a thing, or is reducible to a thing or things.

Thing theorists hold that whatever exists is unqualifiedly countable as one, or reducible to such things. For the Thing Theorist “to be is to be countable.” Some Stuff Ontologists would counter—“to be is to be either countable or measurable” (a gloss on Burge 1975, p. 459).

All three Thing-Theoretic views in section 2 maintain that, fundamentally, it all boils down to things. ‘Matter’ always refers to parcels (or ‘sums’) of matter, and parcels are always particular things, which can even be counted in principle. (If there are n simple and discrete fundamental things across all of space-time, then there are at most (2n − 1) things total in the cosmos). Masses-as-sets can always be held to be sets of things, and plural reference can always be held to be reference to a number of things.

We can view ‘Stuff Ontologies’ as views which, in some sense, depart from this picture and ‘take stuff seriously.’ That is, a Stuff Ontology is any view which departs from Thing Theory in important respects so as to allow non-thing-like stuff to be part of the fundamental furniture of the world, whereas Thing Theorists believe that stuff-talk modeled on mass term use has no proper place in the fundamental correct description of the world.

Stuff Ontologists can either (i) eliminate things, (ii) accept that there are things, but hold that they are merely derivative entities which are parasitic on the fundamental stuff of the world, or (iii) hold that both stuff and things are fundamental, and are inter-irreducible.[5]

1.2 Stuff, Things, Fundamentality and Reduction

These debates are motivated by not just the linguistic data covered below, but by conflicting intuitions about the relation between objects and their constituting matter. (See the entry on material constitution for more details.) Many make a strong case for an ontological distinction between stuff (or matter) and things. Here are some typical reasons given to believe in the distinction:

  1. Some stuff often has a different history than an object which it constitutes. Invariably, the water that makes up a snowball pre-dates the snowball.
  2. The persistence of an object (e.g., a desk) is sensitive to the contiguity of its parts. Some stuff (e.g., the wood), however, can survive many instances of spatial scatter.
  3. Stuffs are cumulative, objects are not (Burge 1977, p. 104). For instance, any two portions of water, considered together, make up a portion of water that contains the first two portions as parts. But objects are not like this, e.g., two cars or cats do not make up a car or cat.
  4. Stuffs are dissective, objects are not (Burge 1977, p. 106) Divide up a (macroscopic) portion of water in half and you will be left with water. Divide a flower in half, and you won’t be left with flowers.[6]
  5. Extended simple objects with no parts are possible. While there are no objects or things making up such objects, there is nevertheless stuff composing it. The parts do not pre-date the division of an extended simple, whereas the stuff does (Markosian 1998a; Scala 2002).

But, if stuff and things are distinct, they must be intimately related. It is tempting to philosophers to try to reduce or eliminate one of the categories and hold that only one category is fundamental (or ‘ontologically basic,’ i.e., it must be mentioned in any true, comprehensive, and non-redundant description of the world).

Reflection can lead us to believe that a familiar object, such as a tree, is nothing more than some stuff in a certain arrangement. This stuff could have been in a different arrangement, possibly constituting two smaller trees, or perhaps nothing at all. This raises the possibility that stuff is more fundamental than things.

But, when we look closely at stuff, or listen to scientists, we see that it is likely particulate, and, if particles are objects, then it appears that stuff is actually not fundamental after all—objects are. Prima facie these positions cannot both be true, and our conflicting intuitions call for an explanation as to the relation between stuff and things.

What are we talking about when we talk about stuff? We will first look at the three main answers given in section 2. The first answer, by far the most popular (and consequently receiving the most attention), is that stuff-talk is talk about masses of particles or molecules. The second is that stuff-talk is talk about sets, and, lastly, that it is talk about many things (or ‘pluralities’). The views in section 2, in one way or another, hold that stuff is very thing-like or reducible to things.

In section 3 we will examine more radical views which say that the moral to draw from reflection upon concrete mass expressions, among other things, is that the world consists of stuff, not things; or stuff in addition to things, where the former is not thing-like.

1.3 Mass and Count Nouns; Mass and Count Expressions

The most common entry-point for thinking that there may be a metaphysical difference between stuff and things is by noting that while common things, such as dogs and rocks, can be unqualifiedly counted, there are also stuffs, such as water and air, which cannot be unqualifiedly counted. But the entry point can be even more rudimentary, possibly pre-linguistic. As Burge (1975, 199) notes, “from early childhood we learn to distinguish compact, enduring things from the stuffs of which they are consituted. We count the former and measure the latter. We treat things as stable points of reference … stuffs we think of as amorphous and protean.” Philosophers and linguists have often latched onto this distinction by noting the difference between what are called ‘mass terms/nouns’ and ‘count terms/nouns.’ Burge goes on, “Mass terms are typically used to measure the masses—count nouns, to number the multitudes” (1975, 199).

But what distinguishes mass from count nouns? In order to answer this, it will be helpful if some preliminary conventions and issues are explained or noted, even if only to sidestep them in order to make the focus of this entry clear.

While this entry is about mass and count expressions, the literature has typically focused instead on what are called mass and count nouns. Mass nouns include nitrogen, porridge, trash, china, traffic, data, shade, music, pain, and furniture. Count nouns include horse, futon, army, codicil, proposition, and galaxy. It should be noted from the outset that the relation between the mass/count distinction and the stuff/thing distinction across all metaphysical categories is not straightforward, as there are so many different kinds of entities (e.g., events, concreta, sets, processes, absences, conventional entities, etc.) referred to by both mass and count expressions.

There is debate about whether nouns as such are count or mass, as opposed to expressions.[7] Mass expression is a broader class than mass noun, since the former includes instances of the latter, as well as phrases such as ‘the water in the tub’, ‘the gold in France,’ and ‘the grape juice Roderick drank.’ In comparison, ‘Robert’s car’, ‘John’s student,’ and ‘a NATO signatory’ are count expressions. But, while there is debate about whether nouns are count or mass, no one denies that expressions can be count or mass (a single word representing the limiting case). This is one reason our emphasis is on ‘expressions.’

There is a further preliminary issue, orthogonal to our discussion, about whether expression-types or expression-instances are what are primarily mass or count. Many hold that mass expressions are ambiguous between mass or count senses depending upon context (e.g., ‘Mary had a little lamb’ could mean she owned one, or ate some (Quine 1960, p. 91)). This question, and the former, can be side-stepped by stipulating, in what follows, that the phrases ‘mass nouns,’ ‘mass terms,’ and ‘mass expressions’ will mean “noun/term/expression occurrences employed with a mass sense.”[8]

Following common usage (cf Pelletier & Schubert 1989), we will occasionally label linguistic items with mass features by ‘+MASS’, and those without by ‘-MASS’, and those with count features by ‘+COUNT’ and without by ‘-COUNT.’ As will become clear, an expression’s being mass or count are not always mutually exclusive, and neither is the distinction exhaustive. There are indeed cases of +MASS/+COUNT (e.g. ‘hair’, ‘fish’), or -MASS/-COUNT (e.g. ‘fireworks’)). This ends the preliminaries.

The following are commonly employed syntactic and lexical distinctions between mass and count nouns. Mass and count nouns act differently in relation to quantifiers and non-logical determiners. Count nouns, but not mass nouns (when not used in the kind sense), can be prefaced by ‘each’, ‘every’, ‘few’, ‘fewer’, ‘many’, and ‘a’. Mass nouns, but not count nouns, can be prefaced by ‘much’, ‘little’, ‘a lot of’, ‘less’, ‘more’, ‘a quantity of’, and so on. Both mass and count nouns take ‘most’, ‘all’, ‘some’, ‘no’, ‘none of the’, ‘any’, ‘hardly any’, and ‘a little’.

Only count nouns can be prefaced unqualifiedly by numerals or the indefinite article, and be pluralized without a category shift. When we switch from speaking of ‘a horse’ to ‘five horses’ we have not switched from speaking of things to speaking of kinds of things. However, when we switch from speaking of ‘wine’ to ‘a wine’ or ‘seven wines’, we usually switch from speaking about wine (+MASS/-COUNT) to either portions of it (-MASS/+COUNT), or to kinds of wine (-MASS/+COUNT) (Pelletier 1974). (Compare ‘The wine is over there’ to ‘Gallo sells seven wines.’) While we do say things like “We’ll have six beers,” or “I need five milks for the children,” these are understood, depending on context, as shorthand for ‘six bottles/kegs of beer,’ or ‘six cartons/pints of milk’ (Higginbotham 1995, Pelletier 1979 pp. 2–4, 2012). If you pour some wine on the floor you cannot, if grammar is your guide, count the number of ‘wines’ (+MASS/-COUNT) (in the non-kind sense) on the floor. There are no things (or at least no commonsense things, by which we individuate and track persistence) which are wines, such that there are a number of them on the floor. Even if there were, say, seven pools (or droplets, puddles, etc.) on the floor, we think the same wine remains on the floor even if the pools cease to be, e.g. if they are merged or further divided.

While mass nouns do not admit the indefinite article, they admit a use of ‘some’ which acts like an indefinite article (Cartwright 1965). We can say, for example, “Adam drank some water which is worse than Onondaga Lake water,” or, “Heraclitus bathed in some water yesterday and bathed in it again today.” (Note the anaphoric use of ‘it’ in the last sentence, and how it does not necessarily imply its referent is a particular thing).

Both count and mass nouns admit the definite article. There are sentence forms with a mass noun prefaced by the definite article, such as “Socrates drank the hemlock in that cup,” “Bob just wrote your name in the snow over there.” These sentences, if true, will be cases of definite reference of mass expressions, in that they pick out an actual concrete referent. Both mass and count nouns admit definite reference. But, it is controversial whether definite reference to stuff is singular reference.

For our purposes, it is useful to lay down a limited taxonomy of mass nouns, not based on their linguistic, logical, or semantic features, but based upon prima facie salient metaphysical criteria.[9] Compare the following lists:

  1. Concrete Quasi-Mass Nouns: furniture, silverware, china, trash, clothes
  2. Concrete Mass Nouns: water, iron, lead, porridge, flesh
  3. Abstract Mass Nouns: information, data, wisdom
  4. Psychological Mass Nouns: pain, admiration
  5. Quantitative Mass Nouns: speed, weight, work, mass

(a) are definitely mass by the grammatical criteria discussed above, and they refer to concrete entities. But, it is hard to see what import they would have for supporting a metaphysics of stuff.[10] These words are devices for speaking about distinct, discrete objects in a collective manner. In certain contexts, we seek to draw attention to a bunch of distinct individuals, not as such, but, for pragmatic reasons, as an undifferentiated mass or plurality of a certain kind.

Few have been led by the use of the words furniture or silverware to conclude that there is a category of stuff or matter which is distinct from things, nor have many others denied that there is such a strong distinction based on the interchangeability of phrases like ‘get your stuff off my desk!’ with ‘get your things off my desk!’ But, as we will discuss, the apparent metaphysical triviality of category (a) could very well undermine the contention that concrete mass nouns do in fact have metaphysical import, since there is little or no grammatical difference between terms in category (a) or (b).[11] This is discussed more in Section 4 and in Supplement: Non-Atomicity and its Relevance to the Mass/Count Distinction.

’Concrete Mass Nouns’ refer to the kinds of entities discussed most often in the linguistically-informed metaphysics literature. They have also been called ‘physical stuff-kind terms’ (Zimmerman 1995).

Abstract mass nouns, if they do refer, do not, prima facie, refer to physical stuffs or hunks of stuff. And the possibility of propositional or ‘abstract stuff’ strikes many, if it strikes them at all, as dubious—but it is not clear what is problematic about it. (Some work on abstract mass nouns can be found in Goddard & Wierzbicka 2014; Husić 2020; Hinterwimmer 2020; Moltmann 2013, esp. 1.6; Nicolas 2002, 2003, and 2010; and Zamparelli 2020. See Treanor 2013, esp. p10, for an applied discussion which relates, and see Koslicki 1999, 68–9 for a rejection of the parallel between some abstract mass nouns and concrete mass nouns). More on abstract mass nouns can be found in this section of the entry on the Logic of Mass Expressions.

Addressing issues surrounding abstract, psychological, and quantitative mass nouns and their referents is beyond the scope of this article.[12] Due to the almost exclusive emphasis on concrete and quasi-concrete mass nouns in the metaphysics literature, this article will follow suit. While an analysis of concrete and quasi-concrete mass expressions could possibly be carried over to generate a general metaphysical theory of masses, the prospects for this are dim. This is because, even given the grammatical similarities between all mass expressions, there are far too many differences between concrete stuff and the entities in categories (c)–(e).[13]

In what follows, both concrete and quasi-concrete mass expressions will be referred to as ‘concrete mass expressions,’ except when the distinction is needed. Also, due to our focus, ‘mass expressions’ henceforth refers only to concrete mass expressions, except where indicated.

1.4 Some Terminology

Mereologies are formal systems, but we will be ignoring technicalities in this entry as far as possible (for details, see the entry Mereology). Still, some terminology is necessary and useful, since we will be discussing theories which employ mereological notions. Let us take the notion of part as primitive. A ‘simple’ is a non-composite entity, i.e., something with no parts.[14]

A composite thing has more than one part. The verb fuse refers to an asymmetric relation between a whole and its parts. If two things fuse they ‘join together’ to make up a whole. For example, if the water in my glass and the water in your glass fuse, then there exists a thing, a fusion, which is made up of the two portions (sometimes it is said that the two portions ‘have a fusion’). No literal contact or fusion (e.g., welding two rods together) is implied by this usage. If a fleet is a single thing, then it is arguably a fusion of the boats making it up. The nouns whole and sum are synonymous with fusion and composite. Overlap occurs when distinct things share one or more parts.

It is also necessary to make the following distinctions, which are not standard to the literature, but are useful for our purposes. Any concrete +MASS or +COUNT kind noun K (e.g., ‘gold’, ‘lobster,’) will fall into one or more of the following categories:

  • K is an atomic kind iff if something is some K, then it is a K-atom, or it is identical with a fusion of K-atoms. And, something is a K-atom iff it has no parts which are K.
  • K is a non-atomic kind iff any K has (proper) parts which are K.
  • K is a fuzzy atomless kind iff any K has parts of which it is indeterminate whether they are K (i.e., there is no fact of the matter as to what counts as a smallest unit of K).
  • K is a heterogeneous kind iff any K has some parts which are K1Kn, where ‘K’, ‘K1’…Kn’ all refer to distinct kinds.

Electrons are atomic, since they have no parts which are electrons. Also, if ships have no parts which are ships, then ‘ship’ is an atomic kind term as well (Zimmerman 1995, p. 75; Sider 2001). Portions of non-atomic gunk or infinitely divisible matter of a kind K are K through-and-through, as would an infinitely descending chain of ‘box-particles’, each of which contains a box-particle (Gardner 1983, p. 26). Fruit cake is arguably a fuzzy atomless substance, since it can have parts (e.g., half a blueberry with some gluten attached) that are not determinately fruit cake. (cf. Landman 2011 on ‘mess mass nouns’). Some mass terms, e.g., ‘cutlery’ and ‘gold’ are heterogeneous. While a fork is some cutlery, a tine is not, and, presumably, an electron in a gold atom is not gold. Not all the categories are mutually exclusive, and the list is not intended to be exhaustive for all kind-terms.

2. Stuff as a Special Kind of Thing or Things

A natural thought to have about sentences with referring nominal concrete mass expressions (e.g., “Alvin drank the water that Roderick poured” or “The coffee in that cup is too hot”) is that the expressions refer to portions of matter, which are themselves made up of smaller bits of matter. It seems obvious that thinking this is what taking such sentences at face value amounts to. Not obvious, though, is what metaphysical commitments this requires, and what metaphysical problems might come along with this thought.

A general consensus has been reached that it is helpful to think through these issues about matter within the framework of mereology, or the logic of parts and wholes, even though there is much disagreement about what the correct mereology is.

2.1 Concrete Mass Expressions Refer to Mereological Sums

In the various sum-theoretical analyses of mass expressions (Cartwright 1965, 1979b; Burge 1977; Moravcsik 1973), all mass expressions with their non-count features disappear upon analysis and are replaced by talk of sums.

These accounts can get quite technical, but the basic idea is relatively easy to understand. Since, on these accounts, concrete mass expressions refer to mereological sums, a sentence such as “Snow is white” is understood to mean that there is a sum of all the snow (flakes, bits, balls, etc.), and that this sum is part of the fusion of all the white things (Quine 1960, ch. 20). A sentence such as “The water is in the tub” gets cashed out to mean that there is a fusion of water molecules which is in the tub. While there are many permutations on this strategy, sum theorists will, whenever possible, paraphrase away talk of stuffs and talk instead of sums, where sums satisfy the constraints of Thinghood and do not contradict Thing Theory (TT) as outlined in 1.1.

There are many possible positions for those who wish to analyze mass expressions in terms of sums. What follows is a short survey of some of the most salient decision points one must confront in constructing a detailed view of this kind, and what problems emerge from deciding one way or another.

2.1.1 Which Sums of Stuff Are There?

In the literature on material objects, an oft-discussed question is: when do two or more things compose a further thing (van Inwagen 1990)? Some common answers are—never (Compositional Nihilism—Unger 1979, Dorr and Rosen 2002); always (Mereological Universalism—Lewis 1986, pp. 212–213; Rea 1998); only when they form a life (Organicism—van Inwagen 1990; Merricks 2001); whenever the candidate fusion has non-redundant causal powers (Merricks 2001); whenever (and only whenever) we intuitively think they do (Intuitivism—Commonsense); or that composition is a brute fact (Brutalism—Markosian 1998b). And the answers have proliferated.[15]

The most commonly held view is Mereological Universalism, or ‘Unrestricted Mereology’ (‘UM’ for short). Two or more things always have a fusion. For example, the Empire State Building and the Dalai Lama compose an object.

The debates about composition largely focus on the fusion of objects—but what of matter? A strong case can be made for what we could call the Unrestricted Fusion of Matter principle:

If there is some matter and some distinct matter, then there is a sum of all of it. (cf. Markosian 2004, p. 410)

There are several ways to argue for this. Here’s one:

  1. For any two masses of stuff K, they compose a further mass of K. (Summativity)
  2. Matter is the most general material stuff kind. (Generality)
  3. So, any two or more masses of matter whatsoever compose a mass of matter. (cf. Zimmerman 1995, section 5, Tanksley 2010)

Summativity is a plausible principle. We believe that we refer when we say things like ‘the water in your bottle’. Now, if you keep half of the water in your bottle, and pour half in Larry’s empty bottle, and Larry drives off with his bottle, does the water still exist? Supposing that none of the water is destroyed, the answer seems to be clearly ‘yes’.[16]

Now, if this is so, and some water can exist while being spread out, why suppose that that very same water came into existence only when poured into your cup (from, say, two bottles)? It seems like it could come into existence when joined only if it went out of existence when scattered. But it didn’t go out of existence when scattered—so it couldn’t have come into existence when joined. So, there always was this water fusion (at least as long as all the sub-portions of water existed). We can repeat the same argument for the copper in two distinct statues. There will also be the sum of the gold in Sweden and the lead in Tanzania, if we can replace the K in Summativity with ‘metal’.

And it also seems true that matter is a genuine kind term, and the most general one there is for concrete stuffs. If it wasn’t, it is hard to see how scientists could speak, as they do, about universal properties of matter, or what kinds of matter there are, or how philosophers could contrast matter with allegedly non-physical minds, abstract objects, and so forth.

So, it seems that any two portions of matter whatsoever have a fusion. Accepting this result leads to acceptance of ‘Mere Sums,’ i.e.,

  • ‘Mere Sum’: A composite object whose only existence condition is the existence of its (fundamental) parts, and only persistence condition is the persistence of all of the same ultimate parts. A mere sum’s parts need not be cohesive, spatially close, or exhibit any kind of functional unity, and the sum need not be solid, macroscopic, or fall under any commonsense or scientific kind term. Even if it does have these features, they are inessential to its existence.[17]

It has proven extremely tempting to identify matter with Mere Sums (and their ultimate parts) in the mereologist’s sense, which unrestricted mereology holds of, for the reasons just outlined.[18]

Of course, if sums are object-like, and one has reason to believe that the only objects are ones with structured essences, then one would have reason to reject Summativity and UFM which lead to the posit of unstructured Mere Sums. (Generality seems harder to reject). Arguments against these principles can be found in sections 2.3 and 3.1. (See also Laycock 1972, pp. 4–5; 2006a, Appendix III).

2.1.2 Can Sums Change Their Parts?

Another crucial decision point in developing a sum theory of the referents of mass expressions is deciding whether the elements in the sum (e.g., the H2O molecules in some water, the gold atoms in some gold) are essential to the sum. The case of the most general kind, masses of matter, is a particularly important instance of this question.

It seems intuitively obvious that when one takes a sip of water, or adds a bit of water to a glass of water, that one does not have in the glass precisely the same water both before and after. Even if the same amount of water from a different batch replaces the water which was taken away, we still would not have the same exact water before us after the replacement. And, if we perform electrolysis on a batch of water but preserve any matter from being lost we can rightly say we have all the same matter as we did before, just not the same water, since there is none. We can construct similar examples for any type of matter. What can explain and unify these obvious intuitions is that there is a most general category of entity—masses of matter, where all the fundamental parts of any mass are essential to it. Such masses of matter cannot change parts whatsoever.

The existence of entities like this could easily explain why there is not precisely the same water through these changes. An unqualified view of this kind would be that nothing whatsoever can change parts—this is called ‘Mereological Essentialism.’ More restricted views hold that at the very least masses of matter cannot change parts. Mereological essentialism has been an extremely popular approach throughout history. (Abelard, Reid, Bishop Butler, Locke, Hume, and Leibniz were all mereological essentialists of some kind.)

There is much to say in favor of the following principle of Mereological Essentialism for Masses (of matter) in general (for early discussion of Mereological Essentialism under that name, see Chisholm 1973, 1975; Plantinga 1975):

For any mass of matter M and any mass of matter x, if x is ever a part of M, M will exist only when x exists and is a part of M.

We can argue for a principle like this by first stating that masses of matter at a time are individuated by having the same parts, and then arguing that no mass can change parts over time.

Our more restricted ‘Mereological Essentialism for Masses’ (MEM) seems prima facie consistent with allowing ordinary objects to change parts. MEM seems less controversial than ‘Mereological Essentialism for Objects’ (MEO). MEM seems like something of a truism, and perhaps part of the nature of the category of matter. But let us turn to an argument for MEM on the assumption that there are Mere Sums.

At a time, it is easy to distinguish and identify masses, which in this context are considered Mere Sums. Assume a toy model of a world with only 20 simples, each given a unique number from 1–20 as a name. By UFM, 1–4 will fuse at \(t_1.\) Let us call that sum ‘Quadri.’ Quadri will be distinct from any sums with distinct parts, since no sum can have different parts from itself at a time. Will Quadri be identical with anything ‘else’ composed of the same fundamental parts? Suppose 1 is an electron, and 2–4 are quarks. Suppose 1–4 compose a hydrogen atom at \(t_1.\) Call the atom ‘Hydro’. By the definition of Mere Sums, Quadri’s parts’ proximity to each other is irrelevant to its persisting, but not so for Hydro, which, if it loses its electron, will cease to exist as hydrogen. (The lone proton is a cation of the hydron variety). So Hydro cannot be a Mere Sum. The same will go for any putative object composed of 1–4 which do not have the same persistence conditions as Quadri. And so any fusion resulting in a Mere Sum of 1–4 is Quadri; and 1–4 compose no other Mere Sums than Quadri. And so something is Quadri at \(t_1\) if and only if it has all and only 1–4 as parts at that time. And so all those parts are essential to it at that time.[19]

One can make a further case that sums’ parts are essential to them over time. Suppose that simples 1–9 exist at \(t_1.\) Assuming UFM, then 1–9 fuse to give us the sum \(S\). At \(t_1,\) also by UFM, there is the fusion of 1–8, which we can call S−. Since S− and S have different parts, by Leibniz’s Law, they are distinct. If a sum could lose a part and persist, then it could be possible for the fusion S to come to be made up of different parts. Suppose that only part 9 is destroyed. If MEM is false, then S could come to be composed of exactly what S− is. So, if MEM is false, either (i) S became S−, (ii) S− went out of existence, or (iii) S and S− coincide as distinct sums. But, (i) cannot be true: two things cannot become one (although this has been challenged, see Gallois 1998); (ii) cannot be true—how can a mere mass of matter go out of existence without undergoing any intrinsic change? (for challenges to this see Burke 1994, Markosian 1998a and 2004); (iii) violates a very clear intuition—if you have some stuff, and take some of it away, then you do not have the very same stuff (cf. Jubien 1993 pp. 18–19). So (iii) is false. But then all of (i)–(iii) are false. And so MEM is true. (For another challenge to an argument like the foregoing, see van Inwagen 2009.)

So, if there can be mere sums, and UFM is true, then we ought to believe in MEM, even if we do not accept MEO. (Arguments against MEM can be found in the supplement Challenges to Mereological Essentialism for Masses and arguments against UFM in section 3.1.)

2.1.3 How do Sums of Stuff Relate to Ordinary Objects?

Of course, if ordinary objects can change parts, but sums can not, then it seems that ordinary objects are not mereological sums. But then, what are they, and how do they relate to the sums which obviously seem to constitute them?

If one is serious about the existence of sums of matter, it seems there are only a few ways they could relate to ordinary objects.[20] One way is to say that sums constitute ordinary objects by coinciding with them. That is, sums are distinct objects which share all of their parts with the commonsense objects they make up. One could also eliminate ordinary objects. Ordinary objects either do not exist, or exist in some kind of shadowy or derivative sense (think of ‘the average man’). Another way is to say that while sums are in fact things or objects, ordinary objects are a different kind of entity. These dual-category views hold that commonsense objects are in a different ontological category than sums.

Those who wish to explore in more detail the metaphysics of masses, ordinary objects, and their relations, can read the supplement on Sums and Ordinary Objects.

2.1.4 Are Sums of Stuff Non-Atomic?

Godehard Link and Harry Bunt have argued that the best models of natural language use of mass expressions will distinguish mass entities from count by treating the former as if they are non-atomic, whether or not they actually are. Godehard Link (1998) argues that the reference of mass expressions is best understood via the development of a rich model-theoretic semantics, which algebraically models the interrelated network of talk of mass, plural, and particular entities. Harry Bunt (1985) subsumes both set theory and mereology into an axiomatic system called “Ensemble Theory” in order to model the structure of talk about mass expressions. Link’s account in particular embraces coincidence on a massive scale.

Since Link and Bunt’s views are put forward in a relatively metaphysically neutral way, we will relegate more information about these views to an appendix. But, if the modeling they propose handles the linguistic data better than other views then that will give further support to a theory which embraces both coincidence and infinite divisibility. Hence these treatments are ontologically relevant. Examining Link’s theory in some detail can show us just how far distinguishing mass- and count- via the atomic/non-atomic distinction can take us, and what it can’t do for us. See the supplement Non-Atomicity and the Mass/Count Distinction for details.

2.2 Concrete Mass Expressions Refer to Sets

A slightly less popular way to answer our question is to treat mass expressions as referring to sets. For instance, suppose there’s some wine on the floor. Roughly, according to the masses-as-sets theorist, this is equivalent to there being a set of wine bits (whatever they are) on the floor. If Nancy’s ring is gold, then there is a set of gold molecules which compose or constitute the ring. If ‘the gold’ is identified with a set, then some problems faced by the mereologists are avoided. While a mereologist who is committed to the existence of the mass of gold is under pressure to deny the existence of the ring if she wants to avoid coincidence, the masses-as-sets theorist has a great advantage in that she can say that both the ring and gold exist but are not coinciding material things, since the gold, unlike the ring, is a set and not an object.

The masses-as-sets theorist reduces mass expressions to count expressions, by treating concrete mass expressions (e.g., ‘the gold’) as veiled count-expressions (e.g., ‘the set of gold atoms’).

One stark problem for the masses-as-sets view (henceforth we will identify a proponent of this view as a ‘set theorist,’ ignoring its more general meaning), is that it identifies paradigmatically concrete stuffs with what are usually regarded as paradigmatically abstract objects—sets. How could some gold be a set? Suppose we can pick out a definite portion of gold which makes up a ring. If sets are abstract, then the set theorist must say that the gold is abstract. This is pretty hard to swallow. Abstract things are not in time or space, but gold is. Also, sets are not identical to their members. But the gold in the ring does seem identical to the members of the set of gold atoms, not the set itself. (Regarding issues of ‘many-one identity’, see Baxter 1988, Wallace 2011a,b, and see section 8 of the entry on identity).

Perhaps the set theorist can instead maintain that masses are sets, but deny that sets (or at least sets of bits of matter) are abstract. A set theorist might maintain that sets of physical objects (such as gold atoms) can be said to be in space in virtue of their members being in space. The gold, construed as a set of gold atoms, can be said to weigh ten ounces in virtue of its members collectively weighing ten ounces. On this kind of view, massy sets have their physical properties ‘by proxy’ (Zimmerman 1995, sections 3 and 9).

But, when we try to unpack exactly in which sense the set of gold atoms is non-abstract, we can see that it is hard to distinguish the masses-as-sets view from the plurals approach which we will examine below. The non-abstract set theorist will hold that a set of gold atoms can in fact have physical properties, in virtue of the properties of its members. So, a non-abstract set theorist would first paraphrase “the gold weighs ten ounces” into “that set of gold atoms weighs ten ounces.” But, in order to explain how a set weighs ten ounces, they would have to again paraphrase and analyze the latter as something like “the set’s members collectively weigh ten ounces.” But if the set theorist has to paraphrase their paraphrase, then there is considerable pressure for the set theorist to instead switch over to the stuff-as-plurals view (section 2.3) and just talk directly about the members. If we are just talking about the members, or the gold atoms, and we can say what we want about many things without talking about the set of those many things, then why complicate matters by introducing sets?

There are some problems for the set-theoretic paraphrase. Suppose one truly says “the melted sugar here is the same sugar that was in the packet.” If ‘sugar’ in this context referred to the various lumps and grains of sugar in a packet, then, if there are no more lumps or grains after the melting, then the set-equality, and hence the identity-claim, comes out false. As Pelletier points out, when we identify some stuff, there are many different individuating standards available (e.g., ‘packets of ___’, ‘bottles of ___’, ‘granules of ___’), and different divisions will yield different sets (1974, p. 94). This ends up either under-determining which identities hold, or, absurdly, entailing that some stuff is distinct from itself.

In addition, set theorists usually formulate their theory in terms assuming atomism, yet it seems possible that there is gunky non-atomic stuff (Zimmerman 1995, §9, 1996b; Sider 1993). If there are, or could be, stuffs like this, then standard set-theoretic treatments will not work, since such theories require all sets to be well-founded. Another problem is that for some stuffs it is (or seems to be) indeterminate what, if anything, will count as a smallest unit of it—e.g., minestrone soup or beer. So, the set theorist has a problem with non-atomic or fuzzy atomless stuffs (see 1.4 for terminology). In what immediately follows, we will only discuss the issue of non-atomicity.

Suppose there is a cube of completely homogenous and gunky jello on the table, with no empty space inside. Suppose that the cube can’t survive being sliced or having its parts scattered. Suppose that the jello composing the cube is a fundamental stuff-kind. On the set-theoretic proposal, to say that the jello constitutes the cube is to say that a set of jello-individuals constitutes the cube. Which individuals? One non-option is the set {cube}, for then the jello would be identical with the cube, and could not undergo any changes which the cube could not. So, the set must include at least two jello individuals. Suppose that the set’s members are the left and right halves of the jello—call them ‘Lefty’ and ‘Righty’. So, saying that the jello constitutes the cube is to say that {Lefty, Righty} constitute the cube. But, of course, there is also the set of Lefty’s left half, right half, and Righty’s left and right halves. This set, {Lefty’s left half, Lefty’s right half, Righty’s left half, Righty’s right half}, is a better candidate to identify with the jello stuff, since it will survive if cut into four pieces the right way, whereas {Lefty, Righty} will not. We want to pick out the set of jello-individuals which can survive any kind of scattering. But, the problem, of course, is that Lefty’s left half is composed of Lefty’s left half’s left half, and so on. Since the postulation of gunk rules out employing a set of point-particles, there appears to be no set of jello-individuals that we can identify the jello stuff with which can serve to pick out all the jello stuff and account for the persistence conditions of the stuff (=set) in the right way. So, there is absolutely nothing which is the set of individuals which make up the cube. If we wish to identify the jello stuff with every set that is some of it, since the members of every set are themselves composed of further sets, then it is sets ‘all the way down’, where we never arrive at members which are not composed of further members of sets of stuff. Dean Zimmerman notes,

The mere thought of these “non-well-founded” sets is enough to induce vertigo. How could something as concrete and physical as a mass of matter be made of nothing but sets of sets of sets…ad infinitum? (1995, p. 99, italics his)

For masses of stuff composed of simples, however, the procedure is relatively simple—“whenever you have a larger mass compounded out of smaller masses of the same kind, identify the larger mass with a set of these smaller masses.” There is no way to do this with gunky masses, since, for any arbitrarily chosen constituting individual, it itself is a constituted object that needs to have the same treatment applied to it.

The set-theoretical interpretation has many difficulties, and few champions. But, this should not be regarded as the last word on the subject. There are non-well-founded set theories, which could perhaps get around the foregoing difficulties.

2.3 Concrete Mass Expressions Refer to Many Things, Not One Thing: Pluralities and Plural Reference

We do not only speak of individual things, we speak of many things. Sentences such as “The cheerleaders formed a human pyramid,” or “Those dogs are sick” are examples of plural predication, quantification, and reference. Some hold that some plural referring expressions are irreducible to singular predication, quantification, and reference (Boolos 1984; McKay 2005; Yi 2005). According to standard logic, “some things are F” is true only if each of those things is F. But, as McKay and others point out, “The students surrounded the building” could be true even though it is false to say of Bob (one of the students) that he surrounded the building (McKay 2005, chapter 1). Those in favor of plural logic argue that we need not countenance sums or sets to account for plural logic, rather, we can take such sentences at face value. Those tigers may be distinct from those lions, but this doesn’t require ‘the tigers’ to refer to a collection, sum, or particular thing of any stripe.

Some ‘pluralists’, as we may call those who analyze mass expressions in terms of plural expressions, hold that mass terms are used, generally, to refer to many things at once (Nicolas 2002). ‘Gold’, on most occasions of use, does not refer to a thing—it refers to many things.

According to an early account (Laycock 1975) statements such as “the water is boiling” or “Bob took out that trash” mean “those water molecules are boiling” and “Bob took out those pieces of trash.” The idea (also developed more fully later by Nicolas 2008, who, in turn, was inspired by Gillon 1992) that mass expressions are used to refer to several things at once seems especially promising for concrete quasi-mass nouns such as silverware and furniture, whose reference is particular pieces of silverware or furniture. Concrete mass nouns such as beer will be paraphrased as referring, depending on context, to bottles, drops, glasses, gallons, or quantities (in Cartwright’s 1979b sense) of beer.

Pluralists about mass expressions differ most markedly from sum and set theorists as follows. The set theorist would take ‘the water in Merrihew’s cup’ to refer to the set of water molecules in his cup, and the sum theorist would take it to refer to a fusion. These are both particular entities. But, for the Pluralist, the water is not a particular thing—it is many things. For example, the account that Nicolas recommends

associates to a mass noun [M], not a set of things, but some things, each of which is M…the denotation of the expression the gold on the table, the as, comprises any things that are gold on the table. (2008, 22)

Many claim that plural logic, reference, predication, and quantification is ontologically innocent. That is, we are not committing ourselves the existence of new entities by employing plurals, even if we believe that some usage featuring plural reference is irreducible. Being committed to the existence of ‘those cats’ (while adverting to Mr. Furrikens, Chairman Meow, and Magnificat) is not an additional commitment over and above the commitment to Mr. Furrikens, Chairman Meow, and Magnificat. When one pays for this apple, and that apple, one gets ‘the apples’ for free. In this respect the ontologically innocent Pluralist has a leg up over the set and sums theorists, since the former posits no novel entities. But, to be fair, some sum theorists have argued that positing sums is ‘ontologically innocent’—i.e., when we have two things, positing a sum of those two things does not introduce anything in addition to the initial two things. So, there may be parity in this respect.[21]

In some of his early work Laycock makes arguments by analogy to support the proposal that mass expressions are veiled plural expressions, so that water, in its analysis, gets treated like apples or Hobbits does. We turn to the analogies.

Both mass and plural terms refer cumulatively. Just as any two portions of water considered together are water, so these apples and those apples together are apples.

Also, Hobbits, just like water, resists pluralization. For the former, this is because Hobbits is already plural: ‘Hobbitses’ does not make sense. Water cannot be pluralized and retain its standard reference, since ‘waters’ either means kinds of water, or different bodies of water (e.g., lakes, rivers, pools, seas, rather than numerous water per se, which doesn’t make sense unless used in a technical or stipulative way). One way to explain this is to suppose that water is already plural.

Both Hobbits and water do not take the indefinite article. Neither ‘a water’ (when not understood in the kind sense or with an implicit partitioning e.g., ‘bottle of’) nor ‘a Hobbits’ are grammatical. Both mass and plural expressions take the definite article since ‘the’ “does not discriminate between singular and plural” (Laycock 2006, p. 35). Both Hobbits and water take the non-singular analogue of the indefinite article—‘some’. Some Hobbits and some water can both surround a castle, and neither use implies singularity.

Both mass and plural terms can be prefaced by partitioning and measurement terms. One could buy seven pounds of applesauce, or seven pounds of apples. One could sell a jar of applesauce, or a box of apples, a gallon of marbles, or a gallon of milk.

But, even given the aforementioned similarities, there are significant differences between mass and plural terms. While one can infer from “There are peppercorns in the sauce” that there is at least one peppercorn in the sauce, one cannot infer from “There is wine in the sauce” that there is at least one (non-kind usage) wine in the sauce. Furthermore, every plural term (except for plural invariable terms such as ‘cattle’ and ‘groceries’) e.g., ‘cats’, is correlated with a singular cognate, e.g., ‘cat’. But there are no singular cognates for mass terms e.g., ‘water’ or ‘silverware’

There is much to say for the pluralist position. Plural logic is becoming better understood, less controversial, and a case can be made that standard first-order logic will be subsumed under, or merged with, plural logic (for discussion of these issues, see the entry on plural quantification). If this is so, and mass expressions are plural expressions, then mass expressions can be accounted for in a relatively well understood and uncontroversial logic which accounts for a wider range of commonsense inferences than standard logic does.

The pluralist account is quite plausible when we consider atomic mass expressions, or mass expressions with atomic denotata (def. ‘atomic’ in 1.4) such as ‘silverware’, ‘furniture’, and ‘water’. It will become easy to cash out the truth conditions of such talk in terms of the atomic units, such as pieces of silverware, furniture, and H2O molecules (Nicolas 2008).

Also in favor of the account is that it does at least as good a job as the set-theoretical view since it explains the relationship between a thing and its constituting matter in a similar way, yet posits no novel entities like sets. There are just the many bits, and the constituted object of which they are parts. This point has been stated forcefully by Laycock (1972) and Burke (1997), yet these accounts have the worrying feature (for some) of not being truly reductive. See section 3.1 for an ‘ontologically serious’ view of pluralities.

Many of the problems which beset the set theorist confront the Pluralists as well. What about fuzzy atomless or gunky stuff? If talk of stuff is to be paraphrased in terms of plural reference, what are the individuals slotted for this role? With atomic stuffs, it is clear. But with ‘fruitcake’ and ‘taco sauce’ it is not. Why suppose there is a fact of the matter as to what counts as stuffs of these kinds? And if there is no fact of the matter then what are the individuals we are speaking of when we speak of fruitcake? And our Pluralist has just as much trouble chopping up the Jello cube as the Set Theorist in 2.2.

Of course, vagueness and indeterminacy are problems for most theories of masses, so it could be unfair to overstress this point, and it is not at all clear that the pluralist can’t augment her account with standard logics of vagueness or employ analogues to set-theoretic non-well-foundedness moves. (See Chierchia 2010 for an examination of vagueness and its relation to mass nouns, and a development of a plural approach, which can be found in many other articles, e.g. Chierchia 1998a). Given the many salutary components of plural logic in relation to mass expressions, this remains a promising area of inquiry.

3. Stuff as Distinct From Things

The first three approaches to the referents of nominal concrete mass expressions in the foregoing section are all relatively conservative. All three are compatible with Thing Theory as described in 1.1. In this section we will examine views which posit non-thing-like stuff in addition to things (3.1), or eliminate things altogether (3.2), and so are not compatible with Thing Theory.

3.1 Serious Pluralities

Some have taken a view of pluralities which is not ontologically innocent. Henry Laycock and Michael Burke, at times, have tentatively favored the notion that there is a novel ontic category of plural entities which are not individual items of quantification.

What is the difference between the ontologically innocent and ontologically serious pluralists, and what is the case for the serious position? The serious pluralist can have several motivations. Laycock (1972) argues that there is definite reference of mass expressions, such as ‘that water’, ‘the water in the tub’, but that this reference is not singular reference. ‘This water’, on a demonstrative occasion, refers, but, “my contention is that this water, unlike this or that drop, is not a particular object” (1972, p. 4). Laycock claims that “we can and do think of stuff as having an independent reality [from things]” (1972, p. 27, italics his). While saying “that there is gold in a certain region is certainly to assert the existence of something” (1972, p. 28), he does deny that this ‘something’ is particular, and, throughout his work, denies that it is a set or a fusion. What definite singular terms like ‘the gold in the…’ “designate is a quite distinct type of item, concrete but not particular” (1972, p. 28).

If one really believes that i) there is water, ii) we make definite reference to it, iii) water is not a thing (i.e., not a sum or set), and iv) plural quantification and predication is irreducible to singular quantification and predication, then one might feel compelled to accept that mass expressions like water and gold refer to genuine entities distinct from (or ‘over and above’) the water and gold molecules. Let us call whatever it is that is referred to with definite reference by mass expressions in this way ‘pluralities’ (Laycock and Burke do not use the phrase, and Laycock would probably find it at best infelicitous, and at worst a grave source of metaphysical error).

Belief in irreducible pluralities gets more traction when combined with a denial of unrestricted mereology, which is just what Laycock does:

The posit of a physical object without a physical unity—the posit of a ‘formless’ or ‘structureless’ concrete plurality, an arbitrary physical unit upon which there are no physical or spatio-temporal constraints—is no mere curiosity: it would seem to be a kind of incoherence…the concept of an object is the concept of a unit or a unity…A physical object with all the physical unity of a set of physical objects, for example {Caesar’s nose, the Eiffel Tower, the Andromeda galaxy}—a physical object in short lacking physical or spatio-temporal unity—is no physical object at all. (2006, p. 95)

If one accepts (i)–(iv), and has reason to reject both UFM (see 2.1.1) and the set-theoretical view, and one wants commonsense sentences featuring mass expressions to come out true, then what is left to be referred to by nominal statements about water, lead, etc. except pluralities?

Another motivation can be found in Burke (1997), inspired by Laycock. Burke was concerned to resolve the coincidence puzzle between not only a thing and its constituting piece of matter, but between these things and the matter per se. (Since some copper can persist past the shattering of a piece of copper which constitutes a statue, then presumably the copper is distinct from either). Burke’s account, all the details of which do not concern us here (see the entry on material constitution and the supplement Sums and Ordinary Objects for details) requires that the statue and piece of copper be identical. If this is so, and the statue comes into existence, and is identical with its constituting piece, then a new piece must come into existence and the old one cease to be. One of the options Burke canvasses to explain why it is that we (mistakenly) assume the piece continues in existence is because the copper persists through the change:

Of course, this explanation concedes that the statue…shares its place with something, namely, the copper. So am I not allowing coinciding objects after all? No, I am not, since I deny that the copper is a single object. Following Laycock (1972) , I claim that the copper is a plurality. It is many objects… The case of the statue and the copper is not a case of coinciding objects because it is not a case in which one object occupies the same place as any one other. (1997, p. 12, italics his)

Burke denies the identification of the many copper bits and the piece of copper:

Well, I hold that each of the many is a part of the one, but I deny that the many parts collectively are identical with the one…Trivially, the many are many. But it is not individually that they are many. (They are one each.) So the many collectively are many. But ‘many’ and ‘one’ are contrary. So the many collectively are not one. But, again trivially, the one is one. So it is false that the many collectively are identical with the one. (1997, p. 13)

It is doubtful, though, that postulating pluralities which are not things can solve the coincidence puzzles. Burke, who himself brought up a similar objection to coincidence in general, faces the following problem. How are distinct entities, such as the statue and the copper, different in sort, given that they both have the same intrinsic properties? There seems to be a one to one correspondence between the features of the statue and those of the copper. Why isn’t the copper a statue, for the same reasons the piece of copper is? Burke can insist that the main difference is that the statue/piece is one thing, whereas the copper is many things, but it is not clear why withholding the honorific thing from ‘the’ copper plurality solves the problem (Zimmerman 1997, p. 23).

It is unclear what the addition of the attribution of ‘concrete non-particulars’ to the plural analysis is doing, and doubtful that it clarifies matters. (See Steen 2011 for a critique of ‘contingent non-particularity’). Indeed it seems to somewhat back away from the plural analysis. The initial reason for analyzing concrete mass expressions in terms of plural quantification and predication is that talk about ‘the lions’ and ‘those Hobbits’ is relatively unproblematic. But then, why reduce mass expressions to plural reference if one holds that water or a water plurality is something over and above those water molecules, yet denies that the lion plurality is something over and above those lions? It’s not clear why both water and lions get a plural reference treatment, yet the referents of mass expressions get to retain some kind of ontological halo which distinguishes their referents from non-mass plural expressions. Laycock (2006) no longer holds (and only tentatively held) that mass expressions are plural.

3.2 World-Stuff

Some stuff ontologists eliminate concrete things altogether. There is only stuff, objects being accidental phases of objectively non-objectual stuff. Alternatively, concepts are thought of as ‘cookie-cutters’, which conventionally carve pseudo-objects (cf Dummet 1981, chap 16) out of the amorphous world-blob, which either is not itself an object (Sidelle 1989), or is the only object there is (Horgan & Potrč 2000, 2008).[22]

Alan Sidelle (1989, 1991, 1998) argues that while stuff exists, there are no things which exist and actually have the essences we believe they do. In 1998 he argues that we should regard the unraveling of a sweater, or the chopping down of a tree, not as substantial changes in which things cease to be, but rather as accidental changes in underlying, persisting stuff (compare also Needham 2010):

the intuitive [claim] we are here considering amounts to the claim that while there are trees, sweaters, and other ordinary objects, our ordinary substance terms are not, in fact, substance terms, but pick out these objects according to accidental properties…Being a tree, or a sweater, is an accidental property of something more basic.

What is more basic? Stuff. Supposed substantial change in objects is actually accidental change to some stuff. Sidelle diagnoses the phenomenon of coincidence as a species of the problem of individuation:

Whether there is coincidence is fundamentally the question of whether there can be more than one criterion of identity instantiated at a given location, that is, whether, for any location taken to contain an object, the various seemingly possible criteria of identity can all be ruled out as false, save one. (1998, p. 441)

He claims that the problem of coincident entities arises not due to the diversity of individuals in a region, but rather due to the fact that the world as it is under-determines which principles of individuation are the correct ones to employ. We can treat any property as accidental or as essential by employing different sortals, or nominal essences, to describe a thing. When a cow dies, we can describe this either as the accidental change in some flesh-and-bones, or the substantial change in a cow which is no more. Sidelle concludes, in a Lockean vein, that which changes we conceive of as substantial and which as accidental is more a function of us and our interests than of the way things really are (1998, p. 439).

Sidelle goes on to note that the main cause of our philosophical puzzles about objects is the dogmatic assumption that there are some, together with our employing the concept object. “It is objects which have made the problem, and the solution isn’t to switch which objects we allow, but to disallow objects altogether” (1998, p.441).

Sidelle recommends, tentatively, that we describe the world without quantification over things, and deny that “there is genuine, world-given individuation.” Furthermore, as it is supposedly obvious that there is at least stuff, we should suppose so, and theoretically regard the role of the ‘world-stuff’ as “the mind-independent matter of the world which, among other things, determines our perceptions” (1998, p. 443).

One problem for this view is that it is virtually indistinguishable from a Quinean view according to which a physical object is just “the content, however heterogeneous, of some portion of space-time, however disconnected and gerrymandered” (Quine 1960, p. 171). Our sortals, according to a type of Quinean, are used to pick out definite filled portions, and any and all of these are objects. What Sidelle calls ‘stuff’ Quine (or Jubien in 1993) is happy to call an ‘object’. If Sidelle’s stuff talk is inter-translatable into Quinean thing-talk then there is merely a terminological difference between the posit of World-Stuff and the posit of arbitrary things.

A further strange point about this view is that it entails that, just as there are no objects which have the persistence conditions that we think, there are no non-fundamental stuffs. The very same arguments given for rejecting ordinary objects and reducing them to world stuff can be given for water molecules and sodium chloride. Electrolysis can be seen not as the destruction of water but as a change in persisting underlying stuff. This can be carried on until we get to the fundamental stuff(s). Hydrogen can be seen as a phase of a proton and an electron, and a proton can be seen as a phase of quarks and gluons. So, it seems that elements and complexes, since they are not the fundamental or non-individuated world-stuff, must also be the result of conceptual carvings.

What about fundamental particles (assuming there are some)? They’ve got to go as well, if we assume they are objects. If there are in fact gluons and electrons which exist, are objects, and are particular things with identity and persistence conditions, then, if they are in fact simple they form the basis out of which we could construct the other objects. So, if non-individual world stuff is going to play a role, it seems that we must eliminate fundamental particles as well. This approach allows too much physics to be done from the armchair. (Other criticisms of views like Sidelle’s can be found in Denkel 1989, 1995; Laycock 1989; Steen 2011; Turner 2011; and meta-ontological criticisms of these kind of disagreements can be found in Eklund 2008. And, while not directly addressed in the following sources, a template for the criticism that these varying views about stuff vs. things may be a ‘disagreement without a difference’ can be found in Hirsch 2002 and Carnap 1950).

It must be noted, though, that such a World-Stuff view is similar to some interpretations of elementary particle physics and quantum theory. Some scientists and philosophers of science do in fact argue that at bottom the world is not a world of things or objects (or not entities we would unqualifiedly apply ‘object’ to). Rather, the basic stuff is non-particular mass-energy, or evolving local quantum states (Arntzenius 2012 §3.14), or fields, wave-functions, or spacetime itself (Malament 1996, Wallace and Timpson 2007), or structures (Ladyman and Ross 2009), or a kind of physics-friendly materia prima (Esfeld et al 2017). Some argue that the only real entity is the space-time fabric, ordinary objects just being temporary warpings or disturbances in it. On such views both ordinary macroscopic objects and putative fundamental particles are only epiphenomenal entities or temporary manifestations in the electromagnetic or gravitational fields (or other entities), which are fundamentally non-individual—some kind of world stuff or spacetime and its features (for details, see the entry identity and individuality in quantum theory). So, one should not rule out such views tout court. But, given the flux and opacity of such views, the untestability of some of the theories which underly some of these views (e.g. String Theory), and the lack of scientific consensus on these issues, one should not quickly and whole-heartedly embrace the notion of fundamental non-particular stuff either. These views merit further examination, but their adequate demonstration in part rests upon succesful advancements in physics and, for a layperson, a clear understanding of these interpretations, each of which may not come anytime soon.

4. Stuff and Things and the Limits of Linguistically-Guided Metaphysics

The foregoing entry represents a detailed case-study of metaphysical views which are heavily guided by syntactical, lexical, and semantic considerations, but freed from some of the methodological constraints and more narrow objectives of linguists and semanticists. Often in the preceding we have seen how the +MASS/+COUNT distinction was used to motivate a parallel ‘metaphysically serious’ stuff/thing distinction. The question to be briefly addressed here, after looking back on sixty years of work on the topic, is: to what extent is the +MASS/+COUNT distinction up to the tasks assigned to it by metaphysicians?

Such tasks often serve two main functions: constructive, and prohibitive. The constructive aspect is the idea that we can (and should) ‘read off’ the correct (or what we think is the correct) ontology from our language use. The prohibitive aspect is the idea that if syntax, semantics, or lexical meaning prohibits (or renders incoherent, or non-well-formed) certain constructions, then we can not (or should not) be ontologically committed to what the impermissible renderings would commit us to. Often the constructive and prohibitive work hand-in-hand, such as we have seen by noting how the fact that ‘wine’ cannot be prefaced with numerals (without referring to kinds) has lead many to think that wine cannot be a thing (prohibitive), and that, since wine exists, and can be measured, that it must be instead stuff (constructive).

But can the +MASS/+COUNT distinction do this much metaphysical work in a reliable way?

4.1 Mass/Count Interchangeability, Arbitrariness, and Non-Universality


As an introductory example of the topic of interchangeability, consider these well-known lyrics from the musical Sweeney Todd:

TODD: (spoken) These are desperate times,
Mrs. Lovett, and desperate measures are called for!
LOVETT: Here we are, now! Hot out of the oven!
TODD: What is that?

LOVETT: It’s priest. Have a little priest.
TODD: Is it really good?
LOVETT: Sir, it’s too good, at least!
Then again, they don’t commit sins of the flesh,
So it’s pretty fresh.

TODD: Haven’t you got poet, or something like that?
LOVETT: No, y’see, the trouble with poet is
’Ow do you know it’s deceased?
Try the priest!

(Lyrics from Sweeney Todd: The Demon Barber of Fleet Street)

As Pelletier has frequently noted (e.g. 1989, 2001, 2011, 2012a, 2012b), even if one wants to ignore putative metaphysical distinctions for distinguishing mass and count, instead maintaining that there are merely syntactical, lexical, or semantical ones—there remain significant problems for distinguishing mass vs. count. And if such fundamental linguistic problems are still outstanding, then the prospects of employing the +MASS/+COUNT distinction as the basis for a strong metaphysical distinction are hazy.[23] Let’s see why.

Every criterion put forth for distinguishing between +MASS and +COUNT faces significant—and seemingly systematic—counterexamples. We attempted to side-step such problems in Section 1 by stipulating that there is a difference between ‘nouns/terms/expressions used with a mass sense,’ versus ‘nouns/terms/expressions used with a count sense,’ but forebore giving an account of what gives particular instances the sense they do have. (More detail on this can be found in the “Logic of Mass Expressions” entry). Then, using the rough-and-ready characterization of +COUNT versus +MASS (or things versus stuff) we, mirroring our authors, went on to exploit the distinction for our ends of taxonomizing the world’s inhabitants and describing their features.

But, this stipulation ignores the following kinds of problems. Suppose we accept that syntactic criteria (as covered in Section 1) are doing the distinguishing. The problem with this is that every putatively +MASS/-COUNT noun admits of -MASS/+COUNT instances, and we cannot tell the difference based on syntax alone. But if this is so, then we would need “syntactic derivation rules to convert each noun from one to the other category—a terrible syntactic idea (or double entries for every lexical noun—another terrible syntactic idea) … once [this is done] …, then the +MASS/-COUNT features do no syntactic work: they never rule out any construction as ungrammatical on their own” (Pelletier 2011, pp. 22–23).

Any supposed count noun can have mass instances, and vice versa. For example, employing something like the ‘Universal Grinder’ idea of Pelletier (1979, pp. 5–6) we can imagine any putative count-item C as being ground up so that there is ‘C all over the floor.’ The quoted passage above from Sweeney Todd is an example of how count-terms for kinds of people are easily transformed into mass terms to refer to the stuffs in (or kinds of) meat-pies served to the unwittingly cannibalistic customers. The Universal Grinder idea relies more on the ease with which we can switch from +COUNT to +MASS than it does on any actual grinding (cf. Chierchia 2010 and 2021, Rothstein 2010 p. 390–4). We can refer to any individual (be it ground or whole) in a ‘massy’ way. Think of how Mark’s spouse might think, ‘there’s a lot more Mark now after the quarantine’ if he gained a lot of weight. These instances of ‘grinding’, which may seem peculiar or violent, have been argued to be merely “realizations of a regular polysemy” (Kiss et al 2021b, 379).

Bunt (1985) discussed the reverse operation(s): (+MASS/-COUNT -> -MASS/+COUNT), which comes in two varieties. The first is the ‘Universal Sorter’, which sorts into kinds, such as with ‘Voodoo Brewery sells six beers.’ The second is the ‘Universal Packager’ (Pelletier 1975), which puts masses into portions, as with ‘we’ll have six beers,’ or ‘there are four butters in the package.’ (Granted, there is a change in sense in these cases, but, as addressed below, this doesn’t undermine the notion that these nouns are polysemous, and so also does not undermine the point of interchangeability without a lexical switch). We can refer to any stuff (be it packaged, atomistic, or neither) in a particular way.

Huddleston & Payne, in The Cambridge Grammar of the English Language (Huddleston & Pullum (eds.), 2002, pp. 334–5, cited in Pelletier 2011 and 2012), show convincingly that such transformations are ubiquitous and do not at all support the notion that [chocolate (+MASS/-COUNT)] (‘he had a lot of chocolate’) is a different word than [chocolate (-MASS/+COUNT)] (‘he had three chocolates’). ‘Chocolate’ is polysemous, not homonymous. In addition to the lack of syntactic features to distinguish between mass and count terms, there are no inherent lexical features either.

So if syntax or lexical meaning won’t do it, maybe a semantic distinction will do? Huddleston & Payne go on to distinguish between the heterogeneity of terms like ‘crockery’ and ‘furniture’, which are not dissective, versus terms like ‘water,’ which are (2002, 336–7). (They call the former sort of mass terms ‘aggregative’). But if dissectivity is taken seriously as a semantic requirement to be considered as mass, then it will end up that an H2O molecule is not water, nor is an NaCl molecule salt. (More on the non-atomic criteria is discussed in the Supplement on Non-Atomicity and Its Relevance to the Mass/Count Distinction). As the authors point out (p338), when some material comes in small enough units, we often treat it as +MASS/-COUNT, such as dust, hair (e.g. when there’s scattered piles of it on the floor), change (i.e., coins)––not because we think the stuff is non-atomic, but because when the atoms are small enough it is more convenient or intuitive to think of it in a +MASS way. Dissectivity may do some work, but only to a point, and so it’s not really what is distinguishing mass from count. And we cannot appeal to language-users’ intentions in particular instances to settle whether their use is mass or count because it may be “that in most instances speakers simply have no intentions that are relevant” (Pelletier 2001 p496, summarizing Ware 1975). Often, people’s use, mental states, and the nature of the referent under-determine whether on a particular occasion a noun/term/expression is used in a mass or count manner.

Cumulativity may be a more dogged criterion, as it is relatively consistent for two (+COUNT/-MASS) N’s not to be an N, e.g. two people don’t seem to be a person, whereas some (-COUNT/+MASS) N and some other N are N, e.g. two bits of water are water. But there are many counterexamples to this as well. If there is an aggregate of well-demarcated individuals, then the aggregation of it with another yields an aggregate. Two connected but discrete planes can compose a plane, and some robots could be made to, Voltron-style, compose a robot. Or, less exotically, in certain circumstances two fleets or armies could compose a fleet or army. Granted, these are somewhat artificial examples, and cumulativity does seem to be much more common in +MASS than +COUNT, but it is not distinguished in this from +PLURAL. (See Sections 2.3 and 3.1 for accounts which reduce mass reference to plural reference).

There is empirical work which militates against the standard criteria put forward for differentiating mass and count, and also questions the over-reliance of researchers on their own intuitions about the distinction (Kiss et al, 2017). Reflection upon recent empirical evidence in language-acquisition has led some researchers to tentatively conclude that particular nouns themselves, whether mass or count, “do not encode full conceptual criteria for individuation, but instead encode partial criteria that are filled out pragmatically, by contrasting alternative descriptions of objects and their parts” (Srinivasan and Barner 2020, p159). But it would be irresponsible to suggest that there is just ‘nothing to’ the mass/count distinction, nor any universal or near-universal distinguishing features (See Chierchia 2010 p.4). One can maintain that while there are different mass and count senses, that nevertheless, all nouns are both mass and count, as we see defended in Pelletier 2012b. (For challenges to this, see Kiss et al 2021b). Yet others argue that it is not the distinction between mass and count that matters so much, rather what matters is the more general distinction between being +COUNT and +NON-COUNT (Laycock 2006b & 2006c, Rothstein 2010, Wiese 2012, and see chapter 1 of Massam 2012 for other proposed replacements to, or more general alternatives to, the mass/count distinction).


Relying on the +MASS/+COUNT distinction to support any strong metaphysical conclusions has the additional problem that, in many cases, whether we use a mass or count term appears to be almost completely arbitrary (and certainly non-universal, see the next section). The following is a chart which lists many nouns in English and shows how their translations frequently diverge in terms of being +MASS or +COUNT (The following examples are from Pelletier 2001, 2011; Chierchia 1998a, 2010):

Cross-Linguistic Mass/Count Variation
French: les pellicules
(-MASS/+COUNT) lit. ‘the films’
French: la vaisalle
German: ein möbel
German: eine nachricht
(-MASS/+COUNT) lit. ‘a news’
Russian: klubnika / клубника

Even within English often the use seems arbitrary, where the following illustrate cases where either (i) the choice to use a +MASS/-COUNT or -MASS/+COUNT term is (usually) arbitrary on the occasion of use, or (ii) where a contrast is given (e.g. between fruit and vegetables) where one can see that our decision to make the default noun mass and another count is arbitrary, since there is no inherent mass/count difference in the referents. (These examples, and the point, are from Pelletier 1989 p19, and 2012 p429, and Gillon 1992 p.627, 2012 p.721).

fruit vegetables
flu cold
spaghetti noodle
footware shoes
change coins
knowledge belief
rice beans
baklava brownies
foliage leaves
ammunition bullets


Strawson (1959) introduced the notion of ‘descriptive metaphysics’ to self-describe his attempt to explain what ‘individuals’ are, according to ordinary language. Projects like this do not seek to carve out the ontic joints in nature so much as show where ‘the folk’ supposedly think such joints are, as implied by their language use. Projects like this represent attempts to describe our metaphysical picture of the world rather than argue that the picture is right.

Prescriptive metaphysics, by contrast, seeks to argue for particular metaphysical views that may not gel with commonsense or ordinary language. Prescriptive metaphysics often relies on the descriptive in order to advance its agenda—sometimes as a foil, other times as a baseline from which to deviate minimally only when required, or regarded as an oppressive thought system that we need liberation from, and so on. Often prescriptivists are descriptivists inasmuch as they attempt to ‘paraphrase’ their replacement ontology into the language of the folk and its implicit ontology, and the availability of such a paraphrase is sometimes thought to be required for the replacement ontology to be considered successful. Such a paraphrase requires doing descriptive metaphysics.

Yet the descriptive is not free from prescriptivity either, since there are obviously disagreements amongst practitioners of descriptive metaphysics, and conflicting intuitions about what ‘our’ implicit ontology is. And so descriptivists argue that we should accept one descriptive view over another, but such arguments often rely on pointing out that the opponents’ view cannot be a correct view of reality, or rely on a principle of charity that requires attempting to massage the folk view so that it ends up being correct as a depiction of reality, which in turn relies on the prescriptive non-universal intuitions of the descriptive metaphysician. Any sufficiently rich descriptive metaphysics is not free from some prescriptive content. And so they need each other, and are inextricably intertwined.

Most of the foregoing metaphysicians (not necessarily philosophers of language or linguists) we have examined have practiced a sort of mixed methodology. One starts by pointing out the commonsense distinction in English between mass and count, and one then proceeds to develop a picture which can both explain, and be consistent with, ordinary talk, as well as solving whichever particular problems the metaphysician in question is concerned with. Often one takes the ordinary language distinction as evidence in their view’s favor, together with various prescriptively informed premises not necessarily endorsed by folk ontology.

The problem with this procedure is that the distinction between mass and count is often employed by metaphysicians to make universal conclusions about ‘our’ (i.e., humanity’s) implicit conceptual scheme, usually by merely examining English (or the one to three Indo-European languages known by the author).

As one early critic of Strawson’s method noted (Mei 1961, cited in Pelletier 2011 pp. 37–8):

Strawson exploits facts peculiar to languages like English … in Chinese, Strawson’s criteria are inapplicable … [his] … Aristotelian arguments based upon the pecularities of English and its relatives … [Strawson’s notion of] ‘assertive ties’, and subject-predicate ‘congruence’ only works for languages with sufficient inflection …. Strawson’s silence [about other languages] can be interpreted in only two ways. He must either have thought that they conform to his criterion or that they are irrelevant. But the grammatical facts of Chinese do not conform to his criterion … and to say that they are irrelevant is to claim that English is the paradigm of all languages. What justification can Strawson, or any of his colleagues, offer for this act of linguistic imperialism? (Mei 1961 p157, most truncation and interpolation is Pelletier’s)

While the mass/count distinction is relatively pervasive, it is not clearly universal. Some (e.g. Sharvy 1978) have argued that Mandarin has no count nouns at all, and rather refers to individuals by imposing a measure or classifier on what are by default mass nouns. So, for example, ‘a cigarette’ (‘香烟’) is best understood as something like ‘a stick’s worth of cigarette-stuff.’ But others (e.g. Cheng & Sybesma 1999, Cherchia 2010) have argued that we are to look for the +MASS/-COUNT distinction in the classifier system itself (cf Pelletier 2011 p30), while yet others argue that there just is no distinction between mass and count in Mandarin. In an opposite fashion, Whorf (1944) argued that Hopi has only count nouns, and Davis and Matthewson (2009) have argued that the Lillooet Salish language lacks mass nouns entirely.

While ignoring the details, The Dënë Sųłinë́ language (spoken by the Dené or Chipeweyan people of Northwest Canada) arguably does not have a mass/count distinction whatsoever, nor do the Amazonian languages Karitiana or Yudja. (See Pelletier 2011 p31, and a challenge to this in Chierchia 2021. See Wiltschko 2012 for an examination of languages which lack a mass/count distinction, and for extremely recent and copious work on this see the Kiss, Pelletier, and Husic (eds.) 2021 collection).

While it hasn’t been definitively demonstrated that the mass/count distinction is not universal (cf. Chierchia 2021), neither can one easily claim that it is (cf. Massam 2012 ch.1). Maybe its universality is not needed for their purposes, but authors frequently seem to argue that syntactical, lexical, or semantic features of mass vs. count give one strong reason to believe that such a distinction goes beyond the representational and reflects reality itself.

4.2 From Arbitrariness to Mass/Count Skepticism?

If the following summary propositions are all true:

  1. It is arbitrary whether a term we decide to use is mass or count (e.g. leaves vs. foliage),
  2. Every supposed mass noun can be used in a count sense, and every supposed count noun can be used in a mass sense,
  3. The mass/count distinction is not universal (or at least not obviously so),

then this calls into question the licitness of metaphysicians’ heavy reliance on the distinction in furthering their descriptive and prescriptive projects. This does not mean that these metaphysical views are not worth arguing for, or entertaining, but that the particular ways they have been argued for could reasonably be doubted by one we could call a ‘Mass/Count Skeptic.’ A Mass/Count Skeptic is one who thinks that the mass/count distinction is a red herring with regards to laying out either a descriptive or prescriptive metaphysics, since the undeterdetermination of (metaphysical) theory by (linguistic) data in this matter is acute. This does not mean that one should not engage in metaphysical arguments about stuff vs things, but perhaps the mass/count distinction is not as firm a foundation as many have thought. After demonstrating some of the preceding kinds of considerations, Pelletier says

the facts surrounding how +MASS/+COUNT is manifested in languages other than the Indo-European ones might seem to show that the basis and rationale for making the distinction—and perhaps any philosophical consequences that might seem to follow from the distinction—are not really valid as claims about reality in general or about how people might conceptualize reality. (Pelletier 2012a p435).

In an earlier piece, Pelletier says “it seems there is nothing in the referent of the terms that should make fruit mass and vegetable count, baklava mass and brownie count, rice mass and bean count” (2001 p497). When we are not thinking about linguistics or metaphysics, and have to go about our business, we see that sometimes it is convenient to look at its inhabitants in a massy way (‘I’ve got 1000 pounds of furniture to ship,’ ‘I had too much fruitcake’), and sometimes in a count way (‘Large-Haired Real Estate Agent’s Quarterly says that a dining table, six chairs, and credenza are necessary for ideal dining room staging,’ ‘We need two fruitcakes for the party’). Whenever we have some stuff or particles whose smallest macroscopically visible bits are identical or interchangeable, and they can be gathered or stuck together or can act together in a macroscopic way (e.g. air/wind), we tend to think of it in massy way, and, as regards its small-scale structure, there just is no folk pre-scientific commonsense commitment to either atomism or not (cf Ware 1975, pace Bunt 1985, Link 1998). The only reason that rice is mass and beans count is probably because the former are smaller and harder to distinguish, or count separately. Change becomes coins when we want to count them, whereas humans become flesh when their individuality is regarded as unimportant, e.g. in the following real-world example. One Dr. Albert Klingman, when beginning medical experiments on prisoners, upon first seeing them (many who were shirtless), said that “All I saw before me were acres of skin. It was like a farmer seeing a fertile field for the first time” (Munson & Lague, 2017, 133).

It’s an open question how a metaphysician with a hardcore commitment to following the dictates of language should adjust their methodology, at least as regards the mass/count distinction, given the foregoing. Suppose one wants to become more inclusive, and follow not merely the dictates of their own language (or even their larger language group), and instead decides to constrain and shape their metaphysical theories only by the most general aspects of shared human grammar, syntax, or semantics. Supposing that there even are some universal semantic features (or a ‘Universal Grammar’, a non-settled hypothesis), it seems that the mass/count distinction is not among them (again—not settled). Then it seems that the linguistically-guided metaphysician must accept either that a ‘metaphysically serious’ distinction between stuff and things cannot be maintained whatsoever, or, it can be. If it can be, it must be in some watered-down fashion. (E.g., maybe reality contains neither stuff nor things, but has beings which can be regarded either way—cf. Pelletier 2001). It may be that the most universal commonalities of all human language will not impose nearly as much structure or guidance as linguistically-guided metaphysicians would wish, at least as regards mass vs. count.

Alternatively, one can be a Mass/Count Skeptic, and, while not ceasing to do metaphysics, or theorize about the difference between ‘stuff’/’matter’ and ‘things’/’individuals,’ cease relying on the mass/count distinction to do the lion’s share of work in deciding whether there is such a corresponding ontological difference in the world. (cf. Pelletier 2011, §3.2). That’s not what it’s there for.

While the reservations expressed in this section may seem pessimistic, they are not, as these observations are serving to move us forward. Much exciting and useful work is being done and remains to be done on the mass/count distinction, as mentioned below, and linguistically-guided metaphysicians will have a role to play in this inter-disciplinary work. It may just be that metaphysicians will have to become more nuanced in their appreciation of mass vs. count, as there will likely become ever more fine-grained distinctions and qualifications to consider.[24]

Furthermore, the direction of the vast growing empirical data needs to be reckoned with, which makes early oracular pronouncements from the armchair seem quaint. Linguistically-guided metaphysicians working at the crossroads of philosophy of language, logic, and metaphysics, need not merely follow the lead of linguists and semanticists, but can, and should, play a role in this work, as they come at this topic with different concerns and different skill-sets which matter. The considerations in this last section represent a tentative reappraisal of the value of continuing to practice a certain methodological stance in the light of recent developments. It could very well be that new data, and new theories could show how the distinction between mass and count actually is as important as many have thought, perhaps by resurrecting itself in a new guise, such as the distinction between +COUNT and -COUNT. Furthermore, we can never be sure what new discoveries will be made in fundamental physics which could suddenly make us re-evaluate, revise, abandon, or double-down on the picture we have of matter, ordinary objects, and their relations.

Mass expressions and their relations to count expressions, and how they are interpreted and employed by metaphysicians, offer us an interesting and voluminous case-study of recent metaphysics informed by lexical, semantic, and syntactic considerations. The careful student of this material can take away many cautionary tales, useful tools, and become aware of just how different the responses to the same linguistic data can be. This is a very difficult and woolly area of inquiry where there is little consensus. But interesting recent empirical work on mass and count expressions is being done which is shedding some new light on these issues, and there has been an explosion of recent work in linguistics which does seem to display genuine progress, the most fecund research being more heavily empirical than before. (For earlier empirically-informed work on this, see Casati 2005, and Frisson & Frazier 2005. For more recent relevant work, see Husić 2020, Kiss et al 2021a, Kiss et al 2017; Goddard & Wierzbicka 2014; Massam 2012; Moltmann 2020; and see the references mentioned in Pelletier 2012 p435).

Hopefully, philosophers can work together with linguists, computer scientists, cognitive scientists, and others to help achieve some kind of breakthrough that can comprehend the mass/count distinction, and in so doing situate it properly into a role it is well-suited for to help us understand more deeply the relations between mental representation, linguistic representation, and represented real-world entities.

The category of Stuff is still under-developed, and seems to be where the category Event was decades ago. Stuff and stuff-talk represent either (i) an important ontological category, which remains poorly understood, or, (ii) a distinct way of conceiving or talking about objects, where its interface with object-talk is, again, poorly understood. In the absence of consensus on the referents and logico-linguistic mechanics of mass expressions, controversy about stuff is bound to continue.


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Other Internet Resources

  • Pelletier, F.J., and L. Schubert, “Mass Expressions,” online manuscript available from the authors (a minor revision of their 1989).


Many people gave me extremely valuable feedback for this entry, or for material which preceded it. I would like to thank David Barnett, Henry Laycock, David Liebesman, Jim McCollum, Thomas McKay, David Nicolas, Jeff Pelletier, Joe Salerno, Adam Sennet, Irem Kurtsal Steen, Jim Stone, and especially Dean Zimmerman. The latter gave me an extraordinary amount of useful feedback and recommendations. I would also like to thank the editors of The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy for their patience. I would like to thank Boğaziçi University Scientific Research Fund for supporting my research for this work (Grant Number: 6668-12B02P1).

Revision Acknowledgments (July 2022). Many thanks go to Irem Kurtsal, Jeff Pelletier, Adam Sennet, and Dean Zimmerman for giving feedback on the newly added section 4. And many thanks go to Shamik Dasgupta who made helpful recommendations on re-structuring, among other helpful advice. And I thank the Editors, again, for their patience.

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