Supplement to The Metaphysics of Mass Expressions

Non-Atomicity and Its Relevance to the Mass/Count Distinction

We can call Link’s view “Lattice Theory” (1998) and Bunt’s is called “Ensemble Theory”. Neither theory recommends adding non-individual entities to the domain. Rather, in the case of Link, the notion of individuals is construed to be non-domain specific and as extensionally neutral as possible—‘individuals’ count as any kind of entity whatsoever. So, the notion of ‘individuals’ is expanded to include mass and plural entities in addition to objects. In the case of Bunt normal individuals and mass entities are both treated as individuals, which differ in whether they are ‘discrete’ or ‘continuous’, respectively (in our terminology of section 1.4, ‘heterogeneous’ or ‘non-atomic’, respectively).

Both theories are put forth in a non-metaphysical spirit, the authors being somewhat agnostic about the real nature of the reference of mass expressions. Part of the advantage of these approaches is that they are most likely consistent with various metaphysical interpretations—their proponents being in the business of offering an economical and faithful logico-linguistic ideology rather than offering a fleshed out or prescriptive ontology. Both accounts, despite their seeming neutrality, cannot help but invite empirical and metaphysical worries and objections, since they imply that the folk are implicitly committed to matter being both infinitely divisible and distinct from the objects they constitute. Since we have previously discussed the problems with stuff-thing or plural-thing dualisms, we will skip discussion of the difficulties of this dualism as such. We will, however, discuss how these accounts differentiate masses from singular individuals. The difference is that masses (as opposed to singular individuals) are non-atomic.

Due to space constraints we will focus on Link. As we will use as few technicalities as possible to get the gist of the view, we will not do complete justice to its sophistication and nuance.

Link argues that an adequate algebraic formal semantics for natural language needs plural and mass individuals in addition to singular ones. The argument for this is the formal fecundity of this procedure and how the resultant system correctly demarcates valid from invalid inferences featuring mass expressions in a consistent and explanatory manner.

Suppose we have a toy domain \(A_1\) with only three particular atomic entities in it—\(a, b\), and \(c\). Suppose they each satisfy the singular predicate \(F\), and have no proper parts which are \(F\). Suppose there is a join relation which combines particular individuals to make plural individuals only (call it a plural join or ‘\(p\)-join’). When we have the (non-set-theoretic and non-mereologically interpreted) union of \(a\) and \(b, a\) and \(c\), and \(b\) and \(c\), it will be signified this way: \(a \cup_p b , a \cup_p c , b \cup_p c\). This results in an extension of domain \(A_1\)—call it \(A_2\). We can think of the \(p\)-join forming a lattice structure with \(A_2\) on top, which contains three nodes with two connections each to the atoms of \(A_1.\) \(A_2\) contains all the plural entities which are doubles. But, we can iterate \(p\)-join for a third level \(A_3\) in the lattice which contains \(a \cup_p b \cup_p c\), or the triple plural entity. The singular predicate \(F\) will be neither cumulative (i.e., it is not true of the joins which are \(F\)s, for example, if ‘\(F\)’ is ‘Man’, and \(a, b\), and \(c\) are each a man, then the plural individual \(a \cup_p b\) is not a man), nor is it distributive over the proper parts of the atoms of \(A_1\) (more on this later). Call the plural predicate of \(F\) ‘\(F^*\)’. \(F^*\) will be distributive over all non-terminal nodes or joins of individuals in \(A_1\) on up which are not single \(F\)s but are composed of \(F\)s. \(F^*\) will also be cumulative on up the lattice for any joins of \(F\)s. This system is nice and tidy and is extended so that we can say what we want to about plural and singular entities and their relations. Certain predicates of plural joins will be stipulated to be non-distributive, such as ‘form a circle,’ while others are seen to be systematically ambiguous, such as ‘carry’ (e.g., “the students carried furniture”) which can, when applied to plural joins, be either distributive or not, depending on the disambiguation.

We can then construct a domain \(B\) out of \(A_1\) and assume it contains a subsystem of mass entities which contains all of the stuff which makes up \(a, b\), and \(c\). On our initial assumption \(a, b\), and \(c\) are the only singular individuals in \(A_1\). So the stuff making up \(a\)–\(c\) is not a singular individual or composed of singular entities. The entities in \(B\) are then related to those in \(A_1\) on up by various mapping functions or homomorphisms (e.g., ‘the stuff of \(a\)’, which we can refer to by “\(a_s\)”). We can also formulate a different join relationship, or \(s\)-join, which holds between different stuff portions, such as the stuff which makes up \(a\) and \(b\), which we could indicate as \(a_s \cup_s b_s\). This allows us to develop an additional lattice structure alongside that of the plural individuals. Predicates of the mass individuals can be tagged as either distributive or cumulative, based on our inferential use. If \(a, b\), and \(c\) are all spatially extended and made up of the same kind of completely homogenous and non-atomistic stuff \(K\), then if ‘is\(-K\)’ is true of the mass individuals \(a_s\) and \(b_s\), then it will be true of their join, as well as true of every proper part of all joins and mass individuals that we started with. These distinctions also help us model each disambiguation of sentences such as “Mephistopheles passed the potatoes.”

One important point to note is that the various part-relationships (each of which forms a partial ordering) in the singular, plural, and mass individual domains do not carry across domains. Call the ‘part-of’ relation in the plural domain ‘\(pp\lt\)’, in the stuff domain ‘\(s\lt\)’. The stuff of \(a\) is part of the join of the stuff of \(a\) and \(b (a_s s\lt a_s \cup_s b_s)\), but the stuff of \(a\) is not a \(pp\)-part of \(a \cup_p b\), nor is the plural individual \(a \cup_p b\) an \(s\)-part of \(a_s \cup_s b_s \cup_s c_s\). Furthermore, the stuff of \(a\) is not an improper \(s\)- or \(pp\)-part of \(a\) either, since the stuff of \(a\) is stipulated to be distinct from \(a\).

These multifarious part relationships give us certain advantages. On classical extensional mereology, if two entities have all the same proper parts, then they are identical. So, since a puddle and its water have the same parts, then they are identical. But then, either the puddle can survive evaporation or the water cannot. These problems arise largely from assuming that the domain of predication is ‘flat’, which is to say that all the entities are of the same kind, e.g., singular/particular individuals, and that predicates (‘part-of’ predicates included) which apply to a singular individual also apply to the stuff making it up. But Link’s system distinguishes different kinds of individuals, so that we can comprehensibly assert of two entities with all the same proper parts, such as a ring and its constituent gold, that the ring is new, whereas the gold is old. This also allows us to differentiate between, for instance, a committee (singular individual), some members of the committee (plural individual), and the matter making them up (mass individual). Any comprehensive treatment of mass, plural, and singular individuals will need to differentiate between the different ways concepts chop up the entire domain of discourse, or, so to speak, lay down different matrices which allow predicates to apply to entities at one level of the lattice (e.g., hydrogen) but not others (e.g., gas bubble), and Link accounts for all this (cf. the notion of ‘covering’ in Gillon 1992, 1996; Nicolas 2008). Of course, this account entails coincidence, which Link happily endorses, since the proliferation of entities, although strange, is supported by our language use, which “seems to function that way” (1998, p. 16). Link’s argument for this is somewhat peremptory:

if we have, for instance, two expressions a and b that refer to entities occupying the same place at the same time but have different sets of predicates applying to them, then the entities referred to are simply not the same. From this it follows that my ring and the gold making up my ring are different entities. (1998, p. 16)

If these entities are metaphysically distinguished in a strong manner, then Link’s theory will inherit all of the problems of coincidence mentioned above, the ontological oddness of which undermines the appeal of the formal elegance.

Problems arise from the contention that what distinguishes mass individuals from singular and plural ones is that mass entities have no smallest parts—“The denotations of mass terms like water are quantities. They differ from pluralities in that they don’t have smallest parts.” This is very strange, since modern science tells us that water does have smallest parts—H2O molecules. How can formal semantics inform us of the structure of matter? At the best it can inform us of how language users believe matter is structured. Link almost never, and certainly never convincingly, argues that stuffs have no smallest parts, and certainly not that stuff is necessarily non-atomic. But, in Link’s defense, he never intended his semantics to tell us what the structure of matter is. He is intending to give us a good semantic representation, and

a semantic representation usually gives no more than a model of the phenomena to be described, and there is no claim about the ‘real nature’ of the things in the domain of discourse. (1998, p. 190)

His defense of the treatment of mass terms as being non-atomic is as follows. Many of our inferences featuring mass terms are distributive, which implies that stuffs are infinitely divisible and have no smallest parts according to the correct semantic modeling. Our talk of singular and ‘plural individuals’ is not distributive. So, if we want to give the right formal semantics to model our language use, we ought to do so in a way which attributes to mass entities the properties the folk imply they have. The right way to validate folk inferences with regards to masses is to model them as non-atomic (see 1998, pp. 189–90). Since Link’s project is to develop formal semantics and not lay down metaphysics, then the best route to go is to lay down the most accurate formal semantics for our use, and if it seems to imply that reality is a certain way that maybe it is not, then so be it.

However, it is questionable that the folk and their use of mass expressions (at the macroscopic level) commit them to a view regarding atomicity. Laycock, for instance, states that folk usage shows that we are implicitly committed to an atomic theory of matter, whereas others (e.g., Gillon 1992), perhaps more plausibly, argue that the folk and their mass expression use often underdetermines whether the reference of mass expressions are atomic or not.[cite] Ancient Greeks philosophers, for instance, can be seen to go either way.

Against the contention of the non-atomist, there are many atomic mass terms. ‘Furniture’ and ‘silverware’ are both mass and atomic. The folk use many mass terms, such as ‘hair’ or ‘fur’, which they know has individual parts—individual hairs. Against the atomist, there are also count terms which are non-atomic (see Nicolas 2002 and 2004). Aggregates can have other aggregates as parts. One of the Pope’s crowns is made up of crowns. A pregnant bird can have a bird as part of it. Geometrical plane figures have plane figures as parts.

Pelletier in (2011) criticizes such semi-lattice approaches, despite having recommended one himself in the past (Pelletier & Schubert 1989). He asks us to consider ‘mass terms’ such as ‘cutlery,’ ‘jewelry,’ ‘footware’ and so on, namely, mass terms which fit the standard lexical and semantic criteria for being +MASS,

It is unfortunate perhaps that Link makes so much of the supposed non-atomicity of stuffs, but it is built into the semantics and lattice structure in such a way that if the non-atomic postulation is dropped, then the framework would have to be re-worked completely. If Link allows stuffs to be atomic, then there is nothing to distinguish them from singular entities. Hence the domain would become ‘flatter’, and Link would have to give up some of his account’s distinctives.

Developing a formally satisfactory, descriptive theory of mass terms whose formal structure’s commitments is in tension with empirical theory, such as Bunt and Link do, has its drawbacks. This requires doing the semantics twice over, if we have reason to believe the world is not as the folk believe it to be. As Koslicki puts it,

Bunt suggests that nouns that standardly have mass-occurrences allow us to speak of things they apply to as if these were infinitely divisible, even if, as a matter of empirical fact, they are not…. But this approach requires two levels of semantic theory: one level is, as Bunt would put it, ‘purely linguistic’ and has nothing to do with the real-world referents of our words. The other incorporates facts concerning the actual referents, such as the fact that water actually consists of H2O molecules. (1999, fn. 41)

It seems that accounts like Link’s and Bunt’s require us to either ignore empirical atomicity of stuffs or to postulate a bridge between the two-level analyses so that the non-atomicity of the formal algebra can be linked with the atomicity of stuffs in the world. So, we must either be empirical ostriches or do our semantics twice over.

One line of defense that Link and Bunt could take is to claim that properties such as ‘being some water’ are sometimes relational. That is, water is water all the way through, regardless of atomic theory. This is because to be some water is either to be a water molecule, a collection of them, or a proper part or sum of proper parts of a water molecule. An electron, for instance, in a H2O molecule is also some water, in virtue of its contributing to the realization of a water molecule. A blueberry in a fruitcake is some fruitcake. This might seem extravagant, but it can be motivated by the resulting account’s problem-solving power. Note that while this might be plausible or at least somewhat motivated for concrete mass nouns, it is implausible for concrete quasi-mass nouns such as ‘furniture’ or ‘cutlery’.

While this was not their goal, it is clear that some metaphysicians might motivate a distinction between things and stuff by appealing to the formal work of Bunt and Link. It is not clear, however, whether the formal fecundity of this approach does sufficiently motivate this kind of view.

There have been other related attempts to distinguish mass vs count in terms of non-atomicity (or not) which could have metaphysical ramifications.

For example, Landman (2011) lays out an intriguing framework which distinguishes mass from count nouns not on the basis of infinite dissectivity or non-atomicity, rather, mass nouns come in two kinds: ‘mess mass nouns’ (e.g. meat and beer); and ‘neat mass nouns’ (e.g. furniture and cutlery). Mass is distinguished from count in terms of syntax, but ‘mess mass nouns,’ while distinguished from count nouns in syntactical terms, are distinguished from ‘neat mass nouns’ in that a mess mass noun’s associated concept under-determines which of the many acceptable, more precise, distinct, but overlapping ways it will partition the substance. Neat Mass Nouns, like cutlery, however, are associated with particular units (e.g. fork, knife) which do impose a single partitioning upon the referent group or stuff, and in this way the principles of individuation are sub-contracted out to the unit items’ associated individual kind terms. But the problem with this is that by trying to render meat to be more like water than cutlery, and water is given a mess mass noun treatment, this has a similar effect to a problem that plagued Link. For both Link and Landman water is non-atomic, it is just that the explanation is different. For Link, it is because it is infinitely dissective, for Landman, it is because of overlapping generators, but both end up with lonely H2O molecules or gold atoms not being water or gold (see p. 33). It gets hard to see how, given real-world atomicity of things like water, that these supposed mess mass nouns are not actually neat, the only actual mess mass nouns being what is referred to in 2.1 as ‘fuzzy atomless’ substance terms. Landman, though, is not attempting to make bold metaphysical conclusions from his treatment. The problem noted here is more about how a metaphysician cannot really exploit these differences to shed light on real-world metaphysical differences. The semantic treatments are likely tools for a different job.

Copyright © 2022 by
Mark Steen <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free