Supplement to The Metaphysics of Mass Expressions

Sums and Ordinary Objects

1. Coincidentalism

If one is a realist about both ordinary objects and sums, and takes parsimony about ontological categories seriously, then coincidentalism is an appealing position. While both ordinary objects and sums (which are also objects) exist, they cannot be identical, since the clay can both pre-exist the statue it constitutes, and can survive past the statue being crushed. Furthermore, the clay (one might think) cannot lose any parts and persist, yet the statue can survive, say, the loss of a finger.

There are other reasons to distinguish ‘mere sums’ from the ordinary objects they constitute. Ordinary objects seem to fall under certain count sortals (e.g., table, cat) which are associated with certain persistence conditions. Yet stuff kinds and fusions of fundamental particles do not fall under commonsense count kind terms. Some water per se is not identical to pools and droplets and cubes, and a proton and electron are not identical to the hydrogen atom they constitute (since their persistence conditions are distinct). The only type of count-terms which will refer to sums (regardless of their arrangement) are cooked up technical terms, such as quantity, fusion, parcel, portion, hunk, aggregate, and so on.

If we allow coincidence, there are many problems (see the entry on material constitution for details.) We will discuss just one objection in any depth—the so called ‘supervenience objection’ or ‘grounding problem’, first pointed out by Burke (1992; see also Rea 1997; Sider 2008 and Zimmerman 1995 for more details on this problem). Consider the putative coincidence of a table and the wood that makes it up. Is the wood table shaped? Yes. Can the wood support objects? Yes. Is the wood made out of all the same material the table is? Yes. The wood is starting to sound a lot like a table.

The upshot of this is that if a thing’s kind is determined by its intrinsic properties, then the wood and table should be of the same kind. How could they differ in kind? The tempting answer is that they differ in kind because they have different modal properties, that is, they survive or are destroyed under different circumstances. But how do we know that they have different modal properties? Because they are different in kind. The explanation of their difference appears circular (Zimmerman 1995, pp. 87–90).

But, ‘colocationists’ or ‘coincidentalists’ are happy to bite the bullet, or make some ameliorating moves (Sider 2008; Rudder Baker 2000, pp. 191–196). Colocationism does have some salutary features, as it explains what the constitution relation is—matter constitutes ordinary objects by sharing parts with them. The wood makes up a table, and a table comes into existence by the wood being arranged in a tablish way.

2. Ordinary Object Eliminativism

There are alternatives for a sum theorist who wants to reject coincidence. Chisholm was convinced that nothing can change parts. But, since common sense objects, if they exist, change parts, then there just cannot be any of them. Chisholm holds that ordinary objects, such as tables and chairs, which appear to change parts, are in fact successions of lumps of contiguous matter which have all of their parts essentially. He recommends a paraphrase of talk of ordinary objects which eliminates them from mention, since he contends that we can say everything we want to about ordinary objects by only mentioning sums or pieces of matter (1976, Appendix III). On this view, there really are no cars, tables, and mountains. The only objects are fundamental material entities and fusions of them. Chisholm calls ordinary objects ‘fictions’ or ‘logical constructions.’ This solves coincidence, since, if there are no ordinary objects they cannot very well coincide with sums. (Chisholm did not believe in 1976 in unrestricted mereology. He only believed in fusions of matter that are, we could say roughly, stuck together (1976, p. 153). He later changed his position for interesting reasons. See Steen 2008 for exegesis and critique).

So, ordinary objects go somewhat the way of ‘the average man’. They are constructed out of genuine things, but are not themselves genuine.

Another eliminativistic sum view is Michael Jubien’s (1993). What is distinctive about Jubien’s view is that (many) definite descriptions and proper names (e.g., the dining table, Obama), “do not designate at all. Instead they are disguised predicates…” (1993, p. 65).

Strictly speaking, Descartes does not exist. What does exist is stuff, some which has the property of being-Descartes: The property of being-Descartes is just a phase of some stuff which is not essentially Descartes. For Jubien, the only objects that really exist are masses of stuff.

Any physical stuff in spacetime is a thing. The thing is nothing more nor less than the stuff. (2003, p. 9)

But Jubien does not restrict his objects via contiguity or simultaneity, like Chisholm. Jubien agrees with Quine that a physical object

comprises simply the content, however heterogeneous, of some portion of space-time, however disconnected and gerrymandered. (Quine 1960, p. 171)

This view also solves, among other things, the paradox of coincidence:

It is hard to deny the intuition that there is only one thing in the region. But there is no need to go to extravagant lengths to maintain it. On my view there is but one thing in the region. It has the property of being a lump of clay. It has the property of being a statue…There are no mysteries or extravagances here…There are just things and their properties. (Jubien 1993, p. 38)

This is somewhat nonchalant, since the view entails that there is some stuff which is the gold in Fort Knox at noon and the mercury on Mercury at 12:30, and that some stuff has the property of being Descartes, yet nothing exists which is identical with Descartes.

While these views do solve problems of coincidence with sums, it could be argued that they do so at too great a cost, since maintaining that ordinary objects exist, in addition to sums, is a desiderata if one wishes one’s view to gel with commonsense.

3. Dual Category Views

Some views seek to maintain the existence of both sums and ordinary objects, and attempt to ameliorate coincidence by interpreting sums and ordinary objects as different kinds of entities. Two different kinds of things in the same place at the same time is often unproblematic. For example, an object can coincide with its spatial region, or a top (object) with its spinning (event).

On Grandy’s function view, masses of matter such as some water are mere sums, and commonsense objects are identified as functions from times to masses of matter (1975). So, a ring is a relation between times and a hunk or (if it changes parts) hunks of matter. This has the drawback that ordinary objects become abstract, among other problems (Zimmerman 1995, p. 92).

There are also views according to which ordinary objects are disturbances in masses of matter (Karmo 1977) or ‘modes’ of the masses (Chisholm 1986, pp. 66–70) or processes that the masses are engaged in. On these kinds of views, ordinary objects stand to masses in a similar way that a wave stands to the water it flows through. The wave is not identical to the portions of water which it flows through—the wave is something the water is doing. These are dual-category views—masses and processes are both irreducible to anything else. These are unlike Whitehead’s monocategorial process view where there are only processes (1978).

One intriguing exposition of this view is found in Toomas Karmo’s “Disturbances”:

…a stream is a species of disturbance, where a disturbance is definable as an object or entity found in some other object—not in the sense in which a letter may be found in an envelope, or a biscuit in a tin, but in the sense in which a knot may be in a rope, a wrinkle in a carpet…or a bulge in a cylinder. One way of telling whether an object X is ‘in’ an object Y in the sense peculiar to disturbances is to enquire whether X can migrate through Y…That which a disturbance is in is its medium; a stream is a disturbance in that total consignment of water which is now, has at any time in the past been, or will at any time the future be found in it. The process which is the flowing of a stream may equally well be described as a stream’s migrating through a quantity of water. (1977, p. 147)

Ordinary objects are substrate-changing processes which ‘pass through’ masses which do not themselves change their parts. A stream is a disturbance in some water, and a person is a disturbance which passes through portions of flesh (see also Zimmerman 1995, pp. 71–72, 107–110).

Chisholm also seemed to embrace such a view at one time (1986, pp. 66–70). Only masses are things, and part-changing entities such as a ship are in fact substrate-changing modes. These modes can ‘move,’ in a form of substrate-migration similar to Karmo’s disturbances which move through a medium:

If a substrate is a ship, then it has a mode which is also a ship. If the substrate ceases to be a ship, and if the mode does not transfer to another substrate, then that mode ceases to be. And if, in such a case, the substrate continues to be, then it would have other modes. (1986, pp. 66–67, italics his)

Such an account would have the benefits of analyzing concrete mass expressions as referring to masses of matter, while also explaining away coincidence. The coincidence between, say, some clay and a statue is explained away since these are not two things in the same place at the same time—rather, the clay (object) is engaged in the activity of statueing. But, actually, coincidence is between at least three candidate entities—the piece of clay, the clay itself, and the statue. On this kind of account, since anything other than sums are activities, then we can say that the clay is both piecing and statueing. The immediate reply to this is that such an account replaces the coincidence of objects with that of processes. The counter-reply is that coincidence of processes, such as a sphere’s spinning and expanding, is benign (Steen 2008, pp. 50–53).

This account, despite its apparent promise, is underdeveloped, and, consequently, has had little attention paid to it. One can see, however, some similarities between this account and Jubien’s, were Jubien’s properties (e.g., being-George-Bush) replaced with activities (e.g., George-Bushing).

Copyright © 2022 by
Mark Steen <>

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