Notes to Monism

1. It is perhaps more common for the bundle theorist to claim reductionism about concrete objects than to claim eliminativism (Hoffman and Rosenkrantz 1997: 26–7; Paul 2002: 579–80). But it would be at least consistent to accept (i) the bundle theorist’s property ontology and (ii) that bundles of compresent properties are not fit to serve as concrete objects. This would yield the sort of nihilism contemplated in the main text.

2. For Frege, the external phenomenon is conceptualized via a sortal term (e.g., via “copse” or “tree”), which provides an associated unit. See Alston and Bennett 1984 for some further discussion.

3. Thus Aristotle (Meta. 998b22; see also Post. Anal. 92b14) argues that if entity (or unity) were the highest type, there could be no differentia:

But it is not possible that there should be one genus of entities, or that unity or entity should be such; for it is necessary, indeed, that the differences of each genus both exist, and that each should be one: but it is impossible either for the species to be predicated about the proper differences of the genus, or for the genus to subsist, independent of the species itself. Wherefore, if unity or entity be a genus, neither will entity or unity constitute any difference.

4. The lack of a natural type/token distinction for abstracta may be connected to the idea that abstracta do not exist in spacetime. Though see Lewis 1986 for discussion of different ways to draw the abstract/concrete distinction.

5. Thus Plato (1961: 744;) Republic VI: 508e–509b) compares the form of the good to the sun, concluding:

This reality, then, that gives their truth to the objects of knowledge and the power of knowing to the knower, you must say is the idea of good…

And then adding:

the objects of knowledge not only receive from the presence of the good there being known, but their very existence and essence is derived to them from it, …

In this vein, Stace (1955: 79) comments:

[Plato’s] own Absolute, the world of Ideas, is a many in one. It is many because it contains many Ideas. It is one because these Ideas constitute a single organized system of Ideas under the final unity of the Idea of the Good.

6. Here classical mereology and atomism are assumed. Other conceptions of mereology will generate different counts. On the nihilist extreme, the total number of parts just is the number of atomic parts. Classical mereology without atoms (“gunk”) will generate a minimum of continuum-many parts but zero atomic parts. For further discussion of mereological systems, see Simons 1987.

7. See Broad (1925: 17–38) for a partly related taxonomy. Broad distinguishes three forms of monism: (i) Differentiating-Attribute Monism, which concerns the number of realms of substances (e.g., whether there is only the material realm); (ii) Specific-Property Monism, which concerns the number of kinds in a realm (e.g., whether there is only one kind of material substance); and (iii) Substantival Monism, which concerns the number of substances in a realm (e.g., whether there is only one material substance token). Broad (1925: 33) recommends a “tentative acceptance of a form of Substantival Monism,” which is something like priority monism, explaining that he has:

granted that the typical material substances of ordinary life, viz., human bodies, chairs, trees, etc., are only imperfectly substantial, since they are transitory and incapable of existing in isolation. And I have granted that the solar system, and still more the whole material realm, can claim a higher degree of substantiality.

8. I will not discuss genus monism, substance monism, or property monism further here partly because they raise almost entirely distinct sets of issues, and partly because they are already covered elsewhere in this encyclopedia. See the entries on categories (Thomasson 2013) and on dualism (Robinson 2011).

9. These interpretations are controversial. Parmenides: See Owen 1960 for a reading of Parmenides as an existence monist, and Curd 1998 for a rival reading of Parmenides as not a monist in any sense under current discussion. Melissus: See Sedely 1999 for a reading of Melissus as an existence monist. Spinoza: See J. Bennett 1984 and 1991 for a reading of Spinoza as an existence monist, see Curley 1969 and 1991 for a reading of Spinoza as more like a priority monist, and see Guigon 2012 for an intermediary speaking to this very issue. Bradley: Bradley (1994: 138) explicitly speaks of plurality as “an integral aspect in a substantial unity,” and (1994: 141) says that the One “embraces every partial diversity in concord,” summarizing (1994: 178): “The Reality, therefore, must be One, not as excluding diversity, but as somehow including it in such a way as to transform its character.” But it is not obvious how to interpret Bradley’s talk about “aspects” and “diversity.” Indeed, given Bradley’s background skepticism as to our grasp of the positive nature of Reality, he might best be described as a monist who is skeptical of deciding between existence and priority monism. See Candlish and Basile 2013 (espec. §6) for further discussion.

10. J. Bennett (1984: 103–6) evinces sympathy for the existence monism (‘field metaphysic’) he attributes to Spinoza, so perhaps should be counted here as well. Della Rocca (2008: 46–58) likewise is sympathetic to a Spinozan metaphysics of one substance with many modes. Though he (2014: 291–2) endorses a Brtadleyan argument against relations and says that this may require some “view that goes beyond pluralism and beyond monism,” since: “[O]nce relations are out of the picture not only may we have to give up any multiplicity of things, but we may not even be able to rest with even one thing.”

Rea (2001: 129) provides a defense of “Eleatic monism,” understood as including the claim that “There exists exactly one material thing.” But Rea’s (2001: 147) proposal for reconciling Eleatic monism with experience is to hold that “we are not denizens of the material world.” This makes his monism far more restrictive than existence monism (perhaps it is best understood as substance dualism plus material existence monism: monism about the material objects as counted by tokens), and makes his claim to represent the actual Eleatic view rather questionable. Further, Rea’s final conclusion (2001: 147) is merely that such a monism counts as “a coherent (even if counterintuitive, even if false) metaphysic.”

11. Indeed, Horgan and Potrč (2000: 50; 2008: 165) seem committed to spacetime and properties, in describing the blobject as having “enormous spatiotemporal structural complexity, and enormous local variability.” Thus they say that “the jello-world might occasionally exhibit quite abrupt local spatial and temporal variations, in the degree to which various magnitudes are locally instantiated.” This looks to require the existence of various locales and various magnitudes, in addition to their one concretum. Though perhaps here they are merely speaking indirectly (for further discussion see Tienson 2002 and Horgan and Potrč 2008: 175–78).

12. Thus Joad (1957: 428) comments: “During the last century Monistic Idealism commanded a larger measure of agreement among philosophers than has been accorded to any other philosophy since the Middle Ages.” And Blanshard (1973: 145) says:

With the appearance of the Tractatus in 1922, British philosophy has completed a full circle in ten years. In 1912 has appeared Bosanquet’s Principle of Individuality and Value, whose thesis was that the world was a single individual whose parts are connected with each other by a necessity so intimate and so organic that the nature of the part depended on its place in the Absolute. A decade later found Wittgenstein maintaining that the very opposite was the truth, that a full knowledge of the world, instead of revealing it as a complete unity, would pulverize it into atoms.

13. See Schaffer 2007 for further discussion. There is a question of whether the existence monist can establish systematic paraphrase techniques. See Sider 2008 (especially. 138–44) for a monistic construction of “microworld fictions”, based on the idea of primitive statespace structure.

14. For further discussion see Horgan and Potrč 2008 (esp. ch. 3), Korman 2008, and Schaffer 2012.

15. For more on the truthmaker view of commitment see Heil 2003, Armstrong 2004, Cameron 2008a and 2010a, and Schaffer 2008.

16. Presumably the existence monist or nihilist who would bite the bullet would do so as part of a general distrust of intuitions. This raises fundamental issues about the methodology of metaphysics. It is troubling that intuitions in this domain prove so unstable. Here one might recall Bosanquet’s (quoted in Muirhead 1935: 243) explanation of why he did not trouble to give arguments for idealism: “I don’t think it important,” since after all: “the universe is so obviously experience.”

17. The following argument is adapted from Schaffer 2007. Perhaps something like this argument is also behind Horgan and Potrč’s existence monism, which is posited (2000: §2.4) as the most parsimonious of the non-vague ontologies. While Horgan and Potrč do not actually give the exclusion argument, presumably they also hold the sufficiency of their monistic ontology, so that the gain in parsimony does not come at any explanatory price. To that extent their motivations may be best understood via the exclusion argument. (Horgan and Potrč’s argument from vagueness is discussed below in §2.2.3)

18. In this vein, Albert 1996 argues that the most natural ontology of both Newtonian and quantum mechanics is in terms of a single world-atom zipping through configuration space.

19. 6 might also be defended on ontological and/or epistemic grounds. The ontological defense of 6 would invoke the Eleatic Stranger’s dictum from Plato’s Sophist, that to be is to have causal power. But this seems implausible: epiphenomenal entities are surely conceivable, which is good evidence that they are possible. The epistemic defense of 6 would maintain that we have no good reason for believing in explanatorily redundant and epiphenomenal entities. But this seems parasitic on Occamite principles. For further discussion see the exchange between Sider 2003 and Merricks 2003.

20. The reader familiar with the debate on mereological composition may note that this argument is quite similar to the mereological nihilist’s argument that only the atomic parts exist (Merricks 2001: 56). The proper lesson is that explanatory exclusion arguments can be used to argue either against the parts or against the wholes. (These arguments are best understood as arguments that we should not posit both). If considerations of ontological economy are brought to bear, it seems that the existence monist’s version of the argument is preferable. See Schaffer 2007 for further discussion.

21. By “the world” is meant only the whole concrete cosmos, and not any kind of trans-categorical sum (e.g., the sum of all entities across all categories). For further discussion of the latter see the exchange between Simons 2003 and Varzi 2006.

22. For instance, Hartle and Hawking 1983 (in a classic paper entitled “Wave function of the Universe”) attempt to write down the wave function of the world (!) And here are some of the opening lines of the final chapter of a standard college physics textbook (Young and Freedman 2004):

Fundamental particles are the smallest things in the universe, and cosmology deals with the biggest thing there is—the universe itself.

23. The view that composition is identity is defended in Baxter 1988. See Lewis 1991, Armstrong 1997, Sider 2006, and Bohn 2014 for further discussion. Caveat: Lewis, Armstrong, and Sider all defend a view labeled “weak composition-as-identity,” which is really the view that composition is not identity, but merely analogous to it in many respects. This weaker (and perhaps more plausible) thesis will not support resistance to 2. As long as whole and part are not identical, the question “why posit both?” will arise.

24. As Sider (2006: §3) points out, the “set-like structure” of pluralities is crucial to the theoretical role of the plural quantifiers in standing in for sets (e.g., in the definition of the ancestral relation), interpreting second-order logic, and comparing the cardinalities of pluralities too big to form sets.

25. Relativization to a target and a unit (as recommended for all numerical predication: §1) may undermine this argument. Perhaps the one copse/five trees are both one relative to the unit “copse” but five relative to “tree.”

26. This is the conclusion of Schaffer 2007 (cf. Schaffer 2012: 87–89). There Schaffer suggests that this modified version of Occam’s Razor (“the Laser”) supports priority monism, with its one basic concretum. For further defense of the Laser see Schaffer 2015 and Bennett 2017 (220–25), though for criticisms see Baron and Tallant 2018 and Fiddaman and Rodriguez-Pereyra 2018.

27. Along these lines, Descartes (1644 [1984]: 196) says:

We should notice something very well known by the natural light: nothingness possesses no attributes or qualities. It follows that, whenever we find some attributes or qualities, there is necessarily some thing or substance to be found for them to belong to; …

28. See Schaffer 2010a (app.) and 2010b (§1) for some further historical discussion. Joad (1957: 420) characterizes the core monistic thesis as the thesis that whole is prior to part:

The wholes emphasized by monistic philosophers are, therefore, logically prior to their parts. They are there, as it were, to begin with, and being there, proceed to express themselves in parts whose natures they pervade and determine.

29. One exception is Schaffer 2010a, 2010b, inter alia. Another exception may be Campbell (1990: 146), for whom the basic entities are tropes, and the basic tropes are worldwide fields: “All basic tropes are space-filling fields, each one of them distributes some quantity, perhaps in varying intensities, across all of space-time.” So if Campbell forms basic objects by compresent bundles of basic tropes (as would be thematic for him), then he would be a priority monist. In this vein, Campbell (1990: 154) concludes: “We would reach Spinoza’s conclusion, that there is just one genuine substance, the cosmos itself…” Yet another exception may be Cameron (2010b) who argues that the truthmaker theorist should take her totality fact to be the one and only fundamental fact. This is clear a monism of some sort (one fundamental fact) but it is not priority monism as characterized, and gives no metaphysical pride of place to the cosmos as a whole.

30. The conflation of existence and priority monisms may have arisen with Russell. Thus Russell (1918 [1985]: 36) sometimes treats his monistic opponents as if they were existence monists who viewed ‘parts’ as merely: “phases and unreal divisions of a single indivisible Reality.” But Russell sometimes treats the issue as one of priority rather than existence, as in (1911 [2003]: 92): “the existence of the complex depends on the existence of the simple, and not vica versa.” In any case it is important to distinguish the view that the world has no proper parts, from the view that the world has dependent proper parts.

31. Priority nihilism as defined includes a variety of diverse views, including views that things get ever more basic without limit (“turtles all the way down”), as well as views on which basicness is a defective notion.

32. In Schaffer 2010a, “priority monism” is formulated as per Priority monism (cosmic). This is perhaps terminologically unfortunate, since there is room for interesting doctrines that uphold Priority monism but deny Priority monism (cosmic) in virtue of denying certain background mereological assumptions. For instance, Guigon 2012 defends an interpretation of Spinoza as neither an existence monist nor a priority monist. On Guigon’s interpretation, Spinoza is a fictionalist about mereology who holds that there are many things (existence pluralist) and that there is one basic thing, but would reject any mereological definition of the one basic thing. In a partially related vein Kriegel 2012 defends a “Kantian monism” which allies the idea of one basic thing with a demotion of mereological notions to the status of response-dependent notions.

33. See Fine 2001 and 2012, Schaffer 2009a and 2016, Rosen 2010, and K. Bennett 2011 and 2017, for influential discussions of grounding. Though for some skeptical reactions Hofweber 2009, Daly 2012, and Wilson 2014.

34. Ontological foundationalism is supported by the metaphysical intuition that being requires an ultimate ground. Without ontologically basic entities, being would be endlessly deferred, never achieved.

In this vein, Fine (1991: 267) suggests as natural the following ontological principle:

Foundation: Necessarily, any element of the ontology can be constructed from the basic elements of the ontology by means of constructors in the ontology.

See Cameron 2008b, and the essays collected in Bliss and Priest 2018, for further discussion.

35. Ontological foundationalism (without concreta foundationalism) is thus compatible with the following scenario: there is a sequence of priority relations which is limitless amongst concreta, but which has a limit in a basic entity of another ontological category. (Analogy: there is an infinite sequence of extended regions nested inside any given region in a pointy space. At the limit of this sequence are not extended regions but points.) This is what concreta foundationalism excludes.

36. Lewis’s (1986: ix) idea that what is fundamental is “just one little thing and then another” thereby expresses a pluralist view. For the monist, the entire cosmic scene is painted onto one vast unbroken slate.

37. For instance, Schaffer 2009b connects priority monism to the supersubstantivalist identification of objects with regions of spacetime, and Schaffer 2010c argues that a related “one fundamental fact only” monism helps with truthmaking for negative existentials.

38. Thus Aristotle (1987: 298) offers the following intuitive judgments on whether whole or part is prior:

If the parts are prior to the whole, and the acute angle is a part of the right angle and the finger a part of the animal, the acute angle will be prior to the right angle and the finger to the man. But the latter are thought to be prior; for in formula the parts are explained by reference to them, and in virtue also of the power of existing apart from the parts the wholes are prior.

39. Perhaps this explains the historical affinity between monism and idealism. In this vein, Joad (1957: 420) notes:

We entertain our ideas, we form our plans as wholes… The wholes of monistic philosophy are in this respect like mental wholes.

Though of course the monist need not be an idealist—the point is rather that the idealist is likely to be a monist.

40. Thus those who view the cosmos as a functionally integrated whole are likely to side with the priority monist. In this vein Marcus Aurelius (quoted in Rutherford 1989: 57) proclaims:

All things are woven together and the common bond is sacred,… for they have been arranged together in their places and together make the same ordered Universe. For there is one Universe out of all, one God through all, one substance and one law.”

41. See Schaffer 2010a §2.1 for further discussion, including an argument that by the lights of reflective common sense the decomposition of the cosmos into portions is arbitrary. See O’Conaill and Tahko 2012 for a reply.

42. See Barnes 2012 for some further conceptions of emergence.

43. See Healey 1991, Schaffer 2010, Morganti 2009, and Calosi 2014 and 2018 for further relevant discussion. Also see Bohn (2012: 218) for a different reply on behalf of the pluralist, which posits fundamental collective properties of pluralities:

The pluralist should simply say of the two particles that they have a quantum property Q. Having Q is a plural, collective intrinsic property of the two particles.

44. This remains neutral on whether metaphysical necessity should be understood as full-blown necessity, or as a restriction imposed on a larger space (which would include metaphysically impossible and perhaps even logically impossible points: see Nolan 1997 for a view with this character).

45. Though see Miller 2009 for an argument that the issue should be regarded as contingent. One consistent view would be to regard the issue as metaphysically necessary but contingent with respect to some larger space that includes metaphysically impossible points.

46. For further discussion on the possibility of gunk see Sider 1993, Zimmerman 1996, Hudson 2001, and Schaffer 2003. For general discussions of the extent of possibility see the volume edited by Gendler and Hawthorne 2002. Given a distinction between metaphysical possibility and a wider notion of conceptual possibility, there is also room for the pluralist to reply that gunk is conceptually possible but still not metaphysically possible. It is not clear how to assess claims of metaphysical possibility at this stage.

47. Tallant (2013) suggests that the possibility of both gunk as well as junk suggests that the framework of priority needs reconsideration. Saucedo (manuscript) defends a plural notion of fundamentality, and argues that the plurality of all things is a fundamental plurality, partly to accommodate both gunk and junk.

48. Bohn (2012: 216) provides a principle of finite fusion (any two things have a fusion), which, when combined with infinite atoms, will generate junky models. But no motivation for restriction composition to the finite case is offered. Indeed Bohn (2014) advocates composition as identity and argues that this entails unrestricted composition (which rules out junk).

49. The argument from heterogeneity equally arises against existence monism (§2), and the replies we consider are equally available for the existence monist.

50. Really this may be just a bad pun on ‘different.’ What is true is that nothing can be non-identical to itself. What is false is that nothing can be internally qualitatively diverse.

51. The scenario of heterogeneity all the way down is a gunky scenario (gunk being matter every part of which has proper parts). If gunk is possible then it seems that heterogeneity-all-the-way-down must be possible. For such constitutes a consistent distribution of properties over gunk.

52. This follows Parsons (2004), who offers examples such as being polka-dotted and being hot at one end and cold at the other, and invokes the possibility of heterogeneity-all-the-way-down to argue against the reductionist view that distributional properties derive from a plurality of homogeneous parts.

53. This maneuver looks to freely quantify over a plurality of regions, and so (barring any further treatment of regions) requires existence pluralism for the target of regions.

54. The idea of using adverbials is lifted from adverbialist theories of perception, such as Chisholm 1957. The adverbialist about perception replaces a plurality of objects of experience (sense-data) by a single subject sensing in different manners. So when I perceive red here and green there, the adverbialist says that I am sensing-herely red and sensing-therely green. Thus Burgess and Rosen (1997: 185–6; see also Johnston 1987, and Hawthorne and Cortens 1995) explain, in skeptical tones:

Nominalists are very moderate compared to monists, whose view is summarized by Prior [as]: ‘there is only a single genuine individual (the Universe) which gets John-Smithish or Mary-Brownish in such-and-such regions for such-and-such periods’. (David Lewis has pointed out that Prior really should say, ‘…regionally and periodically’.) And Mary Brown and John Smith don’t do anything: the Universe does things Mary-Brownishly and John-Smithishly.

55. For further discussion here see Sider 2001 (espec. pp. 92–8) and Lewis 2002. For a further approach involving regionalized tropes see McDaniel 2009.

56. Sider 2007b also offers arguments concerning combinatorial structure and haecceitistic differences. Though see Sider 2008 for a partial reconsideration, and see Cornell 2013 for a further reply. There is a great deal of unexplored ground here.

57. See Weatherson and Marshall 2012 for a useful overview. As Weatherson and Marshall show, there actually seem to be several distinct notions lumped under “intrinsic.” So it may be possible for the priority monist to give up on some of these notions as long as she preserves others and shows these capable of doing the needed work. This is largely unexplored terrain.

58. Indeed this is already a bad result for the monist, leaving aside any mention of intrinsicness. The moon and I are not duplicates. So it seems that the monist had better say that the moon and I differ intrinsically, to respect this claim.

59. For an attempt along these lines see Trogdon 2009, and for subsequent discussion of the proposal see the exchange between Skiles 2009 and Trogdon 2010.

60. For discussions of the idea that inrinsicness might best be regarded as a primitive notion see Eddon (2011: 334) and Skiles (2014).

61. For specific discussion of this aspect of the argument see Zimmerman forthcoming. For further general discussion of principles of modal combination, and the prospects for brute necessary connections, see Bricker 1991, Nolan 1996, Wilson 2010, and Weatherson 2015.

62. See Schaffer (2010b: §3) for further discussion, as well as Williams (2010) and Mumford (2004: 182) for similar claims.

63. “Humeanism” is being used in the sense popularized by David Lewis. Whether or not the historical Hume was a “Humean” in this sense is doubtful. See Strawson (2000) for a very different view of the historical Hume.

64. Segal (2014) argues from causal essentialism to a view he calls “mereological monism,” which supplements mereology with a “null object” that is part of everything, and that (by standard mereology) composes everything. Segal’s view explains necessary connections in nature through common parthood.

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