First published Mon Mar 19, 2007; substantive revision Mon Dec 10, 2018

There are many monisms. What they share is that they attribute oneness. Where they differ is in what they target and how they count.

This entry focuses on two of the more historically important monisms: existence monism and priority monism. Existence monism targets concrete objects and counts by tokens. This is the doctrine that exactly one concrete object token exists. Priority monism also targets concrete objects but counts by basic tokens. This is the doctrine that exactly one concrete object token is basic, and is equivalent to the classical doctrine that the whole is prior to its (proper) parts.

For roughly a century, neither existence nor priority monism was accorded much respect, nor were they even properly distinguished. Indeed, the tradition associated with these doctrines was long dismissed as being somewhere between obscure and ridiculous. But attitudes have evolved, because there are serious arguments for such monisms. Priority monism may especially deserve serious reconsideration.

Though this entry will focus on existence monism and priority monism, there are of course other historically important monisms, including substance monism. Substance monism targets concrete objects and counts by highest types. This is the doctrine that all concrete objects fall under one highest type (perhaps material, or mental, or some neutral underlying type: here the way divides). This topic is covered elsewhere in the encyclopedia (Robinson 2011).

1. Monisms

1.1 Many monisms

There are many monisms. What they share is that they attribute oneness. Where they differ is in what they attribute oneness to (the target), and how they count (the unit). So strictly speaking there is only monism relative to a target and unit, where monism for target \(t\) counted by unit \(u\) is the view that \(t\) counted by \(u\) is one.

Monisms are correlative with pluralisms and nihilisms. Where the monist for target \(t\) counted by unit \(u\) holds that \(t\) counted by \(u\) is one, her pluralist counterpart holds that \(t\) counted by \(u\) is many, and her nihilist counterpart holds that \(t\) counted by \(u\) is none. Among pluralists it is sometimes useful to single out the dualist: the dualist for \(t\) and \(u\) holds that \(t\) counted by \(u\) is two

To illustrate these various doctrines for various targets and units, let the target \(t_1 =\) concrete objects, and let the unit \(u_1 =\) highest type. To be a monist for \(t_1\) counted by \(u_1\) is to hold that concrete objects fall under one highest type. The materialist, idealist, and neutral monist are all monists of this sort (substance monism). They all agree that concrete objects fall under one highest type, disagreeing only over whether the one highest type is material, mental, or something deeper.

To be a pluralist for \(t_1\) counted by \(u_1\) is to hold that concrete objects fall under more than one highest type. The Cartesian dualist is a pluralist of this sort (substance dualism). She holds that concrete objects fall under two highest types: the material (with the primary attribute of extension), and the mental (with the primary attribute of thought).

To be a nihilist for \(t_1\) counted by \(u_1\) is to hold that concrete objects fall under no highest type. The bundle theorist who is an eliminativist about concrete objects is a nihilist of this sort (substance nihilism). She rejects the target: she thinks that there are no concrete objects to count.[1] One who accepts concrete objects but rejects the relevant notion of “highest” type would also be a nihilist for \(t_1\) counted by \(u_1\). She rejects the unit: she thinks that this is no way to count.

As a second illustration, let the target \(t_2 =\) properties. The monist for \(t_1\) counted by \(u_1\) (the substance monist, e.g., the materialist) might still be a pluralist for \(t_2\) counted by \(u_1\) (for properties counted by highest type). For instance, she might hold that there are two highest types of property, physical and mental, inhering in one and the same type of substance (property dualism). Or she might be a nihilist for \(t_2\) counted by \(u_1\), by being an eliminative nominalist about properties and thereby rejecting the target. (These examples show the need to relativize monism to a target.)

As a third illustration, let the unit \(u_2 =\) individual token. The monist for \(t_1\) counted by \(u_1\) (the substance monist, e.g., the materialist) might still be a pluralist for \(t_1\) counted by \(u_2\) (for concrete objects counted by tokens). For instance, she might hold that there exist many concrete object tokens (existence pluralism), while maintaining that these are all material objects. Likewise the pluralist for \(t_1\) counted by \(u_1\) might be a monist for \(t_1\) counted by \(u_2\). For instance, she might hold that there is only the one “world-person” with two highest types of property, physical and mental. (These examples show the need to relativize monism to a unit.)

Monism, along with pluralism and nihilism, must therefore be relativized to both a target and a unit. The underlying reason for this double relativity is that these are theses of numerical predication (‘…is one/many/none’), and all numerical predication is doubly relative in this way: for a target (what is to be counted), and by a unit (how it is to be counted). This is one way to understand the moral of Frege’s (1884: 59) insight:

While looking at one and the same external phenomenon, I can say with equal truth both ‘It is a copse’ and ‘It is five trees,’ or both ‘Here are four companies’ and ‘Here are 500 men.’

The “external phenomenon” is the target, and “copse” and “tree” (or “companies” and “men”) serve as potential units.[2]

1.2 Important examples

I now mention some of the more interesting target-unit pairs, leading to a list of some of the more interesting monisms. To begin with, on perhaps the most general level, one may target the categories themselves, and consider whether the schedule of categories has various sorts of unity. There are at least two interesting sorts of unity to consider: (i) the number of categories (including subcategories), and (ii) the number of highest categories (excluding subcategories).

As to the first sort of unity concerning the number of categories, some posit a categorical distinction between object and property, thereby recognizing a pluralism of at least two categories. But others would prefer the elegant monistic picture of a “one category ontology”: for instance, some trope theorists and property-only theorists claim a property-only schedule, or a schedule that effaces the object/property distinction (Williams 1953; Campbell 1990; Paul 2013); and eliminative nominalists claim an object-only schedule (Rodriguez-Pereyra 2002).

As to the second sort of unity concerning the number of highest categories, those who are pluralists about the number of categories still may (or may not) posit one highest category—a summum genus, such as entity or being—under which all the entities in the lower categories fall. Spinoza (Ethics IV pref., II: 207), for instance, is a pluralist about the categories but a monist about the highest categories, positing a categorical divide between substance and mode but unifying both under being:

We are accustomed to refer all individuals in nature to one genus which is called the most general, that is, to the notion of Being, which embraces absolutely all the individuals in nature.

While Aristotle is a pluralist about both the categories and the highest categories, denying that there is any higher category above his substance, quantity, quality, etc.[3]

Moving down from the level of the categories themselves, one may target a particular type of entity, and consider whether that type has various sorts of unity. Of special interest to the discussion to come is the concrete material realm as a target. For this target there are at least four interesting sorts of unity to consider: (i) the number of types (including subtypes), (ii) the number of highest types (excluding subtypes), (iii) the number of tokens (including derivative tokens), and (iv) the number of basic tokens (excluding derivative tokens). The neutral monist (as per above) is a pluralist about the number of types, but a monist about the number of highest types. On her view there are material and mental types, but both fall under a higher neutral type from which the material and the mental are derivative. The priority monist (as per above) may well be a pluralist about the number of tokens, but is a monist about the number of basic tokens. On this view there are many concrete objects other than the one fundamental whole, but these other objects are all “shards”: derivative fragments of the One.

The abstract realm is another interesting target. For this target it is not obvious that there is a sensible type/token distinction.[4] So only two of the four natural count policies for concrete objects seem applicable: (i) the number of abstract objects (including derivative ones), and (ii) the number of basic abstract objects (excluding derivative ones). So consider the hierarchy of pure set theoretic objects. One might very naturally be a pluralist about the number of pure set-theoretic abstracta that exist, but a monist about the number of basic set-theoretic abstracta, insofar as one holds that the entire transfinite hierarchy is founded upon a single element: the empty set. Those who reject abstract objects altogether will obviously be nihilists on either count policy (c.f. Goodman and Quine 1947).

In general, for any target that supports a type/token distinction—perhaps for any concrete target—it seems that there will be at least the four natural count policies as seen with concrete objects. While for any target that does not support a type/token distinction—perhaps for any abstract target—it seems that there will only be the two natural count policies as seen with abstract objects. To further illustrate these patterns: with concrete events, one might count by types, highest types, tokens, or basic tokens. While with abstract Platonic universals, one might count the number of forms, or the number of basic forms. For example, Plato is a pluralist about the number of forms, but a monist about the number of basic forms, maintaining that they are all sustained by the form of the good.[5]

Moving down from targets that concern a particular type of entity, one might also target a particular token entity, and consider whether it has various sorts of unity. A dizzying variety of natural count policies present themselves. A particular concrete object might, for instance, be counted by (i) the number of its parts, (ii) the number of its atomic parts, (iii) the number of its maximally continuous parts, (iv) the number of its functionally integrated parts, or (v) the number of its qualitatively homogeneous parts. So if one considers a chess set, one might count it functionally as 1 (1 chess set), by its connected parts as 33 (32 pieces and 1 board), by its homogeneous parts as 96 (32 pieces plus 64 squares), by its atomic parts as bazillions of particles, and by its parts as \(2^n -1\), where \(n\) is the number of its atomic parts.[6] Obviously many other count policies are available. It is not clear that there is more to be said of a systematic nature about natural count policies for various particular entities.

There is one count policy of some metaphysical interest worth mentioning, which is to count by the number of individuals (self-identicals) present. Thus one might say, for a given target, that there are exactly three individuals involved. Restricting our domain of quantification to the target, this would be to uphold the formula:

\(\exists x\exists y\exists z(x\ne y \amp x\ne z \amp y\ne z \amp \forall v(v=x \vee v=y \vee v=z))\)

Unless one thinks that identity itself is a relative notion (Geach 1962), or that there is some other problem with this formalism, this formula represents a perfectly legitimate count policy. My point is that it is not the only legitimate count policy. It is perfectly legitimate to count the copse as one, without denying the presence of the five trees, or identifying them.

Putting this together, here is a list of some of the more interesting examples of monistic doctrines mentioned above:

  • Genus monism: target: categories; unit: highest type (the doctrine that there is a highest category; e.g., being)
  • Substance monism: target: concreta; unit: highest type (the doctrine that all concreta are of a common type; e.g., materialism)
  • Property monism: target: properties; unit: highest type (the doctrine that all properties are of a common type; e.g., physical properties)
  • Existence monism: target: concreta; unit: tokens (the doctrine that there is exactly one concretum)
  • Priority monism: target: concreta; unit: basic tokens (the doctrine that there is exactly one fundamental concretum)

This list is not intended to be exhaustive, but just to indicate a handful of the more interesting monisms, and classify them with respect to their associated target and unit.[7]

Most of these five monisms are independent, though there are the following logical relations. Pluralism about the number of basic tokens for some concrete category entails pluralism about the respective number of tokens. In the other direction, both monism and nihilism about the number of tokens for some concrete category entails a corresponding monism or nihilism about the respective number of basic tokens. Further, nihilism about the number of highest types for any concrete category entails nihilism about the number of tokens (and thus the number of basic tokens) for that category.

Thus with existence monism and priority monism (the main foci of what follows), one finds the following logical relations: existence monism entails priority monism, and priority pluralism entails existence pluralism. But otherwise the views are independent. So for instance, one might be an existence pluralist but a priority monist. This would be to maintain that many things exist (not just the world, but also persons, furniture, particles, and whatnot), but that the whole world is basic. The partialia are merely dependent fragments. It may be that this is the view that most historical monists have held, and that especially deserves serious attention.[8]

2. Existence Monism

2.1 Overview

Existence monism targets concrete objects and counts by individual token. It holds that exactly one concrete object token exists (the One). It represents an interesting and historically important form of monism, albeit one which is widely regarded as deeply implausible. Consider any two concrete individuals, such as you and I. The existence monist must either deny that at least one of us exists, or deny that at least one of us is a concrete object, or hold that we are identical. This is hard to swallow. (It is important to distinguish existence monism from priority monism, which does not have this implausible implication.)

Historically, existence monism may have been defended by Parmenides, Melissus, Spinoza, and Bradley, though in each case the claim is controversial.[9] Among contemporary philosophers, Horgan and Potrč are probably the leading, and perhaps the only, existence monists.[10] Thus Horgan and Potrč (2000: 249; c.f. 2008: 8) advance the following ontological and semantical theses:

  • There really is just one concrete particular, viz., the whole universe (the blobject).
  • The blobject has enormous spatiotemporal structural complexity, and enormous local variability—even though it does not have any genuine parts.
  • Numerous statements employing posits of common sense and science are true, even though nothing in the world answers directly to these posits.
  • Truth, for such statements, is indirect language-world correspondence.

Note that existence monism should not be confused with the formula: \(\exists x\forall y(x=y)\). That is the logician’s formula for expressing the claim that exactly one entity exists. The existence monist is making a much weaker (and slightly more plausible) claim. She can allow that many abstract entities exist, she can allow that many spatiotemporal points exist (assuming that she does not follow the supersubstantivalist in identifying objects with regions), and she can allow that many property tokens exist (assuming she does not follow the bundle theorist in identifying objects with compresent property tokens), as long as she maintains that only one concrete object token exists.[11]

In order to properly characterize existence monism, one should first introduce a predicate ‘\(C\)’ that denotes the property of being a concrete object. (The notion of being a concrete object is natural and useful, so this should be clear enough to work with.) Then one can introduce the formula:

Existence monism: \(\exists x(Cx \amp \forall y(Cy \rightarrow x=y))\)

The corresponding logical formulae for existence pluralism and nihilism then run:

Existence pluralism: \(\exists x\exists y (Cx \amp Cy \amp x\ne y)\)

Existence nihilism: \({\sim}\exists xCx\)

It is not built into the formulation of Existence monism that the one concretum has any particular nature. It might be my nose or your left foot. It might be material (realist) or mental (idealist) or neutral. Idealist and neutral forms of existence monism may or may not identify the One with some sort of divinity. Materialist and neutral forms of existence monism typically identify the One with the whole cosmos (Horgan and Potrč’s “blobject”). Using ‘\(u\)’ as a dedicated constant for the cosmos, which may be defined mereologically as the sum of all concreta, one thus reaches:

Existence monism (cosmic): \(\exists !xCx \amp Cu\)

This says that there is exactly one concretum, namely the cosmos.

2.2 Arguments

2.2.1 Moorean truisms

As mentioned, existence pluralism is widely embraced. This attitude came to the fore in the early analytic revolt against the neo-Hegelian monistic idealists, and has made all forms of “monism” something of a taboo until recently (cf. Schaffer 2010b: §1). This pluralistic stance is fairly explicit in Moore’s (1993: 166) declaration: “Here is one hand… and here is another,” and fully explicit in Russell’s (1918 [1985]: 36) declaration:

I share the common-sense belief that there are many separate things; I do not regard the apparent multiplicity of the world as consisting merely in phases and unreal divisions of a single indivisible Reality.

Whether due wholly to argumentative force or at least partly to historical contingencies, such declarations had the effect of ending any interest in monism (even in forms of monism such as priority monism that agree with Moorean truisms: §3), for nearly one hundred years. And so philosophical fashion swung from some form of monism in the nineteenth century, to some form of pluralism in the twentieth century.[12]

There are actually two distinct sources of evidence for existence pluralism: intuition and perception. Where Russell seems to be appealing to his “common-sense belief,” Moore seems to be appealing directly to the content of perception, as do Hoffman and Rosenkrantz (1997: 78):

Monism… is inconsistent with something that appears to be an evident datum of experience, namely, that there is a plurality of things. We shall assume that a plurality of material things exists, and hence that monism is false.

So, barring a radical skepticism about both intuition and perception, there seems to be strong prima facie evidence for existence pluralism.

The argument may be formulated in various ways, but—for reasons that will emerge below—one of the more interesting (and very natural) formulations runs as follows:

  1. It is intuitively obvious (/perceptually apparent) that there are a plurality of concrete objects.

1 makes a claim about the status of a given proposition, that there are a plurality of concrete objects. It says that this proposition is intuitively obvious and/or perceptually apparent.

  1. If it is intuitively obvious (/perceptually apparent) that there are a plurality of concrete objects, then there is prima facie reason to believe that there are a plurality of concrete objects.

2 makes an epistemic claim about propositions that enjoy the status of being intuitively obvious (/perceptually apparent). The epistemic claim is that these propositions thereby enjoy prima facie justification. The argument thus concludes:

  1. There is prima facie reason to believe that there are a plurality of concrete objects.

The argument is valid and the premises seem plausible. Of course the conclusion is not existence pluralism, but rather the weaker claim that there is prima facie reason to believe in existence pluralism. But this leaves existence pluralism as the default view barring any overriding arguments otherwise. This is exactly the way Russell (1918 [1985]: 48) sees the dialectic:

The empirical person would naturally say, there are many things. The monistic philosopher attempts to show that there are not. I should propose to refute his a priori arguments.

How might the existence monist or nihilist reply? As a claim about the content of intuition (/perception), 1 seems hard to question. And as a claim about prima facie justification, 2 seems plausible as well (albeit more theoretically loaded).

There is a fairly standard existence monist and nihilist reply to arguments in the vicinity of 1–3, which involves attempts to paraphrase claims of commonsense. For instance, when one claims that there is a hand here, the existence monist might hold that what is strictly the case is that the world is handish here. The claims of commonsense could then be downgraded to being strictly false but still explicable given the truth of the paraphrase, or as true but only according to the ‘tacit fiction’ of decomposition, which is the ‘fiction’ that the world decomposes into proper parts. [13]

Other techniques besides paraphrase may be employed. For instance, Horgan and Potrč (2000: 50–51) offer an indirect correspondence theory of truth, declaring talk of a plurality of discrete objects apt for tracking “lumps” and “congealings” of the blobject, saying that “such tracking would constitute an indirect kind of language/world correspondence” which “would be a very plausible candidate for truth” (2000: 50–1). Their idea is to posit a contextually sensitive parameter in truth-evaluation, for directness of correspondence required, so that Moorean truisms can count as true in lax contexts.[14] Another option would be to offer a truthmaker theory of commitment, claiming that truths commit one just to their truthmakers, and that the truthmaker for the Moorean truism is just the world.[15]

But it is unclear, however, exactly how these various responses address the argument as formulated via 1–3. Is the idea that, contra 1, the paraphrase reveals that what is obvious and/or apparent might not be exactly what we thought? This is puzzling since the paraphrased claim appears in 1 as the content of intuition and/or perception, and it is dubious that one can freely paraphrase inside such contexts. Perhaps it in some sense “comes to the same thing” if there is a hand, or if the world is handish hereish, but it still might seem to one specifically as if the former were the case. Or is the idea that, contra 2, the paraphrase reveals that what is obvious and/or apparent is not prima facie rational to believe? This is puzzling as well, and raises concerns that the existence of paraphrases would engender a general skepticism about any intuitions and perceptions. Or is the idea that the argument goes through to 3, but that the existence of the paraphrase provides an at least partially undermining defeater to the reason to believe in a plurality of concrete objects? Again this raises worries about engendering a general skepticism, for making defeaters too easy to come by.

The existence monist and nihilist can of course just “bite the bullet” by accepting 3 but claiming overriding arguments otherwise. But this is a dialectically difficult situation for her: whatever support the premises of her arguments otherwise might have will almost certainly pale in comparison to the support that 3 provides for existence pluralism. Not for nothing are existence monism and nihilism widely dismissed as crazy views.[16]

2.2.2 An exclusion argument

Given the highly plausible case for existence pluralism, it seems as if the existence monist and nihilist need strong arguments for their view. For instance, if it could be proven that positing a plurality of concrete objects (or a plurality of anything, or even a single concrete object) led irrevocably to contradiction, this should turn the tide. But nothing like this has ever been proven.

Perhaps the best argument for existence monism is that it provides the simplest sufficient ontology.[17] The idea is that we can give a complete account of the phenomena in which the world is the only concrete object mentioned, so that there is no need to posit any further concreta. The argument may be formulated as follows:

  1. The world is the only concrete object needed to explain how the world evolves.

Somewhat more precisely, 4 claims that the complete causal story of the world can be told in terms of the physical aspect of the world (a path in physical configuration space), together with whatever laws of nature govern temporal evolution. No pieces of the world (such as tables or particles) need be mentioned in this story. To take a toy example, consider a Newtonian world containing what the folk would describe as a rock shattering a window. The complete causal story here can be told purely in terms of the world’s occupational manner vis-á-vis Newtonian configuration space.[18] The rock and the window need not be mentioned in this story. The world bears all the causal information.

The argument then adds that recognizing proper parts of the world is recognizing what is either explanatorily redundant or epiphenomenal:

  1. If the world is the only concrete object needed to explain how the world evolves, then if there were proper parts of the world, these proper parts would be explanatorily redundant or epiphenomenal entities.

If the world suffices to explain everything, then there is nothing left for its proper parts to explain. Its proper parts can at best explain what the world already suffices for. So if the proper parts explain anything at all they are redundant, while if they explain nothing at all they are epiphenomenal.

The argument continues with a rejection of both explanatorily redundant and epiphenomenal entities:

  1. There are no explanatorily redundant or epiphenomenal entities.

Such a rejection is best defended on methodological grounds. Occam’s Razor cuts against both explanatorily redundant and epiphenomenal entities, as there can be no need for positing either.[19] From which the argument concludes:

  1. The world has no proper parts.[20]

The conclusion may seem shocking, but the argument is valid, and the premises seem plausible.

How might the existence pluralist and the existence nihilist reply to such an exclusion argument? Starting with the existence pluralist, she might try to deny 4 by denying that the world exists. This might seem an unlikely reply, though there are those who endorse principles of restricted composition that entail that the world does not exist. For instance, van Inwagen 1990 holds that composition only occurs when the result is a life, and the world is (presumably) not a life—a consequence van Inwagen himself (2002: 127) later notes and embraces.[21] Lowe (2012: 93-5) is more directly skeptical about “the cosmos” that monists invoke (though see Tallant 2015 (3103-06) for a reply to Lowe, based on Schaffer’s 2009b proposed identification of the cosmos with the spacetime manifold).

So much the worse for those sorts of principles of restricted composition, the existence monist might respond. Indeed, insofar as restricted principles of composition are supposed to improve on unrestricted composition either with respect to intuitions or with respect to science, it seems that any plausible principle of restricted composition should retain the world. For the existence of the world enjoys both intuitive and empirical support. Intuitively, we folk speak of “the cosmos” and our poets write verses like “All are but parts of one stupendous whole, whose body nature is, and God the soul;” (Alexander Pope; Essay on Man, Epistle I.IX). Empirically, the cosmos is the very subject matter of physical cosmology, and quantum cosmology directly attempts to solve for the wave function of the cosmos.[22]

The existence pluralist might do better to deny 5, by maintaining that composition is identity. If the world is its proper parts, then positing the former just is positing the latter.[23] But there seem to be two main reasons for denying that composition is identity. First, the whole and its parts differ structurally. Pluralities like “the parts” have a privileged structure in terms of their individuals. Thus consider a circle (the whole) divided into two semicircles (the parts). Here the semicircles are structured into a pair of distinct semicircular shapes.[24] But (given mereological extensionality) fusions lack such privileged structure. The circle is just as much the fusion of its two semicircles, as it is the fusion of its four quadrants, and its continuum-many points. Second, the whole and its parts differ numerically. As Lewis (1991: 87) writes: “What’s true of the many is not exactly what’s true of the one. After all they are many while it is one.”[25] So, assuming that the extended many-one conception of identity retains some analogue of Leibniz’s law of the indiscernibility of identicals, the one whole cannot be identical to its many parts.

The existence pluralist might do best to deny 6. One way to deny 6 is to invoke competing methodological considerations. Perhaps Occam’s Razor cuts against both explanatorily redundant and epiphenomenal entities, but Occam’s Razor is not the only methodological consideration. There are also considerations of conservativeness, which seem to favor an ontology that includes you and I as distinct concrete objects. Though here the existence monist might reply that Occam’s Razor trumps conservativeness when the two conflict. And there are also considerations of theoretical elegance, which might still favor the pluralistic account of the world, if the monistic “world particle” story requires the use of overly complicated and disunified predicates.

Perhaps a better way for the existence pluralist to deny 6 (and the best overall way for her to reply to the exclusion argument) is to argue that Occam’s Razor should be modified to take into account the notion of basicness. For there seems little harm in multiplying entities that are derivative—what seems problematic is the multiplication of basic entities. In this vein Armstrong (1997: 12) speaks of “the ontological free lunch,” explaining:

[W]hatever supervenes, … is not something ontologically additional to the subvenient, or necessitating, entity or entities. What supervenes is no addition to being.

So the existence pluralist might suggest that the better methodological maxim is: do not multiply basic entities without necessity (but help yourself to derivative entities).[26]

Turning to the existence nihilist, she might react to the exclusion argument by claiming to beat the existence monist at her own game. The existence nihilist denies that any concrete objects exist (this is a variant way of denying that the world exists, and so a variant way of denying 4). Just as the complete causal story of the world can be told in terms of the world’s having various configurational properties, so the story can be told without mentioning any concrete object at all, and simply speaking of the instantiation of the relevant properties. This involves what Hawthorne and Cortens 1995 (following Strawson 1959) call a “feature-placing language.” Instead of saying that the world has certain properties, a feature-placing language just says that there are those properties, or (to express the same idea in a different way) instead of saying that the world is \(F\), a feature-placing language just says that it \(F\)s, where ‘it’ is understood as a semantically vacuous placeholder that is present for purely syntactic reasons. Here the existence nihilist might claim to beat the monist at her own game, by providing an even simpler sufficient ontology.

In reply, the existence monist could say that property instantiations metaphysically presuppose concrete objects as the instantiators of such properties.[27] That is, the existence monist should reply that existence nihilism is impossible, for positing properties without bearers. If so then at least one concrete object is required, by the argument that properties need bearers; and at most one concrete object is required, by the argument from exclusion discussed above.

To summarize the dialectic as presented so far, the existence monist must defend both the exclusion argument and the “properties need objects” argument. The existence nihilist must defend both the exclusion argument and the possibility of properties without objects. And both the existence monist and nihilist must establish that the premises of the exclusion argument—or any alternative argument they would provide—have sufficient plausibility to override the considerations from intuition and from perception, which seem to tilt so strongly towards existence pluralism (§2.1).

Of course existence monism is not the only form of monism (§1). If considerations from intuition and from perception ultimately tell against existence monism, there is still room to combine existence pluralism with priority monism. This would yield a view on which many things exist (as is intuitively obvious and perceptually apparent), but only as dependent fragments of the one fundamental whole. This may be the view that many historical monists have held, and is a view that deserves very serious consideration.

2.2.3 Ontological vagueness

But before turning to priority monism, it is worth mentioning in more detail the argument from ontological vagueness that motivates Horgan and Potrč 2000 and 2008. Their core idea, seen in their 2008 (§7.3), is that the ontologist has three main options. She may posit a world full of commonsense objects (“slob-jects”), but at the price of admitting ontological vagueness. Or she may posit a world of many small precise objects (“snob-jects”), which may or many not stand in composition relations. Or she may posit just one precise object, namely the world itself (“the snob-ject is the blob-ject”).

Horgan and Potrč argue that ontological vagueness is impossible since it entails a contradiction, and take this to rule out an ontology of common-sense objects. (See Lowe 2012 for a defense of the coherence of this sort of ontological vagueness, and see Schaffer 2012 for an argument that semantic conceptions of vagueness such as supervaluationism resolve the problem.)

Horgan and Potrč then take the rejection of ontological vagueness to force an ontology of precise objects (no “slob-jects” only “snob-jects”), and take the remaining issue solely to concern which inventory of precise objects the ontologist should countenance. They consider three main inventories: a nihilist inventory of many small precise objects (e.g. particles) with no composites, a universalist inventory of many small precise objects plus all composites formed therefrom, and an existence monist inventory of just one big precise object. And they conclude (2008: 183) that the existence monist inventory is to be preferred on grounds of parsimony:

[T]hese three candidates can be ordered with respect to comparative ontological parsimony. The simplest is [existence monism]; it maximizes ontological parsimony by countenancing just one real concrete object, the blobject. Less parsimonious is [nihilism], since it countenances all those point-objects… Still less parsimonious is [universalism], since it countenances not only all the same point-objects, but also a completely unrestricted mereological hierarchy of snobjective region-objects as well.

I think that there are at least three problems with this argument. The first is that the parsimony comparison between the nihilist and existence monist inventory is problematic, since the ontologies in question are disjoint. This is not a case where one ontology is a proper subset of another (rather both are disjoint proper subsets of the universalist inventory). Rather each inventory is itself minimally complete. From the perspective of each inventory, there are no elements that are superfluous.

The second problem—hinted at in §2.2.2—is that any added parsimony gains for the existence monist must be weighted against potential explanatory losses. In particular, the existence monist is going to struggle to account for linguistic phenomena such as reference, without positing any objects to serve as referents (Schaffer 2012). And she will struggle to formulate her own theory, insofar as her own theory speaks of things such as “sentences” and “posits” whose very existence it denies (Lowe 2012).

The third problem is that—given that parsimony considerations only attach to fundamental posits (§2.2.2)—there is room to combine a universalist total ontology with a monistic conception of what is fundamental, and so reclaim all of the relevant parsimony of existence monism with none of the wild rejections of obvious commonsense objects or useful linguistic referents. This is a form of the priority monist alternative.

3. Priority Monism

3.1 Overview

3.1.1 Formulation

Priority monism targets concrete objects and counts by basic tokens. It holds that exactly one basic concrete object exists—there may be many other concrete objects, but these only exist derivatively. The priority monist will hold that the one basic concrete object is the world (the maximal concrete whole). To distinguish herself from the existence monist, she will allow that the world has proper parts, but hold that the whole is basic and the proper parts are derivative. In short, she will hold the classical monistic doctrine that the whole is prior to each of its (proper) parts. This doctrine presupposes that the many proper parts exist, for the whole to be prior to. Historically, priority monism may have been defended by Plato, Plotinus, Proclus, Spinoza, Hegel, Lotze, Royce, Bosanquet, and Bradley, inter alia.[28] But today, priority monism has few advocates.[29] Indeed, until the last decade, priority monism was seldom even recognized as a possible position. ‘Monism’ was typically understood as existence monism (exactly one concrete object exists), and summarily dismissed.[30]

In order to properly characterize priority monism, one should introduce a predicate ‘\(B\)’ that denotes the property of being a basic concrete object. Then one can introduce the formula:

Priority monism: \(\exists x(Bx \amp \forall y(By \rightarrow x=y))\)

The corresponding logical formulae for priority pluralism and nihilism then run:

Priority pluralism: \(\exists x\exists y(Bx \amp By \amp x\ne y)\)

Priority nihilism: \({\sim}\exists xBx\)[31]

The formulae associated with priority monism are thus the same formulae as for existence monism/pluralism/nihilism, save for the replacement of ‘\(C\)’ with ‘\(B\).’ Note that it is not built into the formulation of Priority monism that the one basic concretum has any particular nature. Priority monism, Priority pluralism, and Priority nihilism are so far characterized as strictly numerical doctrines, concerning the number of basic concreta (one, many, or none).

It is standard for priority monists and nihilists to also have views about the “size” of the basic concreta. Like the existence monist, the priority monist standardly associates her one basic concretum with the whole cosmos. Using ‘\(u\)’ as a dedicated constant for the cosmos, one thus reaches:

Priority monism (cosmic): \(\exists !xBx \amp Bu\)

This says that there is exactly one basic concretum, namely the cosmos.[32] Likewise the priority pluralist standardly associates her many basic concreta with proper parts of the cosmos:

Priority pluralism (partial): \(\exists x\exists y(Bx \amp By \amp x\ne y) \amp{\sim}Bu\)

This adds that the cosmos is not among the basic concreta.

To get from Priority monism (cosmic) to the further claim that the proper parts of the cosmos are dependent on the whole, one need only add that the cosmos has proper parts, and that nonbasic concreta depend on basic concreta. These proper parts will be nonbasic concreta by Priority monism (cosmic), and hence must depend on the one and only basic concretum. (Analogous reasoning allows one to move from Priority pluralism (partial) to the further claim that the cosmos depends on its proper parts.)

3.1.2 Priority

The doctrines of priority monism, pluralism, and nihilism—indeed the very idea that “basic concrete token” is a legitimate unit of counting—presuppose a notion of basicness. This notion of basicness may be understood with reference to the classical hierarchical view of reality. The basic forms the sparse structure of being, while the derivative forms the abundant superstructure. The basic is fundamental. It is the ground of all else. It is (as it were) all God would need to create, while the derivative is a mere byproduct. The derivative is dependent on, grounded in, and existent in virtue of the basic.

Such a notion of basicness—and the hierarchical picture associated with it—is intuitively natural and theoretically useful, in this context and others. It has classical roots in Aristotle’s notion of priority in nature, and has branched into the contemporary program of sparse ontology, in a way that has proven fruitful in understanding a wide range of issues. For instance, the physicalist holds that physical entities are basic, and that mental and moral entities are derivative. For the abstract objects of pure set theory, it is natural to think that the empty set is basic, and that the other pure sets are founded on it. With respect to holes, one might hold that the material host is basic and that its holes are formed by it. And with respect to objects and properties, one classical idea is that objects are basic and properties inhere in them as dependent abstractions (modes). Some are skeptical of these locutions. But for better or worse, such talk has rapidly become ubiquitous.[33]

There are many ways to make sense of these notion, but one natural approach is to take basicness as the foundation of ontological priority. That is, suppose that one begins with the notion of ontological priority, understood as an irreflexive and transitive relation between entities. Then ontological priority will induce a partial ordering over the domain of entities. Suppose one now adds the assumption that ontological priority requires foundations. These foundations will be those entities that are not posterior to any other entities. These are the basic, ungrounded entities.[34] Suppose one now adds a third assumption that there is a well-founded ontological dependency structure within the domain of concrete objects. Then one gets basic concrete objects. Being such an object is the property denoted by ‘\(B\)’.

Formally speaking, this natural approach begins with an irreflexive and transitive ontological priority relation \(P\). A foundational entity may then be defined as an entity that has nothing prior to it:

Foundational entity: \(Fx =_{df} {\sim}\exists yPyx\)

Ontological foundationalism may then be formulated as the following thesis:

Ontological foundationalism: \(\forall x(Fx \vee \exists y(Fy \amp Pyx))\)

In words, ontological foundationalism holds that every entity is either basic or posterior to something basic. In content, what ontological foundationalism excludes is the prospect of something being neither itself foundational nor founded on something else that is foundational.[35]

Within the domain of concrete objects, a basic object is then a concrete object that has no concrete object prior to it:

Basic concreta: \(Bx =_{df} Cx \amp{\sim}\exists y(Cy \amp Pyx)\)

Here ‘\(C\)’ continues to denote the property of being a concrete object (as per the formulation of existence monism: §2), and ‘\(P\)’ the priority relation. This defines the predicate ‘\(B\)’ used in the formulations of priority monism, pluralism, and nihilism above. Object foundationalism may then be defined as the following thesis:

Concreta foundationalism: \(\forall x(Cx \rightarrow(Bx \vee \exists y(By \amp Pyx)))\)

In words, concreta foundationalism holds that every concrete object is either basic-among-the-concreta or posterior to something basic-among-the-concreta.

Given these assumptions, the debate between the priority monist and the priority pluralist may be described as a debate over what is at the foundation of the priority relation on concrete objects. The priority monist holds that whole is prior to (proper) part, and that the maximal whole is ultimately prior. The priority pluralist holds that (proper) part is prior to whole, and typically holds that the minimal parts are ultimately prior. This is not a debate over what exists. Both sides may accept the same roster of existent beings (including the world, you and I, planets and particles, etc.) This is a debate over what is basic.

3.1.3 Tiling

Under a certain natural picture about basic objects, Priority monism and Priority pluralism are exhaustive and exclusive doctrines. The picture is that the basic objects tile the cosmos, in the sense that they cover every portion of reality without overlap. More precisely, the tiling constraint (c.f. Schaffer 2010a: §1.3) may be thought of as the conjunction of two conditions:

No gaps: Sum:\(x(Bx)=u\),
(Sum:\(x(Bx)\) is the mereological sum of all things that are such that \(Bx\).)

No overlaps:
\(\forall x\forall y((Bx \amp By \amp x\ne y) \rightarrow{\sim}\exists z(\text{PART}zx \amp \text{PART}zy))\)

No gaps expresses the requirement that the sum of all the basic entities is the cosmos as a whole. No portion of the cosmos is left uncovered. No overlaps expresses the requirement that the basic entities be mereologically disjoint, having no common parts.

The picture given by No gaps and No overlaps is one on which the basic concreta partition the cosmos. The question of which concreta are basic becomes the question of how to carve nature at the joints. Or to invoke Lewis’s (1986) memorable picture of the cosmos as a vast mosaic, the question becomes what are the tiles from which the cosmic mosaic is inlaid?[36]

No gaps rules out Priority nihilism. For if nothing is basic, then the sum of the basic concreta cannot be the cosmos. This makes Priority monism and Priority pluralism exhaustive doctrines.

No gaps also renders Priority monism equivalent to Priority monism (cosmic). For if only one concretum is basic, and it must sum to the cosmos, then it must be the cosmos. Likewise No overlaps renders Priority pluralism equivalent to Priority pluralism (partial). For if many concreta are basic, then the cosmos cannot be among the basic concreta or it will overlap the others.

Given No gaps plus No overlaps, further equivalences follow. On the monistic side, the two conjuncts of Priority monism (cosmic)—\(\exists !xBx\) and \(Bu\)—turn out to be mutually entailing. And likewise on the pluralistic side, the two conjuncts of Priority pluralism (partial)—\(\exists x\exists y(Bx \amp By \amp x\ne y)\) and \({\sim}Bu\)—turn out to be mutually entailing. That is to say that, given the tiling constraint, the numerical thesis that the number of basic concreta is one turns out equivalent to the holistic thesis that the basic concretum is mereologically maximal.

Since Priority monism turns out equivalent to Priority monism (cosmic) which turns out equivalent to \(Bu\), and Priority pluralism turns out equivalent to Priority pluralism (partial) and so equivalent to \({\sim}Bu\), Priority monism and Priority pluralism turn out to be contradictories. They are exhaustive and exclusive conceptions of the basic concreta. Given the tiling constraint, Priority monism and Priority pluralism turn out to be exhaustive and exclusive conceptions of how to carve nature at the joints.

3.2 Arguments

What arguments might be given for whether the one whole or some of its many proper parts is basic? What follows is a survey of some of the more important arguments that have appeared in the literature, on behalf of both the priority monist and the priority pluralist (the priority nihilist will not make any further appearances). This survey is not intended to be exhaustive. Indeed, there has recently been some recurrence of interest in the debate over priority monism, and new arguments are emerging on both sides.[37]

3.2.1 Common sense

It is perhaps best to begin from the idea that common sense might favor priority pluralism, as these considerations are historically important (perhaps due in part to the historical conflation of priority monism with existence monism), and linger as something like a reflex response to priority monism in the contemporary literature. So the argument from commonsense, which is an argument for priority pluralism, may be posed as follows:

  1. Commonsense holds that part is prior to whole.
  2. If commonsense holds that part is prior to whole, then there is reason for thinking that part is prior to whole.
  3. There is reason for thinking that part is prior to whole.

The argument is obviously valid, so the only remaining questions concern the truth of the premises 8 and 9.

As to 8, consider the grains of sand in the heap. Here it seems that the grains are prior—the heap exists in virtue of the grains. Or consider the tiles in the mosaic. Here it seems that the tiles are prior—the mosaic is just an arrangement of tiles. Or consider the individuals in a community. Here it seems that the individuals are prior—the community is just a grouping of individuals. In all these cases, it seems that part is prior to whole. Thus Leibniz (1714: 455) maintains that, in general, “a composite is nothing else than a collection or aggregatum of simple substances.” Relatedly, it is common in the contemporary discussions of metaphysical grounding and related notions, to see wholes treated as dependent on their parts. For example, Bennett (2017: 8–9) offers an initial survey of building relations, and takes her leading example to be that of the composition of wholes from their parts.

Yet on the other hand consider some gerrymandered division of a circle. Here it seems that the circle is prior—the gerrymander is just an arbitrary partition on the circle. Or consider the organs of the body. Here it seems that the body is prior—the organs are just functional portions of the body. Or consider the myriad details of the percept. Here it seems that the percept is prior—the details are just particulars of the gestalt. In these latter cases, it seems that whole is prior to part.[38]

Generalizing, it seems that commonsense actually has a relatively nuanced stance on priority relations between whole and part. Commonsense endorses the priority of the parts in cases of mere aggregation and arrangement, and the priority of the whole in cases of arbitrary decompositions, functionally integrated systems, and mental unities.[39] Overall commonsense seems to distinguish between mere heaps and genuine unities. On this point Aristotle (Meta.1041b11–2) speaks of “that which is compounded out of something so that the whole is one—not like a heap, but like a syllable…”

So it remains, in evaluating 8, to ask whether commonsense conceives of the world as a mere heap or a genuine unity. Here the priority monist might invoke the following passage from Blanshard (1973: 180):

We are convinced that [Russell’s atomistic conclusion] will not stand. Our conviction is essentially that of the plain man. Intuitions may be of small weight in philosophy, but…the ‘invincible surmise’ of most thoughtful minds [is] that the world is not in the final account a rag-bag of loose ends…

Indeed, as James (1909 [1987]: 650) notes in the course of defending pluralism—which he took to be a radical doctrine—virtually all (pre-twentieth century) philosophers have conceived of the world as a genuine unity:

Whether materialistically or spiritually minded, philosophers have always aimed at cleaning up the litter with which the world apparently is filled. They have substituted economical and orderly conceptions for the first sensible tangle; and whether these were morally elevated or only intellectually neat, they were at any rate always aesthetically pure and definite, and aimed at ascribing to the world something clean and intellectual in the way of inner structure.[40]

So the priority monist should conclude that, if anything, the argument from commonsense should be reversed. Commonsense does see the cosmos as more of a genuine unity than a mere heap (more like a syllable than a heap of sand). One more passage from James (1907 [1991]: 59) may be useful in mapping the general intellectual landscape, beyond the provinces of the twentieth century Anglo-American tradition:

A certain abstract monism, a certain emotional response to the character of oneness, as if it were a feature of the world not coordinate with its manyness, but vastly more excellent and eminent, is so prevalent in educated circles that we might almost call it part of philosophic common sense.[41]

In any case, as to 9, it is not obvious that commonsense is entitled to much of an opinion on the topic. One might well think that the use of intuitions is particularly perilous on this topic (in contrast to the more mundane topic of existence pluralism) since the notion of ontological priority is a somewhat sophisticated theoretical notion. I would suggest that even if commonsense leans slightly towards priority monism (as the overall history of metaphysics might be thought to bear out), this should not matter much. To the extent it provides any reason to favor priority monism, it seems to be a rather weak reason.

3.2.2 Quantum emergence

A second argument to consider is the argument from quantum emergence (Schaffer 2010a: §2.2; see also Ismael and Schaffer forthcoming). This argument, which is an argument for priority monism by way of quantum mechanics, may be posed as follows:

  1. The whole possesses emergent properties (due to quantum entanglement).
  2. If the whole possesses emergent properties, then whole is prior to part.
  3. Whole is prior to part.

The argument is obviously valid, so the only remaining questions concern the truth of the premises 11 and 12.

As to 11, the intended notion of an emergent property is one for which mereological supervenience fails.[42] Let \(x\) have proper parts. Then \(F\) is an emergent property of \(x\) iff (i) \(x\) instantiates \(F\), (ii) \(F\) is an intrinsic property, and (iii) \(x\)’s instantiating \(F\) does not supervene on the intrinsic properties of, and spatiotemporal relations among, \(x\)’s proper parts. Such a property would be an intrinsic property of the whole that is not determined by the intrinsic properties of and spatiotemporal relations among its parts.

While any appeal to quantum mechanics sparks interpretive controversies, it seems that emergent properties are found in the entangled systems of quantum mechanics. An entangled system is one whose state vector is not factorizable into tensor products of the state vectors of its components:

\(\Psi_{\text{system}} \ne \Psi_{\text{component1}} \otimes \Psi_{\text{component2}} \otimes \Psi_{\text{component3}} \otimes \ldots\)

What this inequality means is that the quantum state of an entangled system contains information over and above that of the quantum states of the components. The intrinsic properties of entangled whole systems do not supervene on the intrinsic properties of and spatiotemporal relations among their component parts. Here Esfeld (1999: 26) notes:

In the case of entanglement, it is only the description of the whole in terms of a pure state, such as the singlet state, which completely determines the local properties of the parts and their relations… Therefore, quantum physics exhibits a substantial holism.

In a similar vein, Maudlin (1998: 56) concludes:

The physical state of a complex whole cannot always be reduced to those of its parts, or to those of its parts together with their spatiotemporal relations, even when the parts inhabit distinct regions of space… The result of the most intensive scientific investigations in history is a theory that contains an ineliminable holism.

Entangled systems are wholes that contain new information, found in the correlation coefficients of their wave functions.

There is reason to think that the world forms a single entangled system, due to the fact that everything interacted in the Big Bang. Everything is a shard of the primordial atom. As Gribbin (1984: 229) explains:

Particles that were together in an interaction remain in some sense parts of a single system, which responds together to further interactions. Virtually everything we see and touch and feel is made up of collections of particles that have been involved in interactions with other particles right back through time, to the Big Bang… Indeed, the particles that make up my body once jostled in close proximity and interacted with the particles that now make up your body. We are as much parts of a single system as the two photons flying out of the heart of the Aspect experiment.

Indeed Zeh (2003: 33) notes that, given quantum decoherence, all seemingly localized particlesque behavior “can be dynamically described in terms of a unitarily evolving (hence strongly entangled) universal wave function.” Thus there is reason to think that the cosmic whole possesses emergent properties, as 8 maintains.

Though of course the claim that the world forms a single entangled system will be controversial (as will any claim that involves an interpretation of quantum mechanics), in at least two respects. First, certain kinds of anti-realist and relationalist interpretations of quantum mechanics (e.g., Rovelli 1996) posit an irreducible relation between the quantum system and an external observer, which preclude assigning a quantum state to the whole world (for lack of an observer external to it). Secondly, some interpretations (e.g., Ghirardi-Rimini-Weber) posit a separate dynamics of wave-function collapse that breaks entanglements. But virtually any realist interpretation of quantum mechanics that also posits an initial singularity (the Big Bang) and unitary Schrödinger evolution will posit an entangled universe, since an initial singularity generates entanglement and Schrödinger evolution preserves it.

I think that the best line for the priority pluralist to take is to deny 11, by holding that (i) entanglement represents a new fundamental relation between individual particles (as opposed to a new emergent property of whole systems), and (ii) mereological supervenience should be revised to concern the supervenience of the intrinsic properties of wholes on the intrinsic properties of their parts plus any fundamental (as opposed to merely spatiotemporal) relations among their parts. Entangled quantum systems so understood will now count as mereologically supervenient so understood.[43]

The priority pluralist’s “fundamental relation” move actually takes two main forms, each of which comes with distinct concerns. One form posits a single irreducibly \(n\)-place relation for \(n\)-particles. Thus Darby (2012: 14) argues that fundamental entanglement relations (unlike spatiotemporal relations and other fundamental external relations) cannot be treated as binary relations, but must be regarded as irreducibly \(n\)-place relation for \(n\)-particles:

It is not true, then, that all else supervenes on anything less than the intrinsic properties of the whole system. The n-place relations instantiated by the members of an n-party system are going to have to go into the supervenience basis.

This is problematic in two respects, the first of which is that it marks an unprecedented departure from more localist pictures. Thus Darby (2012: 14) continues: “[I]t is no longer possible to think of the world as being built up with these relations one component at a time.” The second respect in which this fundamental \(n\)-place relation is problematic is that it makes the fundamental properties and relations at an entangled \(n\)-particle world at least partially distinct from the fundamental properties and relations at an entangled \(n+1\)-particle world (or at any entangled world with any number of particles other than \(n)\). This seems like a loss of unity.

A second form of the priority pluralist’s “fundamental relation” move posits only binary entanglement relations, but allows these to hold between individual particles and whole composite systems. Thus Calosi (2014) shows that one can treat e.g., a fully entangled three particle system by positing a binary entanglement relation between the first particle and the composite system made up of the second and third particles. This is problematic insofar as it posits fundamental entanglement relations relating entities that (by the lights of the pluralist) are nonfundamental. How can the fundamental level “see” the composite system made up of particles 1 and 2, in order to put that composite system in fundamental relation to particle 3, if the only individuals found at the fundamental level are noncomposite?

As to 12, the idea is that a whole that does possess emergent properties is thus “more than the sum of its parts.” Thus consider the entangled quantum universe. As Toraldo di Francia (1998: 28) aptly summarizes:

Since any particle has certainly interacted with other particles in the past, the world turns out to be nonseparable into individual and independent objects. The world is in some way a single object.

Likewise Nadeau and Kafatos (1999: 4) say:

If nonlocality is a property of the entire universe, then we must also conclude that an undivided wholeness exists on the most basic and primary level in all aspects of physical reality,

and then go on (1999: 5) to speak of “a seamlessly interconnected whole called the cosmos.” This fits with the priority monist picture on which the whole cosmos is basic and its proper parts are derivative.

3.2.3 Atomless gunk

A third argument to consider is the argument from gunk (Schaffer 2010a: §2.4), where “gunk” is something every part of which has proper parts, and so is lacking any ultimate parts. This argument, which is an argument for priority monism by way of principles of modality, may be posed as follows:

  1. Either the ultimate parts must be basic at all worlds, or the ultimate whole must be basic at all worlds.
  2. There are gunky worlds without ultimate parts (and hence no ultimate parts to be basic at those worlds).
  3. The ultimate whole must be basic at all worlds.

The argument is obviously valid, so the only remaining questions concern the truth of the premises 14 and 15.

As to 14, the idea is that the direction of priority must be a necessary truth, at least with respect to all metaphysically possible worlds. It would be odd if there were worlds that were otherwise indiscernible, save for differing over what was prior to what. The direction of priority seems to have the same status as other fundamental metaphysical claims (e.g., the debate over universals).[44] To know the direction of priority seems to be part of what Rosen (2006: 35) has in mind when he speaks of knowing:

…what might be called the form of the world: principles governing how objects in general are put together. If the world is a text then these principles constitute its syntax. They specify the categories of basic constituents and the rules for their combination. They determine how non-basic entities are generated from or ‘grounded’ in the basic array.[45]

That said, one might expect the priority pluralist to challenge 14, for one of the following two reasons. First, the priority pluralist might (on considering gunk, and maintaining her thesis that the parts are prior to the whole) declare that nothing is basic in gunky worlds. Things get ever more basic without limit. But this would run counter to ontological foundationalism, and the widespread idea that being needs an ultimate ground (§3.1). This is no longer priority pluralism but priority nihilism, as least for gunky worlds.

Second, the priority pluralist might (on wanting to maintain basic entities in a gunky scenario, but not wanting to take the whole as basic) take some intermediate level of mereological structure to be basic. But this is hardly thematic for the pluralist, as now she would be treating these intermediate structures monistically, as prior to their parts. In any case it seems arbitrary, especially in cases where there is no natural joint in the gunk. For instance, in the case of a homogeneously pink cube of gunk, all the levels of mereological structure (save for the top) are intermediate, and all are homogeneously pink. Is there supposed to be a fact of the matter as to which intermediate level is really basic?

Turning to 15, there seem to be good reason for accepting gunky possibilities. The best tests for whether a scenario is possible are whether it is conceivable, logically consistent, and posited in serious scientific theories. Gunk passes every test (Schaffer 2003). It is conceivable. For instance, it is conceivable that everything is extended, and that everything that is extended has two extended halves. This generates a Zeno sequence of halvings without limit. Further, gunk is logically consistent. Or at least, there are gunky models of classical mereology (Simons 1987: 41). Finally, gunk is scientifically serious. In this vein Georgi (1989: 456) has suggested that effective quantum field theories might form an infinite tower which “goes down to arbitrary short distances in a kind of infinite regression… just a series of layers without end.” Perhaps there are competing considerations that weigh against the possibility of gunk. Here we enter into deep issues concerning the extent of what is possible.[46]

There is also room for the priority pluralist to claim a tu quoque, by arguing for the possibility of “worldless junk,” which is something every whole of which is a proper part, so that there is no ultimate whole. In this vein Bohn (2009) argues that junk has an equal claim to gunk for being metaphysically possible. If there are both gunky as well as junky metaphysical possibilities—and even “hunky” possibilities that are both gunky and junky—then one will not be able to appeal to either ultimate parts or an ultimate whole consistently across metaphysical possibilities. (As with tu quoque replies generally, the rejoinder from gunk leaves open what went “wrong” in the original argument of 14–16.[47])

But the priority monist can point to some crucial differences between gunk and junk that arguably justify only recognizing the metaphysical possibility of the former. Indeed it is doubtful that junk passes any of the tests for possibility that gunk passes. As to conceivability, it is hard to conceive that there is no limit to summation at which one has taken in everything. As to logical consistency, as least if this is judged with respect to classical mereology (arguably our best systematization of the logic of part-whole relations, and certainly the most orthodox), there is a difference as well: classical mereology has gunky models but not junky models. The onus is on the defender of junk to produce an overall logic of part-whole relations which tolerates junky models while being as plausible as orthodox classical mereology.[48] And as to scientific seriousness, while there is lots of work on physical cosmology, it appears that virtually all of it takes for granted that there is such a thing as the cosmos. Indeed it hardly seems to be an empirical question whether there could be such a thing as “the world,” and the reasons mentioned in §2.2 for thinking that there is such a thing equally serve as arguments against the prospect of there being only worldless junk.

3.2.4 Heterogeneity

A fourth argument to consider is the argument from heterogeneity. This argument, which is an argument for priority pluralism, may be posed as follows:

  1. Fundamental entities must be homogeneous.
  2. If the whole world were fundamental, then the whole world would be homogeneous.
  3. The whole world is not homogeneous.
  4. The whole world is not fundamental.

The argument is obviously valid, so the only remaining questions concern the truth of the premises 17–19.[49]

The truth of 19 is perhaps evident. There is qualitative variation in the world. Things are not uniform in all directions. The world is in fact not the kind of perfectly homogeneous sphere that Parmenides (quoted in Robinson 1968: 115) imagined it to be:

But since there is a furthest limit, it is complete on every side, like the body of a well-rounded sphere, evenly balanced in every direction from the middle; for it cannot be any greater or any less in one place than in another.

Rather, as even existence monists like Horgan and Potrč (2008: 168) will immediately acknowledge, “The cosmos exhibits enormous spatiotemporal structural complexity and nonhomogeneity.”

So the question is whether priority monism can account for the qualitative heterogeneity of the cosmos. Further, 18 follows from 17. So the real question comes down to the status of 17.

Why think that fundamental entities must be homogeneous (as per 17)? Here are the best two (related) attempts one might make at defending 17. First attempt: nothing can differ from itself. For a fundamental entity to be heterogeneous would be for it to be internally diverse, which would render it different from itself.[50] Second attempt: the priority pluralist has a way of accounting for heterogeneity that the monist lacks. The pluralist has many fundamental entities, which may all be homogeneous, but might still be different from each other. Hence if the only way to account for heterogeneity were to have many fundamental homogeneous parts differing from each other, then the priority pluralist would have the only way to account for heterogeneity. Perhaps this line of thought is behind the following passage from Turner (1911):

The weak point of all metaphysical Monism is its inability to explain how, if there is but one reality, and everything else is only apparent there can be any real changes in the world, or real relations among things.

Having made an attempt to defend 17, it is time to turn to replies on behalf of the priority monist. The starting reply is that internal heterogeneity within the basic must be allowed by everyone. Or at least, the priority pluralist’s way of accounting for heterogeneity (above) is insufficient to account for all forms of heterogeneity. For there might be heterogeneity all the way down, in the sense of matter every part of which has heterogeneous proper parts.[51] If this is possible, it shows that the pluralistic strategy of accounting for heterogeneity in terms of differences between internally homogeneous parts is insufficient. In a partially similar vein, Taylor (1961: 88) claims that the pluralist can gain no advantage:

Either [the pluralist’s] units are mere units without internal variety, and then it is easy to show that they are the merest nothings, or they have internal variety of their own, and therefore simply repeat within themselves the problem they are supposed to solve.

It must be possible to account for heterogeneity in other ways. It remains to describe these ways.

What is needed is to find ways to allow for internal heterogeneity, which would not entail that anything is “different from itself.” Here are three possibilities, the first of which is to use distributional properties.[52] The world might, for instance, have the property of being polka-dotted. Here there would be no question of the world being “different from itself,” or having any other problematic status. The claim that the world is polka-dotted is a coherent claim, which would entail heterogeneity among its derivative dots and background.

The second way to allow for heterogeneity without contradiction is to relationalize properties. Here the idea (for monadic properties at least) is that instantiation is a three-place relation holding between an object, a property, and a region. So the world might be heterogeneous by, for instance, instantiating red here and green there.[53]

The third way to allow for heterogeneity without contradiction is to regionalize instantiation. Here the idea is that, instead of regionalizing the properties, one might regionalize the instantiation relation itself. So the world might be heterogeneous by, for instance, instantiating-here red and instantiating-there green. (Since the regionalization is incorporated into the copula rather than the predicate, this may be expressed adverbially, as “the world is here-ly red and there-ly green,” or “the world is red in a here-ly way, and green in a there-ly way.”[54])

Perhaps there is a better way to defend 17, and perhaps there are problems with all three of the monistic strategies that have been sketched (distributional properties, relationalized properties, and regionalized instantiations). This takes us deeper into issues about objects and properties.[55]

3.2.5 Intrinsicness

A fifth argument to consider—drawn from Sider (2007b: §4)—is the argument from intrinsicness.[56] This argument, which is an argument against priority monism, turns on the idea that the best analyses of intrinsicness presuppose the fundamentality of parts, and may be posed as follows:

  1. There are real differences between the intrinsic and the extrinsic properties of subcosmic objects.
  2. If there are real differences between the intrinsic and the extrinsic properties of subcosmic objects, then subcosmic objects must bear fundamental properties.
  3. If subcosmic objects bear fundamental properties, then priority monism is false.
  4. Priority monism is false.

The argument is evidently valid, so the only remaining questions concern the truth of the premises 21–23.

The priority monist could in principle try to contest 21, but the notion of an intrinsic property looks to have important theoretical work to do.[57] For instance, intrinsicness seems connected to other core notions like duplication (duplicates agree in all of their intrinsic properties) and change (change is change in intrinsic properties). If one wants to say that some subcosmic objects are duplicates and some not, or say that some subcosmic objects undergo change and some do not, then it seems that one needs to posit a real difference between the intrinsic and extrinsic properties of subcosmic objects. It seems to me that the priority monist should hope to capture this plausible distinction rather than erase it.

The priority monist could in principle also try to contest 23, but 23 stems from a plausible connection between being a fundamental object and bearing fundamental properties (Sider 2008: §1). It would be a cost to sever this connection. (Though it may be that all parties will need to sever this connection in the end: for instance, if priority relations themselves are fundamental, then there will be nonfundamental objects in fundamental relations.)

So it seems to me that most of the action should be on 22, which essentially encodes a certain conception of intrinsicness defended (in different forms) by Lewis 1986, Sider 1996, and Rosen 2010, which seems to build in some sort of preconceptions of fundamentality for the parts and dependence on the parts. Thus Lewis (1986: 61) says:

[T]wo things are duplicates iff (1) they have exactly the same perfectly natural properties, and (2) their parts can be put into correspondence in such a way that corresponding parts have exactly the same perfectly natural properties, and stand in the same perfectly natural relations.

Lewis (1986: 62) then adds: “Then we can go on to say that an intrinsic property is one that can never differ between duplicates.” This requires subcosmic objects to bear perfectly natural (/fundamental) properties. Otherwise it will be (vacuously) true, for any two subcosmic objects, that Lewis’s two conditions for duplication are satisfied: these objects and their parts will have no perfectly natural properties whatsoever and a fortiori cannot differ in this respect.[58]

In a somewhat similar vein, Rosen (2010: 112) proposes:

\(F\) is an intrinsic property iff, as a matter of necessity, for all \(x\): If \(x\) is \(F\) in virtue of \(j(y)\)—where \(j(y)\) is a fact containing \(y\) as a constituent—then \(y\) is part of \(x\); and if \(x\) is not-\(F\) in virtue of \(j(y)\), then \(y\) is part of \(x\).

Given that the priority monist accepts that “in virtue of” claims about facts run in concord with priority relations between objects, from the cosmos down (e.g., I am sitting in virtue of the cosmos being as it is), this would have the bad result that no property that an object can have while being subcosmic can be an intrinsic property. For if a given subcosmic object \(a\) has property \(F\), the priority monist will say that \(a\) is \(F\) in virtue of the fact that the cosmos is such and so, where the cosmos is not part of \(a\).

The priority pluralist who defends anything like Lewis’s or Rosen’s conception of intrinsicness can thereby make the case for 22. She might also—following Sider—make the more modest case that these are the best definitions going. The priority monist who would reject 18 thus, as Sider (2007b: 6) says, “owes us a story.”

The priority monist should ideally reply by giving a successful definition of intrinsicness that is compatible with her view.[59] But this may be too much to ask for: no one seems to have a fully successful definition of intrinsicness . Perhaps the notion—or some allied notion such as duplication—must in the end be taken as primitive.[60]

In that case the priority monist is off the hook, since she too can simply appeal to primitive intrinsicness to mark the real difference between the intrinsic and extrinsic properties of subcosmic objects.

Pending a successful definition, the priority monist may still play defense in two main (and connected) ways. First, she may argue that both Lewis’s and Rosen’s conceptions of intrinsicness are independently known to be problematic (c.f. Weatherson and Marshall 2012: §3), so that it is not such a big deal if priority monism is incompatible with either conception. Secondly, she may turn the tables, and—following Trogdon (2009)—maintain that any conflict between priority monism and a proposed definition of intrinsicness reflects badly on the proposed definition of intrinsicness. As Trogdon (2009: 137) explains, “For me, pluralism and monism are each epistemic possibilities, so it is a virtue of an account of intrinsicality to be neutral between them.”

That said, it is perhaps fair to acknowledge some advantage to the priority pluralist at this stage of the discussion on intrinsicness, insofar as her view fits with certain at least partially plausible attempts to define intrinsicness, and insofar as it is not yet know whether the priority monist can make the same claim.

3.2.6 Combinatorial constraints and internal relations

A sixth argument to consider—drawn in part from Schaffer 2010b—is the argument from free recombination. This argument, which may potentially be run in favor of either priority pluralism or priority monism, begins with the idea that priority pluralism is connected to the modal claim of free recombination. If there really were multiple basic independent units of being—as the priority pluralist claims—then these units should be, in Hume’s (1748: 54) words, “entirely loose and separate.” They should be freely recombinable in any which way. Any way the one can be and any way the other can be ought to be compossible. A disconnected pluralistic heap thus should be amenable to free recombination, and thus failure of free recombination is the modal signature of an interconnected monistic cosmos. The argument from free recombination thus begins with:

  1. Priority pluralism holds if and only if there are multiple concreta that are open to free recombination.

Given 25, the priority pluralist may try to argue from the right bijunct to priority pluralism, and the priority monist may try to argue from the denial of the right bijunct to the denial of priority pluralism (which still leaves open priority nihilism, but at least eliminates the more popular competitor). So the argument continues:

  1. There are (/are not) multiple concreta that are open to free recombination.
  2. Priority pluralism holds (/does not hold).

Obviously the priority pluralist who runs this argument will run 26 and 27 as stated, while the monist (or nihilist) will run their parenthetical variants.

The argument—in whichever direction it is run—is evidently valid, so it remains to consider the premises. There are two main reasons why one might challenge 25. First, one might challenge the left-to-right direction of 25 (from priority pluralism to free recombination) by holding that free recombination is independently blocked. For instance, those who posit brute necessary connections in nature posit such brute necessary connections between the priority pluralist’s basic units of being. Obviously here one enters into deeper issues concerning modality, and the extent to which brute necessary connections are or are not tolerable.[61]

A second reason why one might challenge 25 is a challenge to the right-to-left direction (from free recombination to priority pluralism). While priority pluralism arguably entails free recombination, it is not obvious that priority monism should entail any lack of free recombination. Just because multiple concreta have a common ground in the cosmos does not mean that these concreta cannot be freely recombined. Perhaps modal constraint entails ontological connection; but it is not obvious why ontological connection should entail modal constraint. If so then the priority monist might have a special flexibility with respect to whether or not there is free recombination.

But it is likely that most of the action will fall on 26. Whether or not one permits free recombination between multiple concreta will turn on one’s background views on other matters. For instance, if one combines “causal essentialist” views of properties on which properties confer their powers essentially, with “natural kind” views of things on which things fall under their natural kinds essentially, one will find that all things have essential “fit” requirements into their causal contexts.[62]

Perhaps what is most interesting about the connection between modal constraints and the debate over priority monism is that it shows that “Humeanism” about fundamentality and “Humeanism” about modality may come as a package deal.[63] There seem to be at least three main packages of views to consider. First, there is the package of pluralism plus modal freedom between these multiple units of being. Secondly, there is the package of pluralism plus brute necessary connections in nature. Thirdly, there is the package of priority monism without modal freedom between multiple concreta. This monistic option may allow one to combine a rejection of brute necessary connections in nature with an absence of free recombination.[64]

The argument from combinatorial constraints may be connected to the classic monistic argument from the internal relatedness of all things (Schaffer 2010b). A strong notion of internal relatedness is one on which two entities are internally related if and only if neither can exist without the other (necessarily, either both exist or neither exist). The idea of combinatorial constraints may be seen as a useful weakening of this strong notion of internal relatedness. So understood, to claim that all things are internally related just is to claim that there are combinational constraints between all things, and the inference from the internal relatedness of all things to priority monism just is the inference from combinatorial constraints to a holistic common ground, which accounts for the constraints.

3.2.7 Nomic integrity and island universes

A seventh argument to consider—drawn from Schaffer 2013—is the argument from nomic integrity. This argument notes that the world is a single integrated causal system, and uses that observation to argue for priority monism as follows:

  1. Basic objects evolve by the fundamental laws.
  2. The cosmos is the one and only thing which evolves by the fundamental laws.
  3. The cosmos is the one and only basic object.

The core idea is that our fundamental laws of nature govern the temporal evolution of the cosmos as a whole, applying at most approximately and derivatively to any merely partial subsystem, such that “the cosmos ticks like a single clockwork” and “reality acts as one” (Schaffer 2013: 67). As Ellis (2001: 249) says:

It is possible to say a great deal about the world as a whole. We can point to global structuring principles, universal processes of world evolution, general symmetries, a common ontological basis of reality, a single origin of the universe, and various universally conserved quantities … The world [has] a highly integrated and coherent structure.

In other words, the causal/nomic structure of the world makes it look more like an integrated unity than a mere heap.

The priority pluralist or nihilist could deny 29, but 29 seems to fit a fairly standard image in philosophy of science. Thus Maudlin (2007: 172) writes:

[T]he fundamental laws of nature appear to be laws of temporal evolution: they specify how the state of the universe will, or might, evolve from a given initial state.

29 is just an expression of the idea that nomic evolutions concern states of the whole universe, and not mere subsystems. One way to support this idea is to note that nomic evolutions concern the behavior of closed systems, and only the universe as a whole forms a closed system.

Rather the priority pluralist or nihilist is more likely to deny 28, and say that it is too demanding a standard for basicness. In this vein, Miller (2014) responds by allowing that it is a necessary condition on a plurality being the plurality of basic objects that they plurally evolve by the fundamental laws, but adding that further constraints on fundamentality can also come in to filter out bad pluralities (such as the plurality of each left foot, plus the rest of the cosmos minus the fusion of all the left feet).

Priority pluralists can also use modalized versions of 28 (“Necessarily, basic objects evolve by the fundamental laws”) plus the possibility of island universes to pose a problem for the priority monist (Schaffer 2013: 83, Baron and Tallant 2016, Siegel 2016). An island universe in the sense relevant to the argument is not a spatiotemporally disconnected universe with multiple disconnected regions (as discussed by Lewis 1986: 71–3), but a causally disconnected universe with multiple causally/nomically separate closed systems. The counter-argument (compare Baron & Tallant 2016: 590) is that such island universes are possible, and so—given a modalized version of 28—scenarios with a plurality of basic objects are possible, and so priority monism is not necessarily true. Tack on the premise that if priority monism is true then it is necessarily true, and it follows that priority monism is false.

The main options for the priority monist seem to be denying the modalized version of 28 (Schaffer 2013: 84), and so claiming that priority monism holds even at island universes; or denying the final premise that if priority monism is true then it is necessarily true, and instead claiming that the matter is contingent (Siegel 2016). But whatever option the priority monist should take, it is hard to see how an argument premised on the claim that it is necessary that basic objects evolve by the fundamental laws, could refute priority monism in the end, given the claim in 29 that the cosmos is the one and only thing which actually evolves by the fundamental laws. That much at least gets us the actual truth of priority monism.

3.2.8 Modal cut and paste

There are further arguments to consider against priority monism, which use modal cut and paste principles to either paste our cosmos into a bigger world, or cut parts of our cosmos to make a smaller world. Here is a way to run the pasting argument:

  1. If priority monism is true, then priority monism is necessarily true.
  2. Fundamentality is an intrinsic property that does not differ among duplicates.
  3. It is possible that a duplicate of our cosmos could be embedded as a proper part of a larger cosmos.
  4. If priority monism is necessarily true then fundamentality is not an intrinsic property and does differ among duplicates.
  5. Priority monism is not true.

The core idea is that it is possible that a duplicate of our cosmos Cos could be embedded in a still larger world \(w^+\). If priority monism is necessary then it holds at \(w^+\) so Cos (being a mere proper part of \(w^+\) is not fundamental at \(w^+\). But if Cos is not fundamental at \(w^+\), and fundamentality never differs between duplicates then the cosmos is not actually fundamental at our world, since it has a non-fundamental duplicate at \(w^+\).

The priority monist could deny 31, but that presumably means abandoning the argument from gunk (in particular thesis 14). The priority monist could also deny 33 but that seems desperate. It may be that the priority monist is best advised to deny 32, and maintain that fundamentality is an extrinsic property. After all, she identifies fundamentality with the extrinsic status of mereological maximality. It is not clear what the positive argument would be for 32, but the priority monist could float some independent counterexamples such as: (1) a given phenomenal feel, which is not fundamental at physicalist worlds but is fundamental at dualist worlds; and (2) the entire physical world, which is fundamental at physicalist worlds but is not fundamental at worlds where it is sustained by a more fundamental deity.

A related argument is the cutting argument, from Steinberg (2015: 2026; see also Benocci 2017 and Calosi forthcoming), which uses the idea of cutting out parts of our cosmos to make a smaller world. The argument may be phrased as:

  1. Priority is an internal relation.
  2. If priority monism is true, then priority monism is necessarily true.
  3. Any object and its parts could be an entire world.
  4. Some parts are prior to wholes.

The guiding idea here is to use 36, 38, and 39 to show that monism is possibly false, by finding a whole whose parts are prior to it, and then cutting away the rest to leave a world whose parts remain prior to it.

36 is much harder to deny than 31, 37 is just 32 again, 38 seems plausible, and 39 is just the commonsense attitude towards mere heaps (§3.2.1). Steinberg thinks the priority monist should deny 39, but take this to be “a heavy burden” and seems inclined to reject priority monism. Benocci denies 37, and Calosi denies 38.

There may be a tuquoque argument in the works against the priority pluralist, that replaces 37 with the analogue claim for the pluralist:

  1. If priority pluralism is true, then priority pluralism is necessarily true.

And then replaces 39 with:

  1. Some wholes are prior to parts.

41 is just the commonsense attitude towards integrated unities, that are not like a heap but like a syllable (§3.2.1). Like all tu quoque arguments, this does not show what went wrong in the original. But something must go. 36–38 paired with 36, 38, and 40 seem to drive us to the extreme view that every possible part-whole complex exhibits the same direction of dependence (leaving open which direction this is), no matter how heap-like or how syllable-like it may be. Perhaps what these arguments reveal is that the nuanced stance of commonsense is not sustainable. This leaves open which direction needs revision.

Obviously there is a great deal more that could be said, but overall it is perhaps fair to conclude that priority monism deserves serious reconsideration, of a kind that it is now beginning to receive. There seem to be no knockdown arguments against priority monism. Or at least, none of the arguments against priority monism surveyed here seem in any way decisive. This may be surprising to those raised on the idea that monism can only be some obscure or ridiculous idea. Moreover, there may even be some decent arguments for priority monism. Or at least, the arguments for priority monism surveyed here seem to have some potential, given further cultivation. This terrain has lain fallow for nearly one hundred years.


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