The Moral Status of Animals

First published Tue Jul 1, 2003; substantive revision Wed Aug 23, 2017

Is there something distinctive about humanity that justifies the idea that humans have moral status while non-humans do not? Providing an answer to this question has become increasingly important among philosophers as well as those outside of philosophy who are interested in our treatment of non-human animals. For some, answering this question will enable us to better understand the nature of human beings and the proper scope of our moral obligations. Some argue that there is an answer that can distinguish humans from the rest of the natural world. Many of those who accept this answer are interested in justifying certain human practices towards non-humans—practices that cause pain, discomfort, suffering and death. This latter group expects that in answering the question in a particular way, humans will be justified in granting moral consideration to other humans that is neither required nor justified when considering non-human animals. In contrast to this view, an increasing number of philosophers have argued that while humans are different in a variety of ways from each other and other animals, these differences do not provide a philosophical defense for denying non-human animals moral consideration. What the basis of moral consideration is and what it amounts to has been the source of much disagreement.

1. The Moral Considerability of Animals

To say that a being deserves moral consideration is to say that there is a moral claim that this being can make on those who can recognize such claims. A morally considerable being is a being who can be wronged. It is often thought that because only humans can recognize moral claims, it is only humans who are morally considerable. However, when we ask why we think humans are the only types of beings that can be morally wronged, we begin to see that the class of beings able to recognize moral claims and the class of beings who can suffer moral wrongs are not co-extensive.

1.1 Speciesism

The view that only humans are morally considered is sometimes referred to as “speciesism”. In the 1970s, Richard Ryder coined this term while campaigning in Oxford to denote a ubiquitous type of human centered prejudice, which he thought was similar to racism. He objected to favoring one’s own species, while exploiting or harming members of other species. Peter Singer popularized the term and focused on the way speciesism, without moral justification, favors the interests of humans:

the racist violates the principle of equality by giving greater weight to the interests of members of his own race, when there is a clash between their interests and the interests of those of another race. Similarly the speciesist allows the interests of his own species to override the greater interests of members of other species. The pattern is the same in each case. (Singer 1974: 108)

Discrimination based on race, like discrimination based on species is thought to be prejudicial, because these are not characteristics that matter when it comes to making moral claims.

Speciesist actions and attitudes are prejudicial because there is no prima facie reason for preferring the interests of beings belonging to the species group to which one also belongs over the interests of those who don’t. That humans are members of the species Homo sapiens is certainly a distinguishing feature of humans—humans share a genetic make-up and a distinctive physiology, we all emerge from a human pregnancy, but this is unimportant from the moral point of view. Species membership is a morally irrelevant characteristic, a bit of luck that is no more morally interesting than being born in Malaysia or Canada. As a morally irrelevant characteristic it cannot serve as the basis for a view that holds that our species deserves moral consideration that is not owed to members of other species.

One might respond that it is not membership in a biological category that matters morally, but rather the social meaning of those categories, meanings that structure not only the institutions we operate within, but how we conceptualize ourselves and our world. Humans have developed moral systems as well as a wide range of other valuable practices, and by creating these systems, we separate the human from the rest of the animal kingdom. But the category “human” itself is morally contested. Some argue, for example, that racism is not simply, or even primarily about discrimination and prejudice, but rather a mechanism of dehumanizing blackness so as to provide the conditions that makes humans white (see Fanon 1967; Kim 2015; Ko& Ko 2017). According to this line of thought, speciesism isn’t focused on discrimination or prejudice but is a central tool for creating human (and white) supremacy or exceptionalism.

1.2 Human Exceptionalism

Like speciesism, human exceptionalism can be understood in different ways. The most common way of understanding it is to suggest that there are distinctly human capacities and it is on the basis of these capacities that humans have moral status and other animals do not. But which capacities mark out all and only humans as the kinds of beings that can be wronged? A number of candidate capacities have been proposed—developing family ties, solving social problems, expressing emotions, starting wars, having sex for pleasure, using language, or thinking abstractly, are just a few. As it turns out, none of these activities is uncontroversially unique to human. Both scholarly and popular work on animal behavior suggests that many of the activities that are thought to be distinct to humans occurs in non-humans. For example, many species of non-humans develop long lasting kinship ties—orangutan mothers stay with their young for eight to ten years and while they eventually part company, they continue to maintain their relationships. Less solitary animals, such as chimpanzees, baboons, wolves, and elephants maintain extended family units built upon complex individual relationships, for long periods of time. Meerkats in the Kalahari desert are known to sacrifice their own safety by staying with sick or injured family members so that the fatally ill will not die alone. All animals living in socially complex groups must solve various problems that inevitably arise in such groups. Canids and primates are particularly adept at it, yet even chickens and horses are known to recognize large numbers of individuals in their social hierarchies and to maneuver within them. One of the ways that non-human animals negotiate their social environments is by being particularly attentive to the emotional states of others around them. When a conspecific is angry, it is a good idea to get out of his way. Animals that develop life-long bonds are known to suffer from the death of their partners. Some are even said to die of sorrow. Darwin reported this in The Descent of Man: “So intense is the grief of female monkeys for the loss of their young, that it invariably caused the death of certain kinds” (1871: 40). Jane Goodall’s report of the death of the healthy 8 year old chimpanzee Flint just three weeks after the death of his mother Flo also suggests that sorrow can have a devastating effect on non-human animals (see Goodall 2000: 140–141 in Bekoff 2000). Coyotes, elephants and killer whales are also among the species for which profound effects of grief have been reported (Bekoff 2000) and many dog owners can provide similar accounts. While the lives of many, perhaps most, non-humans in the wild are consumed with struggle for survival, aggression and battle, there are some non-humans whose lives are characterized by expressions of joy, playfulness, and a great deal of sex (Woods 2010). Recent studies in cognitive ethology have suggested that some non-humans engage in manipulative and deceptive activity, can construct “cognitive maps” for navigation, and some non-humans appear to understand symbolic representation and are able to use language.[1]

It appears that most of the capacities that are thought to distinguish humans as morally considerable beings, have been observed, often in less elaborate form, in the non-human world. Because human behavior and cognition share deep roots with the behavior and cognition of other animals, approaches that try to find sharp behavioral or cognitive boundaries between humans and other animals remain controversial. For this reason, attempts to establish human uniqueness by identifying certain capacities, are not the most promising when it comes to thinking hard about the moral status of animals.

1.3 Personhood

Nonetheless, there is something important that is thought to distinguish humans from non-humans that is not reducible to the observation of behavior best explained by possessing a certain capacity and that is our “personhood”. The notion of personhood identifies a category of morally considerable beings that is thought to be coextensive with humanity. Historically, Kant is the most noted defender of personhood as the quality that makes a being valuable and thus morally considerable (for a contemporary utilitarian discussion of personhood, see Varner 2012). Kant writes:

…every rational being, exists as an end in himself and not merely as a means to be arbitrarily used by this or that will…Beings whose existence depends not on our will but on nature have, nevertheless, if they are not rational beings, only a relative value as means and are therefore called things. On the other hand, rational beings are called persons inasmuch as their nature already marks them out as ends in themselves. (Kant [1785] 1998: [Ak 4: 428])

And:

The fact that the human being can have the representation “I” raises him infinitely above all the other beings on earth. By this he is a person….that is, a being altogether different in rank and dignity from things, such as irrational animals, with which one may deal and dispose at one’s discretion. (Kant [1798] 2010: 239 [Ak 7: 127])

More recent work in a Kantian vein develops this idea. Christine Korsgaard, for example, argues that humans “uniquely” face a problem, the problem of normativity. This problem emerges because of the reflective structure of human consciousness. We can, and often do, think about our desires and ask ourselves “Are these desires reasons for action? Do these impulses represent the kind of things I want to act according to?” Our reflective capacities allow us and require us to step back from our mere impulses in order to determine when and whether to act on them. In stepping back we gain a certain distance from which we can answer these questions and solve the problem of normativity. We decide whether to treat our desires as reasons for action based on our conceptions of ourselves, on our “practical identities”. When we determine whether we should take a particular desire as a reason to act we are engaging in a further level of reflection, a level that requires an endorseable description of ourselves. This endorseable description of ourselves, this practical identity, is a necessary moral identity because without it we cannot view our lives as worth living or our actions as worth doing. Korsgaard suggests that humans face the problem of normativity in a way that non-humans apparently do not:

A lower animal’s attention is fixed on the world. Its perceptions are its beliefs and its desires are its will. It is engaged in conscious activities, but it is not conscious of them. That is, they are not the objects of its attention. But we human animals turn our attention on to our perceptions and desires themselves, on to our own mental activities, and we are conscious of them. That is why we can think about them…And this sets us a problem that no other animal has. It is the problem of the normative…. The reflective mind cannot settle for perception and desire, not just as such. It needs a reason. (Korsgaard 1996: 93)

Here, Korsgaard understands “reason” as “a kind of reflective success” and given that non-humans are thought to be unable to reflect in a way that would allow them this sort of success, it appears that they do not act on reasons, at least reasons of this kind. Since non-humans do not act on reasons they do not have a practical identity from which they reflect and for which they act. So humans can be distinguished from non-humans because humans, we might say, are sources of normativity and non-humans are not.

1.3.1 Rational Persons

But arguably, Kant’s view of personhood does not distinguish all and only humans as morally considerable. Personhood is not, in fact, coextensive with humanity when understood as a general description of the group to which human beings belong. And the serious part of this problem is not that there may be some extra-terrestrials or deities who have rational capacities. The serious problem is that many humans are not persons. Some humans—i.e., infants, children, people with advanced forms of autism or Alzheimer’s disease or other cognitive disorders—do not have the rational, self-reflective capacities associated with personhood. This problem, unfortunately known in the literature as the problem of “marginal cases”, poses serious difficulties for “personhood” as the criterion of moral considerability. Many beings whose positive moral value we have deeply held intuitions about, and who we treat as morally considerable, will be excluded from consideration by this account.

There are three ways to respond to this counter-intuitive conclusion. One, which can be derived from one interpretation of Kant, is to suggest that non-persons are morally considerable indirectly. Though Kant believed that animals were mere things it appears he did not genuinely believe we could dispose of them any way we wanted. In the Lectures on Ethics he makes it clear that we have indirect duties to animals, duties that are not toward them, but in regard to them insofar as our treatment of them can affect our duties to persons.

If a man shoots his dog because the animal is no longer capable of service, he does not fail in his duty to the dog, for the dog cannot judge, but his act is inhuman and damages in himself that humanity which it is his duty to show towards mankind. If he is not to stifle his human feelings, he must practice kindness towards animals, for he who is cruel to animals becomes hard also in his dealings with men. ([1784–5] 1997: 212 [Ak 27: 459])

And one could argue the same would be true of those human beings who are not persons. We disrespect our humanity when we act in inhumane ways towards non-persons, whatever their species.

But this indirect view is unsatisfying—it fails to capture the independent wrong that is being done to the non-person. When someone rapes a woman in a coma, or whips a severely brain damaged child, or sets a cat on fire, they are not simply disrespecting humanity or themselves as representatives of it, they are wronging these non-persons. So, a second way to avoid the counter-intuitive conclusion is to argue that such non-persons stand in the proper relations to “rational nature” such that they should be thought of as morally considerable. Allen Wood (1998) argues in this way and suggests that all beings that potentially have a rational nature, or who virtually have it, or who have had it, or who have part of it, or who have the necessary conditions of it, what he calls “the infrastructure of rational nature”, should be directly morally considerable. Insofar as a being stands in this relation to rational nature, they are the kinds of beings that can be wronged.

This response is not unlike that of noted animal rights proponent, Tom Regan, who argues that what is important for moral consideration are not the differences between humans and non-humans but the similarities. Regan argues that because persons share with certain non-persons (which includes those humans and non-humans who have a certain level of organized cognitive function) the ability to be experiencing subject of a life and to have an individual welfare that matters to them regardless of what others might think, both deserve moral consideration. Regan argues that subjects of a life:

want and prefer things, believe and feel things, recall and expect things. And all these dimensions of our life, including our pleasure and pain, our enjoyment and suffering, our satisfaction and frustration, our continued existence or our untimely death—all make a difference to the quality of our life as lived, as experienced, by us as individuals. As the same is true of … animals … they too must be viewed as the experiencing subjects of a life, with inherent value of their own. (Regan 1985: 24)

A third way of addressing this problem has been taken up by Korsgaard who maintains that there is a big difference between those with normative, rational capacities and those without, but unlike Kant, believes both humans and non-humans are the proper objects of our moral concern. She argues that those without normative, rational capacities share certain “natural” capacities with persons, and these natural capacities are often the content of the moral demands that persons make on each other. She writes,

what we demand, when we demand … recognition, is that our natural concerns—the objects of our natural desires and interests and affections—be accorded the status of values, values that must be respected as far as possible by others. And many of those natural concerns—the desire to avoid pain is an obvious example—spring from our animal nature, not from our rational nature. (Korsgaard 2007: 7)

What moral agents construct as valuable and normatively binding is not only our rational or autonomous capacities, but the needs and desires we have as living, embodied beings. Insofar as these needs and desires are valuable for agents, the ability to experience similar needs and desires in patients should also be valued.

1.3.2 Legal Persons

In the courts, all humans and some corporations are considered persons in the legal sense. But all animals, infants and adults, are not legal persons, but rather, under the law they are considered property. There have been a few attempts to change the legal status of some nonhuman animals from property to persons. The Nonhuman Rights Project (NhRP) founded by Steven Wise, has filed a series of cases in the New York courts seeking to establish legal personhood for particular chimpanzees being held in the state, with the goal of protecting their rights to bodily integrity and liberty, and allow them to seek remedy, through their proxies, when those rights are violated. Chimpanzees are a good test case for establishing nonhuman legal personhood as they are, according to the documents filed by NhRP, autonomous beings with sophisticated cognitive abilities including

episodic memory, self-consciousness, self-knowing, self agency, referential and intentional communication, mental time-travel, numerosity, sequential learning, meditational learning, mental state modeling, visual perspective taking, understanding the experiences of others, intentional action, planning, imagination, empathy, metacognition, working memory, decision-making, imitation, deferred imitation, emulation, innovation, material, social, and symbolic culture, cross-modal perception, tool-use, tool-making, cause-and-effect. (petition of NhRP v. Samuel Stanley, p. 12, see Other Internet Resources)

The legal arguments to extend personhood beyond the human parallel more general ethical arguments that extend ethical consideration outward from those who occupy the moral center. Turning to empirical work designed to show that other animals are really similar to those considered legal persons, primatologists submitted affidavits attesting to what they have learned working with chimpanzees. Mary Lee Jensvold suggests

there are numerous parallels in the way chimpanzee and human communication skills develop over time, suggesting a similar unfolding cognitive process across the two species and an underlying neurobiological continuity. (Jensvold affidavit, p. 4, in Other Internet Resources)

James King notes

chimpanzees and humans resemble each other in terms of their ability to experience happiness and the way in which it relates to individual personality. (King affidavit, p. 8, in Other Internet Resources)

And Mathias Osvath makes remarkable claims about chimpanzee personhood:

Autonoetic consciousness gives an individual of any species an autobiographical sense of it self with a future and a past. Chimps and other great apes clearly possess an autobiographical self, as they are able to prepare themselves for future actions… they likely can, just as humans, be in pain over an anticipated future event that has yet to occur. For instance, confining someone in a prison or cage for a set time, or for life, would lose much of its power as punishment if that individual had no self-concept. Every moment would be a new moment with no conscious relation to the next. But, chimpanzees. and other great apes have a concept of their personal past and future and therefore suffer the pain of not being able to fulfill one’s goals or move around as one wants; like humans they experience the pain of anticipating a never-ending situation. (Osvath affidavit, pp. 4–7, in Other Internet Resources)

These claims, as well as those of others experts, identify the relevantly similar capacities that chimpanzees and other great apes share with humans and it is in virtue of these capacities that legal personhood is sought.

1.4 Sentience

Using rational nature or cognitive capacities as the touchstone of moral considerability misses an important fact about animals, human and nonhuman. Our lives can go better or worse for us. Utilitarians have traditionally argued that the truly morally important feature of beings is unappreciated when we focus on personhood or the rational, self-reflective nature of humans, or the relation a being stands in to such nature, or being the subject of a life, or being legal persons. What is really important, utilitarians maintain, is the promotion of happiness, or pleasure, or the satisfaction of interests, and the avoidance of pain, or suffering, or frustration of interests. Bentham, one of the more forceful defenders of this sentientist view of moral considerability, famously wrote:

Other animals, which, on account of their interests having been neglected by the insensibility of the ancient jurists, stand degraded into the class of things. [original emphasis] … The day has been, I grieve it to say in many places it is not yet past, in which the greater part of the species, under the denomination of slaves, have been treated … upon the same footing as … animals are still. The day may come, when the rest of the animal creation may acquire those rights which never could have been withholden from them but by the hand of tyranny. The French have already discovered that the blackness of skin is no reason why a human being should be abandoned without redress to the caprice of a tormentor. It may come one day to be recognized, that the number of legs, the villosity of the skin, or the termination of the ossacrum, are reasons equally insufficient for abandoning a sensitive being to the same fate. What else is it that should trace the insuperable line? Is it the faculty of reason, or perhaps, the faculty for discourse?…the question is not, Can they reason? nor, Can they talk? but, Can they suffer? (Bentham 1780/1789: chapter xvii, paragraph 6)

Contemporary utilitarians, such as Peter Singer (1990, 1979 [1993]), suggest that there is no morally justifiable way to exclude from moral consideration non-humans or non-persons who can clearly suffer. Any being that has an interest in not suffering deserves to have that interest taken into account. And a non-human who acts to avoid pain can be thought to have just such an interest. Even contemporary Kantians have acknowledged the moral force of the experience of pain. Korsgaard, for example, writes “it is a pain to be in pain. And that is not a trivial fact” (1996: 154).

When you pity a suffering animal, it is because you are perceiving a reason. An animal’s cries express pain, and they mean that there is a reason, a reason to change its conditions. And you can no more hear the cries of an animal as mere noise than you can the words of a person. Another animal can obligate you in exactly the same way another person can. …So of course we have obligations to animals. (Korsgaard 1996: 153)

When we encounter an animal in pain we recognize their claim on us, and thus beings who can suffer are morally considerable.

2. The Moral Significance of Animals’ Moral Claims

That non-human animals can make moral claims on us does not in itself indicate how such claims are to be assessed and conflicting claims adjudicated. Being morally considerable is like showing up on a moral radar screen—how strong the signal is or where it is located on the screen are separate questions. Of course, how one argues for the moral considerability of non-human animals will inform how we are to understand the force of an animal’s claims.

According to the view that an animal’s moral claim is equivalent to a moral right, any action that fails to treat the animal as a being with inherent worth would violate that animal’s right and is thus morally objectionable. According to the animal rights position, to treat an animal as a means to some human end, as many humans do when they eat animals or experiment on them, is to violate that animal’s right. As Tom Regan has written,

…animals are treated routinely, systematically as if their value were reducible to their usefulness to others, they are routinely, systematically treated with a lack of respect, and thus are their rights routinely, systematically violated. (Regan 1985: 24).

The animal rights position is an absolutist position. Any being that is a subject of a life has inherent worth and the rights that protect such worth, and all subjects of a life have these rights equally. Thus any practice that fails to respect the rights of those animals who have them, e.g., eating animals, hunting animals, experimenting on animals, using animals for entertainment, is wrong, irrespective of human need, context, or culture.

The utilitarian position on animals, most commonly associated with Peter Singer and popularly, though erroneously, referred to as an animal rights position, is actually quite distinct. Here the moral significance of the claims of animals depends on what other morally significant competing claims might be in play in any given situation. While the equal interests of all morally considerable beings are considered equally, the practices in question may end up violating or frustrating some interests but would not be considered morally wrong if, when all equal interests are considered, more of these interests are satisfied than frustrated. For utilitarians like Singer, what matters are the strength and nature of interests, not whose interests these are. So, if the only options available in order to save the life of one morally considerable being is to cause harm, but not death, to another morally considerable being, then according to a utilitarian position, causing this harm may be morally justifiable. Similarly, if there are two courses of action, one which causes extreme amounts of suffering and ultimate death, and one which causes much less suffering and painless death, then the latter would be morally preferable to the former.

Consider factory farming, the most common method used to convert animal bodies into relatively inexpensive food in industrialized societies today. An estimated 8 billion animals in the United States are born, confined, biologically manipulated, transported and ultimately slaughtered each year so that humans can consume them. The conditions in which these animals are raised and the method of slaughter causes vast amounts of suffering (see, for example, Mason & Singer 1980 [1990]). Given that animals suffer under such conditions and assuming that suffering is not in their interests, then the practice of factory farming would only be morally justifiable if its abolition were to cause greater suffering or a greater amount of interest frustration. Certainly humans who take pleasure in eating animals will find it harder to satisfy these interests in the absence of factory farms; it may cost more and require more effort to obtain animal products. The factory farmers, and the industries that support factory farming, will also have certain interests frustrated if factory farming were to be abolished. How much interest frustration and interest satisfaction would be associated with the end to factory farming is largely an empirical question. But utilitarians are not making unreasonable predictions when they argue that on balance the suffering and interest frustration that animals experience in modern day meat production is greater than the suffering that humans would endure if they had to alter their current practices.

Importantly, the utilitarian argument for the moral significance of animal suffering in meat production is not an argument for vegetarianism. If an animal lived a happy life and was painlessly killed and then eaten by people who would otherwise suffer hunger or malnutrition by not eating the animal, then painlessly killing and eating the animal would be the morally justified thing to do. In many parts of the world where economic, cultural, or climate conditions make it virtually impossible for people to sustain themselves on plant based diets, killing and eating animals that previously led relatively unconstrained lives and are painlessly killed, would not be morally objectionable. The utilitarian position can thus avoid certain charges of cultural chauvinism and moralism, charges that the animal rights position apparently cannot avoid.

It might be objected that to suggest that it is morally acceptable to hunt and eat animals for those people living in arctic regions, or for nomadic cultures, or for poor rural peoples, for example, is to potentially condone painlessly killing other morally considerable beings, like humans, for food consumption in similar situations. If violating the rights of an animal can be morally tolerated, especially a right to life, then similar rights violations can be morally tolerated. In failing to recognize the inviolability of the moral claims of all morally considerable beings, utilitarianism cannot accommodate one of our most basic prima facie principles, namely that killing a morally considerable being is wrong.

There are at least two replies to this sort of objection. The first appeals to the negative side effects that killing may promote. If, to draw on an overused and sadly sophomoric counter-example, one person can be kidnapped and painlessly killed in order to provide body parts for four individuals who will die without them, there will inevitably be negative side-effects that all things considered would make the kidnapping wrong. Healthy people, knowing they could be used for spare parts, might make themselves unhealthy to avoid such a fate or they may have so much stress and fear that the overall state of affairs would be worse than that in which four people died. Appealing to side-effects when it comes to the wrong of killing is certainly plausible, but it fails to capture what is directly wrong with killing.

A more satisfying reply would have us adopt what might be called a multi-factor perspective, one that takes into account the kinds of interest that are possible for certain kinds of morally considerable beings, the content of interests of the beings in question, their relative weight, and the context of those who have them. Consider a seal who has spent his life freely roaming the oceans and ice flats and who is suddenly and painlessly killed to provide food for a human family struggling to survive a bitter winter in far northern climes. While it is probably true that the seal had an immediate interest in avoiding suffering, it is less clear that the seal has a future directed interest in continued existence. If the seal lacks this future directed interest, then painlessly killing him does not violate this interest. The same cannot be said for the human explorer who finds himself face to face with a hungry Inuit family. Persons generally have interests in continued existence, interests that, arguably, non-persons do not have. So one factor that can be appealed to is that non-persons may not have the range of interests that persons do.

An additional factor is the type of interest in question. We can think of interests as scalar; crucial interests are weightier than important interests, important interests are weightier than replaceable interests, and all are weightier than trivial interests or mere whims. When there is a conflict of interests, crucial interests will always override important interests, important interests will always override replaceable interests, etc. So if an animal has an interest in not suffering, which is arguably a crucial interest, or at least an important one, and a person has an interest in eating that animal when there are other things to eat, meaning that interest is replaceable, then the animal has the stronger interest and it would be wrong to violate that interest by killing the animal for food if there is another source of food available.

Often, however, conflicts of interests are within the same category. The Inuit’s interest in food is crucial and the explorer’s interest in life is crucial. If we assume that the explorer cannot otherwise provide food for the hunter, then it looks as if there is a conflict within the same category. If you take the interests of an indigenous hunter’s whole family into account, then their combined interest in their own survival appears to outweigh the hapless explorer’s interest in continued existence. Indeed, if painlessly killing and eating the explorer were the only way for the family to survive, then perhaps this action would be morally condoned. But this is a rather extreme sort of example, one in which even our deepest held convictions are strained. So it is quite hard to know what to make of the clash between what a utilitarian would condone and what our intuitions tell us we should believe here. Our most basic prima facie principles arise and are accepted under ordinary circumstances. Extraordinary circumstances are precisely those in which such principles or precepts give way.[2]

The multi-factor utilitarian perspective is particularly helpful when considering the use of animals in medical research. According to the animal rights position, the use of animals in experimental procedures is a clear violation of their rights—they are being used as a mere means to some possible end—and thus animal rights proponents are in favor of the abolition of all laboratory research. The utilitarian position, particularly one that incorporates some kind of multi-factor perspective, might allow some research on animals under very specific conditions. Before exploring what a utilitarian might condone in the way of animal experimentation, let us first quickly consider what would be morally prohibited. All research that involves invasive procedures, constant confinement, and ultimate death can be said to violate the animal’s crucial interests. Thus any experiments that are designed to enhance the important, replaceable, or trivial interests of humans or other animals would be prohibited. That would mean that experiments for cosmetics or household products are prohibited, as there are non-animal tested alternatives and many options already available for consumers. Certain psychological experiments, such as those in which infant primates are separated from their mothers and exposed to frightening stimuli in an effort to understand problems teenagers have when they enter high school, would also come into question. There are many examples of experiments that violate an animal’s crucial interests in the hopes of satisfying the lesser interests of some other morally considerable being, all of which would be objectionable from this perspective.

There are some laboratory experiments, however, that from a multi-factor utilitarian perspective may be permitted. These are experiments in which the probability of satisfying crucial or important interests for many who suffer from some debilitating or fatal disease is high, and the numbers of non-human animals whose crucial interests are violated is low. The psychological complexity of the non-humans may also be significant in determining whether the experiment is morally justified. In the case of experimenting in these limited number of cases, presumably a parallel argument could be made about experimenting on humans. If the chances are very high that experimenting on one human, who is a far superior experimental animal when it comes to human disease, can prevent great suffering or death in many humans, then the utilitarian may, if side effects are minimal, condone such an experiment. Of course, it is easier to imagine this sort of extreme case in the abstract, what a utilitarian would think actually morally justified, again depends on the specific empirical data.

In sum, the animal rights position takes the significance of morally considerable claims to be absolute. Thus, any use of animals that involves a disregard for their moral claims is problematic. The significance of an animal’s morally considerable interests according to a utilitarian is variable. Whether an action is morally justified or permissible will depend on a number of factors. The utilitarian position on animals would condemn a large number of practices that involve the suffering and death of billions of animals, but there are cases in which some use of non-human animals, and perhaps even human animals, may be morally justified (Gruen 2011: ch. 4; Gilbert, Kaebnick, & Murray 2012).

3. Alternative Perspectives on Human Relations to Other Animals

Given the long-standing view that non-humans are mere things, there are still many who reject the arguments presented here for the moral considerability of non-humans and the significance of their interests. Nonetheless, most now realize that the task of arguing that humans have a unique and exclusive moral status is rather difficult. Yet even amongst those who do view animals as within the sphere of moral concern, there is disagreement about the nature and usefulness of the arguments presented on behalf of the moral status of animals.

Increasingly, philosophers are arguing that while our behavior towards animals is indeed subject to moral scrutiny, the kinds of ethical arguments that are usually presented frame the issues in the wrong way. Some philosophers suggest that rational argumentation fails to capture those features of moral experience that allow us to really see why treating animals badly is wrong. The point, according to commentators such as Stephen R.L. Clark and Cora Diamond, for example, is that members of our communities, however we conceive of them, pull on us and it is in virtue of this pull that we recognize what is wrong with cruelty. Animals are individuals with whom we share a common life and this recognition allows us to see them as they are. Eating animals is wrong not because it is a violation of the animal’s rights or because on balance such an act creates more suffering than other acts, but rather because in eating animals or using them in other harmful, violent ways, we do not display the traits of character that kind, sensitive, compassionate, mature, and thoughtful members of a moral community should display.

According to some in the virtue ethics tradition, carefully worked out arguments in which the moral considerability and moral significance of animals are laid out will have little if any grip on our thoughts and actions. Rather, by perceiving the attitudes that underlie the use and abuse of non-human animals as shallow or cruel, one interested in living a virtuous life will change their attitudes and come to reject treating animals as food or tools for research. As Rosalind Hursthouse recognized after having been exposed to alternative ways of seeing animals:

I began to see [my attitudes] that related to my conception of flesh-foods as unnecessary, greedy, self-indulgent, childish, my attitude to shopping and cooking in order to produce lavish dinner parties as parochial, gross, even dissolute. I saw my interest and delight in nature programmes about the lives of animals on television and my enjoyment of meat as side by side at odds with one another…Without thinking animals had rights, I began to see both the wild ones and the ones we usually eat as having lives of their own, which they should be left to enjoy. And so I changed. My perception of the moral landscape and where I and the other animals were situated in it shifted. (Hursthouse 2000: 165–166; see also Diamond 2001 [especially chs. 11 and 13], and Clarke 1977)

Alice Crary argues that shifting perceptions of our moral landscapes occur because these landscapes, and more precisely the rich worlds of those who inhabit them, are not morally neutral. The characteristics that philosophers tend to look for in other animals to determine whether or not they are morally considerable, according to Crary, are already infused with moral importance, “human beings and other animals have empirically discoverable moral characteristics” (my emphasis, 2016: 85) that are, as she puts it “inside ethics”. These values often sneak in under a supposedly neutral gloss. By explicitly locating these characteristics inside ethics, the texture, quality, and purposes of our ethical reflection on moral considerability changes. Arriving at an adequate empirical understanding requires non-neutral methods, identifying historical and cultural perspectives as shaping how we consider other animals morally. What ethical questions we think are important and how we frame and answer them, will be different if we see our lives and the lives of other animals as already imbued with moral values.

Other feminist philosophers have taken issue with the supposedly morally neutral methods of argumentation used to establish the moral status of animals. For many feminists the traditional methods of rational argumentation fail to take into account the feelings of sympathy or empathy that humans have towards non-humans, feelings they believe are central to a full account of what we owe non-humans and why (see Adams & Donovan 1995; Donovan & Adams 2007; Adams & Gruen 2014).

Feminist philosophers have also challenged the individualism that is central in the arguments for the moral status of animals. Rather than identifying intrinsic or innate properties that non-humans share with humans, some feminists have argued instead that we ought to understand moral status in relational terms given that moral recognition is invariably a social practice. As Elizabeth Anderson has written:

Moral considerability is not an intrinsic property of any creature, nor is it supervenient on only its intrinsic properties, such as its capacities. It depends, deeply, on the kind of relations they can have with us. (Anderson 2004: 289).

And these relationships needn’t be direct. The reach of human activity has expanded across the entire globe and humans are entangled with each other and other animals in myriad ways. We participate in activities and institutions that directly or indirectly harm others by creating negative experiences, depriving them of their well-being, or denying them opportunities to be who they are and pursue what they care about. Philosophers Elisa Aaltola and Lori Gruen have argued for refining our empathetic imagination in order to improve our relationships with each other and other animals.

Even though it is challenging to understand what it is like to be another, and even though we are limited by our inevitable anthropocentric perspectives, being in respectful ethical relation involves attempting to understand and respond to another’s needs, interests, desires, vulnerabilities, hopes, and perspectives. What Gruen calls, “entangled empathy” is a process that involves both affect and cognition (Gruen 2015). Individuals who are empathizing with others respond to the other’s condition and reflectively imagine themselves in the distinct position of the other while staying attentive to both similarities and differences between herself and her situation and that of the fellow creature with whom she is empathizing. Entangled empathy involves paying critical attention to the broader conditions that may negatively affect the experiences and flourishing of those with whom one is empathizing, and this requires those of us empathizing to attend to things we might not have otherwise. It therefore also enhances our own experiences, develops our moral imagination, and helps us to become more sensitive perceivers.

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Further Reading

  • Beauchamp, Tom L. and R.G. Frey (eds.) 2011, The Oxford Handbook of Animal Ethics, New York: Oxford. doi:10.1093/oxfordhb/9780195371963.001.0001
  • Brambell, Ben and Bob Fisher, 2015, The Moral Complexity of Eating Meat, New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199353903.001.0001
  • Chignell, Andrew, Terence Cuneo, and Matthew C. Halteman (eds.) 2015, Philosophy Comes to Dinner: Arguments About the Ethics of Eating, New York: Routledge.
  • Derrida, Jacques, 2008, The Animal That Therefore I Am (Animal que donc je suis), Mary-Louise Mallet (ed.) and David Wills (trans.), New York: Fordham University Press.
  • Donaldson, Sue and Will Kymlicka, 2011, Zoopolis: A Political Theory of Animal Rights, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Gruen, Lori, 2016, “Conscious Animals and the Value of Experience” in Stephen Gardiner and Allen Thompson (eds.) The Oxford Handbook of Environmental Ethics, New York: Oxford University Press, chapter 8.
  • Haraway, Donna, 2003, The Companion Species Manifesto: Dogs, People and Significant Otherness, Chicago, IL: Prickly Paradigm Press.
  • Jones, Robert C., 2013, “Science, Sentience, and Animal Welfare”, Biology and Philosophy, 28(1): 1–30. doi:10.1007/s10539-012-9351-1
  • Kagan, Shelly, 2011, “Do I Make a Difference?”, Philosophy & Public Affairs, 39(2): 105–141. doi:10.1111/j.1088-4963.2011.01203.x
  • Korsgaard, Christine M., 2013, “Getting Animals in View”, The Point, 6. [Korsgaard 2013 available online]
  • McMahan, Jeff, 2008, “Eating Animals the Nice Way”, Daedalus, 127(1): 66–76. doi:10.1162/daed.2008.137.1.66
  • Midgley, Mary, 1983, Animals and Why They Matter, Athens, GA: University of Georgia Press.
  • Pachirat, Timothy, 2011, Every Twelve Seconds: Industrialized Slaughter and the Politics of Sight, New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.
  • Rachels, James, 1990, Created from Animals: The Moral Implications of Darwinism, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Rowlands, Mark, 2012, Can Animals Be Moral? New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Ryder, Richard D., 1989, Animal Revolution: Changing Attitudes Toward Speciesism, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • Sapontzis, Steve F. (ed.), 2004, Food for Thought: The Debate Over Eating Meat, NY: Prometheus Press.

Other Internet Resources

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