Notes to A Priorism in Moral Epistemology

1. By calling this the standard view we do not mean that it is standard among philosophers who are currently writing about the a priori, but rather that it is something like the traditional, common sense view that critics will react against and that any defenders would have to further elaborate. For a good introduction to more contemporary approaches to the a priori see the essays in Boghossian and Peacocke 2000.

2. We should emphasize that the traditional view holds that empirical propositions cannot be justified a priori. A number of philosophers have contested this orthodoxy. See, e.g., Kripke 1980, Soames 2007, and Turri 2011.

3. A maxim is, roughly, a statement of what the agent takes himself to be doing in performing an action, e.g., because I would like to possess this bicycle, I will take it even though it belongs to someone else.

4. Definitions of “good” in moral terms provide the possible exception, e.g., something is good iff it is what one ought to desire.

5. Moore did not distinguish between a proposition being self-evident and appearing true from the proposition’s appearing to be self-evident. For a discussion of the significance of this distinction, see Audi 2004, chapter 2.

6. We cannot say that PSE definitely will not be evident to a person who lacks mental maturity or has not considered it, since the person might have good grounds for believing PSE that are not related to its self-evidence, e.g., a reliable informant might have told the person it is true.

7. “Closely enough” to allow the possibility that no familiar or easily defined natural property is completely co-extensive with some moral property, but that some such natural property is very nearly co-extensive with the moral property. In such a case we may be willing to say that the nearly co-extensive natural property indeed plays the role of the moral property, and is the same as the moral property, resulting in a somewhat different extension of the moral property. If things worked out in this way, the analytic naturalist’s analysis of moral terms would be, to some extent, revisionary.

8. The naïve comprehension axiom states, roughly, that for every property, there is a set of all and only the things that have that property. The paradox, credited to Bertrand Russell, comes to light when one considers the set consisting of all and only the things that are not members of themselves. If this set is a member of itself, then it has the property of not being a member of itself. But if this set is not a member of itself, then it has the property of not being a member of itself and so is a member of the set. See entry on Russell’s paradox.

Copyright © 2016 by
Michael DePaul <>
Amelia Hicks <>

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