A Priorism in Moral Epistemology

First published Tue Jun 28, 2016; substantive revision Wed May 12, 2021

A priori knowledge is, in an important sense, independent of experience. In contrast, a posteriori knowledge depends on experiences such as empirical observations and introspection of one’s conscious states. If a proposition can be known a priori, then we can somehow see that it is true just by thinking and reasoning about it (see entry on a priori justification and knowledge). Here are some paradigm examples of propositions one can know a priori:

that all bachelors are unmarried
that all three sided plane figures will also have three angles
that 2 + 3 = 5.

Here are some paradigm examples of moral propositions:

that all murder is wrong
that no person’s good is any more important than the good of any other person
that I ought to do some volunteer work with Habitat for Humanity this weekend.

Many philosophers think we can know some moral propositions a priori. Few deny that we can know (4) a priori or the proposition that if it would be wrong not to do something, one ought to do it or other propositions that are obviously true because of definitions. But some philosophers claim we can know more significant moral propositions a priori.

On one familiar view, we can know a priori the fundamental moral principle (or principles), e.g., the principle that one ought to perform the action that has the overall best consequences, or the principle that one ought to act in accordance with virtue, or whatever the basic moral principle really is. Some hold we can know the principle via analysis or because it defines the moral term it is about. We can then know every day moral propositions about particular actions or types of actions by inferring them from the fundamental principle in conjunction with empirical facts.

However, some theorists claim we can know many more moral propositions a priori, in particular, propositions that are not so closely tied to the meaning or reference of moral terms. Others go farther, claiming that most or all moral claims can be known a priori, or even that moral claims can be known only a priori.

In this entry, we clarify the concept of a priori knowledge (and related concepts), as well as the relationship between a priori knowledge and analyticity. We then review Kant’s view of moral knowledge, early 20th century versions of non-naturalism, late 20th century versions of naturalism, particularism, and finally some 21st century versions of intuitionism—all with an eye to the role they afford to a priori knowledge.

1. Preliminaries

1.1 A Priori Knowledge and Justification: The Standard View

The concept of the a priori is fundamentally a concept of independence from experience. The a priori stands in contrast to the a posteriori or empirical. Knowledge is empirical just in case it is derived from experience. What experience includes is contested. Experience uncontroversially includes sense perception. It arguably also includes introspection and the testimony of others. Much of what we know is empirical: we know by sense perception or introspection or the testimony of others, etc. A priori knowledge—if there is any—would be independent of sense perception, introspection, etc. (see entry on rationalism vs. empiricism). A majority of epistemologists could probably agree that justification is necessary for knowledge if one interprets justification broadly (e.g., so that a belief might be justified in virtue of being produced by a reliable cognitive mechanism, or by an exercise of intellectual virtue, or by having supporting evidence from good reasons). For the purposes of this entry, we will understand justification broadly and assume that in order to have a priori knowledge of a proposition one’s belief in that proposition must be justified (see entries on the analysis of knowledge; foundationalist theories of epistemic justification; coherentist theories of epistemic justification; internalist vs. externalist conceptions of epistemic justification).

So on what we will call the standard view of a priori knowledge and justification,[1] being justified makes a very significant contribution to the epistemic status required for knowledge. Hence, for one’s knowledge to be independent of experience, one’s justification would also have to be independent of experience. Such justification is a priori.

However, it is unlikely S could be justified in believing any proposition P in a way that is completely independent of experience. For one thing, S must grasp or understand P before S could be justified in believing it. According to one familiar view, propositions involve properties and in order to understand a proposition, S must have or grasp concepts corresponding to these properties. The majority of our concepts are empirical. Hence, without experience S could not believe, or even understand, most propositions; so without experience S could not be justified in believing these propositions. For example, it is unlikely the concepts of marriage and bachelorhood are innate, so not even (1) is a proposition S could be justified in believing without any experience at all. Hence, the sense in which a priori justification is independent of experience must be further specified: at the very least, experiences required to understand a proposition, including experiences necessary to grasp the relevant concepts, do not count against being justified independently of experience.

According to the standard view of a priori justification, once S has the experiences needed to acquire the concepts of marriage and bachelorhood and S understands (1), S has justification to believe (1). No additional experience is needed. Compare:

that all bachelors are untidy.

If S has the experiences needed to acquire the concepts of bachelorhood and untidiness, acquires these concepts, and understands (7), S will not have a justification to believe (7)—even if we suppose, for the moment, that all bachelors are untidy. S would have to observe many bachelors and their personal habits, or be told about the personal habits of bachelors by others for (7) to be justified. As we’ve already noted, (1) is different: once S understands (1), this proposition will be justified for S—or so says the standard view.

So far we have only a negative account of a priori justification; it is justification that does not depend on experiences beyond those necessary for understanding. But in virtue of what could S be justified in believing something apart from experience? The standard answer appeals to the special nature of the propositions that can be a priori justified: they are supposed to be self-evident.

A proposition P is self-evident just in case P is evident for any person S who understands P. (P is evident for S when S has a degree of justification for P that, when combined with some other conditions, is sufficient for S to have knowledge of P.)

This definition of self-evidence may not be entirely satisfactory. One seeking a positive, informative account of how S could be justified in believing P simply in virtue of the fact that S understands P should not be satisfied when told that P is a special, self-evident proposition, when all this means is that P is justified to a high degree for everyone who understands it. Nevertheless, the lack of an explanation of the mechanism that brings something about is not a decisive reason for thinking it could not come about. We shall assume that (SE) correctly defines self-evidence.

Even though any person, S, who understands a self-evident proposition, PSE, will be justified in believing PSE to a degree sufficient for knowledge, we cannot say that if S understands PSE and believes PSE, then S will know PSE. We have not yet addressed the connection between self-evidence and truth, but this is not the problem: self-evidence is taken to imply truth. To explain why S could understand and believe PSE but fail to know PSE, it will be helpful to distinguish between propositional justification and doxastic justification.

We introduce the distinction in terms of having good reasons, but it can be generalized to other ways of being justified. If S has good reasons for believing a proposition, P, e.g., if S knows some propositions that straightforwardly entail P, S has a propositional justification for P. Note that P might be propositionally justified for S even though S does not believe P—while S knows propositions that entail P, the proposition P might never have even occurred to S. E.g., suppose S knows that her only pets are two cats. This entails that she has no pet hippopotamus, so this proposition is propositionally justified for S. But unless S is a little odd, this is not a proposition S currently believes. The formulation “P is propositionally justified for S” leaves open whether S believes P. The formulation “S is propositionally justified in believing P” indicates that P is propositionally justified for S and that S believes P.

If S believes P and does so on the basis of good reasons, then S’s believing P is doxastically justified. Significantly, doxastic justification requires more than propositional justification plus belief. P could be propositionally justified for S and S could believe P, but not believe P on the basis of the good reasons that constitute S’s propositional justification for P. E.g., despite having excellent reasons to believe there are no vampires, Vlad believes he is safe from vampires only because he eats lots of garlic and wears a special cross to repel vampires. Vlad’s belief that he is safe from vampires would be propositionally justified, but not doxastically justified. Unless noted, when we use “justified” and its cognates without qualification we will mean “doxastically justified”. Knowledge requires basing the belief in the proposition on something that justifies it. This goes for moral knowledge of self-evident moral propositions as well as it goes for any other kind of knowledge.

So far, the standard view may understand the class of a priori propositions too narrowly. Mathematics and logic are regarded as the paradigm a priori disciplines. But it is doubtful that all the mathematical and logical truths we know are self-evident. Many of these truths require proof. When S believes such a proposition, S’s belief will not be based solely on understanding the proposition. S’s experience of constructing the proof will play an important role in S’s justification for believing the proposition proven. If the proof is complex, S’s justification will probably in part rely on memory, e.g., of lemmas proven along the way. The standard view can extend the class of a priori propositions without compromising its basic approach by adding that if S believes P on the basis of proving it from self-evident premises by steps that are self-evidently valid, then S is a priori justified in believing P.

To sum up, the standard view holds that a priori knowledge is justified independently of experience, where this means experience beyond the experience required to understand the relevant proposition. There are certain special, self-evident propositions that are propositionally justified for any person who understands them. If a person believes a self-evident proposition solely on the basis of understanding it, the person will be doxastically justified in believing it. Such propositions are often referred to as a priori, which should be taken to mean that it is possible for one to be a priori justified in believing them. By extension, propositions are also a priori if they can be deduced from self-evident premises via steps that are self-evidently valid. A person who believes such a proposition on the basis of such a proof will be a priori justified in believing it. It is also possible to be empirically justified in believing an a priori proposition, but one cannot be a priori justified in believing empirical propositions.[2]

Before closing the presentation of the standard view, we should highlight a potential problem already implicit in our presentation. As we stressed, the basic concept of a priori justification is of justification that is independent of experience. The standard view recognizes that one typically needs experience to understand a proposition, and interprets experience independent justification as justification that requires no additional experience. But consider an experience like this. You believe a mathematical proposition is true, but solely on a teacher’s testimony. You do not know for yourself. But then after turning the proposition over in your mind for a while, perhaps by thinking through some examples, you “get it”; you “see” that the proposition is indeed true (see Bealer 2000).

What happens in such cases? Understanding alone does not seem to justify you in believing. To be justified in believing the proposition—in a way that does not depend upon testimony—you need to “see” it for yourself. Such “seeing” has various names, e.g., “intuition”, “rational insight”, “clear and distinct perception”. But whatever it is called, it is hard to deny it is an experience. So the standard view faces a problem: there is a distinctive kind of experience apparently required for a priori justification in believing, and hence, a priori knowledge of, some propositions typically regarded as a priori and perhaps even self-evident. One might be led to question whether one who understands such a proposition but has not yet had the experience of “seeing” the proposition to be true even has propositional justification. Finally, one might be led to wonder whether this kind of “experience” is always required for a priori knowledge and justification that does not depend upon proof.

Those who take the standard view might respond by accepting that rational intuition is an experience and distinguishing this experience from the experiences that are involved in empirical justification, i.e., perception, proprioception, introspection, and memory. This modified standard view could then maintain that a priori knowledge and justification are independent of the latter experiences, but not necessarily all experience; a priori justification can be grounded in an experience of rational intuition—perhaps it is always so grounded. Thus, on the modified standard view, the special role of understanding comes down to this: understanding an a priori proposition is the only prerequisite for rational insight into its truth; understanding the proposition does not guarantee that one will attain such insight, but it is the only thing that is necessary. Notice, on this modified standard view, self-evident propositions no longer play such a prominent role. It is not an essential part of the view that there are special propositions, and anyone who understands one of these propositions has propositional justification. If one wants to think in terms of special propositions, there will be propositions that are special only in an attenuated sense: it is possible for a person to have the experience of seeing the propositions to be true simply by understanding and thinking about them. Some might consider this modification too much of a departure from the spirit of the standard view.

While it is not beyond criticism, we will proceed assuming the standard view about a priori knowledge and justification is true.

1.2 Analyticity and the A Priori

According to Kant’s original formulation, in analytic judgments the concept of the predicate is contained in the concept of the subject (1781 [1998]: A6–7). (1), that all bachelors are unmarried, provides a good illustration. On one view, being a bachelor is a complex concept that is composed of being unmarried as well as being an adult male. So the concept of a bachelor “contains” the concept of being unmarried. Hence, part of thinking of someone as a bachelor is thinking of him as unmarried. Compare this with the synthetic proposition (7), that all bachelors are untidy. The concept of being a bachelor is not partly composed of the concept of being untidy. Thinking of someone as untidy is not part of thinking of him as a bachelor. So being a bachelor does not “contain” being untidy. A more contemporary understanding holds that sentences are analytic just in case they can be converted into logical truths by replacing terms with terms that have equivalent meanings (Frege 1884 [1980]). The more contemporary understanding counts more propositions as analytic than Kant’s original formulation: for example, all logical truths will be counted as analytic, as well as a sentence such as “if there is blizzard, then there will be snow.”

One might be tempted to think that all and only propositions expressed by analytic sentences can have a priori justification, and that propositions expressed by synthetic sentences can only have a posteriori justification. We should resist this temptation. A number of philosophers, beginning with Kant, have claimed that some synthetic propositions can have a priori justification. As we will discuss below, Kant thought that all moral propositions were synthetic but could be established only by reason. Moreover, if one considers what is fundamental to the two distinctions, there is no obvious reason to assume they would perfectly coincide. The analytic/synthetic distinction fundamentally concerns conceptual or meaning relations, specifically, whether the subject of a proposition contains the predicate or whether the proposition is equivalent to a logical truth. The a priori/a posteriori distinction is fundamentally epistemic, being concerned with whether experience is required for justification. Two such fundamentally different distinctions could coincide, but it is not immediately apparent that they do; it would take considerable work to show that they do.

Finally, we must at least mention Quine’s (1951) important attack on the coherence of the analytic/synthetic distinction. He argued that there’s no clear way of distinguishing between analytic sentences and sentences that merely express very strongly accepted propositions. Many philosophers have found Quine’s argument persuasive, but the concept of analyticity has not been abandoned by all philosophers, indeed a majority still accept it (see entry on the analytic/synthetic distinction). We will make use of the of the analytic/synthetic distinction in this entry.

1.3 Cognitivism and Non-Cognitivism

We can divide metaethical positions into two kinds: cognitivist and non-cognitivist. Cognitivists hold that moral statements—statements such as “Lying is wrong” and “Courage is a virtue”—have truth-values, being either true or false. Cognitivists maintain that when one sincerely makes a moral statement in an ordinary context, one believes the proposition expressed by the statement. Non-cognitivists hold that moral statements are not truth-evaluable: moral statements are neither true nor false, being more akin to utterances such as (a) “Haggis, YUCK!” or (b) “Take the haggis away!” Just as, when one sincerely utters (a) or (b), one does not express a belief, but does something else, non-cognitivists maintain that one does something other than express a belief when one makes a moral statement. The early non-cognitivists A.J. Ayer (1936) and R.M. Hare (1952) maintained that moral statements were akin to utterances (a) and (b) respectively, that is, they express either emotive reactions or commands. Other forms of non-cognitivism propose different accounts of exactly what one does when one makes a moral statement (see entry on moral cognitivism vs. non-cognitivism). Since non-cognitivism holds that we do not express beliefs when we make moral statements, there is no reason for non-cognitivists to think that there are any moral beliefs—according to non-cognitivism, even though moral statements typically have the form of declarative sentences, there are no moral propositions that correspond to them. If there are no moral beliefs or propositions, there is no a priori moral justification or a priori moral knowledge. So, the question of whether some moral propositions can be justified a priori really comes up only in the context of cognitivism.

However, many non-cognitivists want to vindicate as much of actual moral thought and practice as possible, particularly quasi-realists such as Simon Blackburn (1993) and Alan Gibbard (2003). While denying that there are, strictly speaking, moral propositions that are true or false (or moral beliefs, or moral arguments that are valid or invalid), they would at the same time maintain that in the moral realm there are things close enough to propositions, truth, belief, and validity that our practice of speaking of such things as moral beliefs and these beliefs being true or false makes sense. And such theorists would certainly want to allow that moral beliefs can be better or worse in a way that closely corresponds to beliefs being more or less epistemically justified, strictly understood. So there are interesting questions about whether there is something closely akin to a priori moral justification (and knowledge) on these views. But in this entry we will limit ourselves to cognitivist theories.

Moreover, serious questions regarding a priori moral knowledge and justification arise only for non-error-theoretic versions of cognitivism. Error theories, such as J.L. Mackie’s, hold that moral statements express propositions, and hence are true or false, but that these propositions are all false. Moral propositions are systematically false because they presuppose something radically mistaken. Mackie claims they presuppose the existence of objectively prescriptive moral facts, when there are no such facts (1977: Ch. 1; but see Berker 2019, which contests the standard interpretation of Mackie presented here). A person could be justified in believing a false proposition, but one could not know it. And it is difficult to see how one could even be justified a priori in believing a proposition of a type that is systematically false because it makes a radically mistaken presupposition. Thus, this entry focuses on non-error-theoretic versions of cognitivism.

Having discussed some metaethical theories such as cognitivism and non-cognitivism, we should pause to distinguish claims regarding a priori knowledge or justification of moral evaluations from claims regarding a priori knowledge or justification of meta-ethical propositions, such as that moral statements do not express propositions. Much meta-ethical theorizing is presented as an analysis of moral language, and it seems likely that those involved think of themselves as conducting an a priori inquiry. It would be interesting to devote more specific attention to a priori meta-ethical epistemology, but we are concerned mostly with a priori knowledge or justification of moral propositions.

We focus almost exclusively on moral theories from the 20th century and later; the exception is Kant, with whom we begin. After briefly discussing Kant, we move on to the non-naturalist moral theories presented in the early part of the 20th century by Moore and Ross. We then consider naturalist moral theories developed much later in the 20th century, and close by considering particularism and more recent versions of intuitionism that are descendants of the positions developed by Moore and Ross.

2. Kant’s Synthetic A Priori Moral Truths

For Kant, there is a close connection between the nature of moral truths—in particular, their prescriptive content (i.e., what they direct one to do), as well as their necessity and universality—and the way in which we discover those truths, namely, a priori. In his view, one can discover a maximally general, fundamental moral principle. This is a principle that he calls “the categorical imperative”. Kant holds it can be known through reason alone, specifically, via a transcendental argument (see entries on Kant’s moral philosophy and transcendental arguments). He held that we could then deduce more specific, but still general moral truths from this fundamental principle. Kant provides various formulations of the categorical imperative, the first being that one ought to act only in accordance with a maxim[3] that one can at the same time will to become a universal law—roughly, an act ought to be done by someone only if the person could will, without contradiction, that everyone act as he or she is acting. Examples of more specific principles he deduces from the categorical imperative are that one ought not make lying promises or commit suicide. Kant’s discussion of lying promises nicely illustrates how the categorical imperative works: A person in some difficulty is considering making a promise he knows he cannot keep to escape the difficulty. To apply the categorical imperative, the person must consider what would happen if everyone in some difficulty made a lying promise to escape. If so many lying promises were made, no one would believe a person who promised to do something, so under these conditions one could not escape a difficulty by making a promise. Hence, the person could not consistently will that his maxim be a universal law, since making it a universal law would frustrate his aim in making the lying promise. Therefore, one ought not escape a difficulty by making a lying promise.

In Book II of the Groundwork (1785 [1996]) Kant claims the fundamental moral truths are synthetic a priori because moral truths are prescriptive. Kant held that the categorical imperative is not analytic, because although Kant thought the applicability of the categorical imperative to any given individual is deducible from the assumption that the individual is rational, the concept of the categorical imperative is not contained in the concept of a rational being. Kant thought the categorical imperative must be discovered a priori—through reason—because, as a fundamental moral law applying to all rational beings, it cannot be discovered through mere experience: one cannot learn how one should act from how people do act.

Moreover, we can see why Kant may have thought that the necessity and universality of moral truths makes them impossible to discover a posteriori. Regarding necessity: observing how things actually go seems insufficient to find out how they must go. And regarding universality: if moral truths are universal in the sense that they are true in all contexts, then one could only verify the truth of a moral claim by (a) experiencing all contexts and (b) perceiving the moral truth in each one. But that is clearly impossible.

Thus, on a standard reading of Book II, the prescriptive content of moral claims, along with their necessity and universality, led Kant to believe we know moral truths only a priori. However, some interpret Kant as saying that if a moral truth is a priori, then it must also be necessary and universal (Dancy 2007: 45). On this interpretation, if one knows P a priori, then P must be necessary; after all, it’s unclear how one could know a contingent truth without experience. Moreover, if P is necessary, then P must also be universal; for if P must be true, then it is true in every actual case. So, on this interpretation, Kant’s views about moral epistemology motivate his views about the content of moral claims, not vice versa. Regardless of which interpretation is correct, it’s clear Kant thought there is a close relationship between the content of moral claims and how we come to know them.

As we will see, moral particularists deny there is any such relationship between the content of moral claims and the means by which we know them. Particularists claim that we can have a priori moral knowledge, even though all moral truths are contingent and particular.

How, specifically, does Kant think that one can establish the categorical imperative a priori? The crucial premise is that practically rational beings are autonomous, in the sense that their wills can be determined by rules they give themselves. Kant holds that the law that an autonomous agent gives to herself must tell her which ends to pursue and not merely which means to employ in light of the ends the agent already has. Kant therefore rejects the more orthodox conception of practical reason as purely instrumental, i.e., limited to discovering the means to ends dictated by something else, e.g., desire. The question then becomes, “What rule or law could determine the rational will apart from any end?” that is, “What rule could possibly tell a rational agent which ends to pursue?” Such a rule would have to be formal, since it could not simply tell the agent what to do in light of the ends she already has, and thus could not include any specification of an end. This leads Kant to the categorical imperative, roughly: for an agent to perform a moral action, the maxim the agent acts on must be one that the agent can consistently will to govern everyone, regardless of their goals, as a necessary law.

3. A Priori Justification and Early 20th Century Non-Naturalism

3.1 The Naturalistic Fallacy and Intuitionism

G.E. Moore reacted against views that provided naturalistic definitions of moral concepts, especially that of goodness (see entries on naturalism, and moral naturalism). One might question whether his targets actually held the view he criticized, but let’s set such worries aside and assume that as the 19th-century drew to a close, philosophical ethics was dominated by hedonists who defined “good” in terms of pleasure, evolutionary ethicists who defined “good” as the most evolved, utilitarians who defined “right” as what produces the most utility, and other naturalists. According to such views, fundamental moral principles are analytic, and hence knowable a priori. Since the fundamental principles defined moral concepts in natural terms, one can infer whether some specific thing is good or action right from the principle conjoined with appropriate propositions about the natural properties of the thing or action, the latter being knowable empirically. For example, one could infer that listening to music is good from the analysis of “good” as conducive to pleasure and the fact that listening to music is often pleasant. In presenting Moore’s response to such naturalistic definitions, we will focus on the position he took in Principia Ethica (1903 [2003]) (although his views changed significantly over time).

According Moore, all naturalistic analytic definitions of “good” fail, committing what he called “the naturalistic fallacy”. To show all naturalistic analyses of goodness fail, Moore presented the “open-question argument”. The basic idea is that if a definition of “good” is correct, a morally competent person could not sensibly question whether something satisfying the definition is good. Consider a definable term: a triangle is a closed plane figure with three angles. No person who understands the term can sensibly ask, “X is a triangle, but is X three-angled?” The question is closed; an open question is one it makes sense to ask. Moore claimed that for any naturalistic definition N of “good”, the question “X is N, but is it good?” is open. For example, suppose someone analyzes “good” as conducive to pleasure. If the analysis were correct, the question “X is conducive to pleasure, but is it good?” should be closed. But the question is open; it is perfectly reasonable. One might, e.g., think of schadenfreude—pleasure at another’s misfortune—and wonder whether such pleasure is good. Hence, Moore would conclude, the analysis fails. Moore held that the argument can be repeated for any proposed naturalistic analysis of “good”, so “good” cannot be analyzed in natural terms. He concluded that goodness is non-natural (see entry on moral non-naturalism). Moore went further, holding that “good” was unanalyzable, and that the property of goodness was simple and irreducible. These claims about goodness do not follow from the failure of all naturalistic analyses of “good”, since it might be possible to give a non-natural definition of “good”, e.g., as what God approves. However, although he does not seem to have recognized it, at least in Principia Ethica, the open question argument seems to work against nearly any definition of “good” just as it works against natural definitions.[4] (For more on the open question argument and objections to it, see the entry on Moore’s Moral Philosophy.)

Because of his views regarding moral concepts and properties, Moore concluded that the fundamental moral principles are self-evident and that moral knowledge can come only from moral “intuition”. Superficially, his view seems to comport well with the standard conception of a priori knowledge. But consider how he explains his position, quoted here at some length:

[T]he fundamental principles of Ethics must be self-evident. But I am anxious that this expression should not be misunderstood. The expression “self-evident” means properly that the proposition so called is evident or true, by itself alone; that it is not an inference from some proposition other than itself. The expression does not mean that the proposition is true, because it is evident to you or me or all mankind, because in other words it appears to us to be true. That a proposition appears to be true can never be a valid argument that true it really is. By saying that a proposition is self-evident, we mean emphatically that its appearing so to us, is not the reason why it is true: for we mean that it has absolutely no reason. It would not be a self-evident proposition, if we could say of it: I cannot think otherwise and therefore it is true. For then its evidence or proof would not lie in itself, but in something else, namely our conviction of it. That it appears true to us may indeed be the cause of our asserting it, or the reason why we think and say that it is true: but a reason in this sense is something utterly different from a logical reason, or reason why something is true. Moreover, it is obviously not a reason of the same thing. The evidence of a proposition to us is only a reason for our holding it to be true; whereas a logical reason, or reason in the sense in which self-evident propositions have no reason, is a reason why the proposition itself must be true, not why we hold it so to be. Again, that a proposition is evident to us may not only be the reason why we do think or affirm it, it may even be a reason why we ought to think it or affirm it. But a reason, in this sense too, is not a logical reason for the truth of the proposition, though it is a logical reason for the rightness of holding the proposition…. When, therefore, I talk of Intuitionistic Hedonism, I must not be understood to imply that my denial that “Pleasure is the only good” is based on my Intuition of its falsehood. My Intuition of its falsehood is indeed my reason for holding and declaring it untrue; it is indeed the only valid reason for so doing. But that is just because there is no logical reason for it; because there is no proper evidence or reason of its falsehood except for itself alone. It is untrue, because it is untrue, and there is no other reason: but I declare it untrue, because its untruth is evident to me, and I hold that that is a sufficient reason for my assertion. We must not therefore look on Intuition, as if it were an alternative to reasoning. Nothing whatever can take the place of reasons for the truth of any proposition: intuition can only furnish a reason for holding any proposition to be true: this however it must do when any proposition is self-evident, when, in fact, there are no reasons which prove its truth. (1903 [2003]: 143–144)

Note first that Moore’s conception of self-evidence is of propositions whose truth does not depend on anything else; these would be propositions that express a sort of brute fact. Nothing obviously follows about the epistemic status of such propositions or about beliefs in such propositions. In this respect, Moore’s conception of self-evidence differs from the standard conception. Second, given his conception of self-evidence, Moore chooses an odd example of a self-evident proposition. For that pleasure is not the only good seems to follow from various propositions regarding what things are good, propositions that Moore accepted—and that are apparently self-evident—e.g., that appreciation of beauty is good.

Finally, to interpret Moore as holding that we are a priori justified in accepting fundamental moral principles, one must adopt the modified standard view. And his position nicely illustrates the problem that forces the modification of the standard view. Moore held that what justifies one in believing a fundamental moral principle is that the principle is self-evident and that it appears to be true, i.e., that one has an intuition of it. But this intuition, as an appearance of truth, is clearly a kind of experience, so it seems that one’s justification for an intuitive belief in a fundamental moral principle will not be independent of experience. Hence, to regard this justification as a priori, one must make an exception for this specific kind of experience. While Moore famously denied hedonism, this was because he denied that pleasure is the only good. He accepted that pleasure is good, and this proposition nicely illustrates the tension inherent in the modified standard view of a priori justification, and indeed the standard view, as well as Moore’s a priori moral epistemology. Presumably one must experience pleasure to acquire the concept of pleasure. But then how exactly is it that one is justified in believing that pleasure is good? Is it that once one has the concepts of pleasure and goodness, one believes that pleasure is good simply on the basis of understanding this proposition? Or is it that once one understands this proposition, one has a rational intuition of its truth? Or is it instead that when one experiences pleasure one also experiences its goodness? If something like the latter, the justification for our belief that pleasure is good seems more empirical than a priori.

Contrasting Moore’s view with Kant’s might be helpful. Kant viewed moral knowledge as fundamentally a priori in the sense that moral knowledge must be the result of careful reasoning (first transcendental, then deductive); one could discover through reason the fundamental moral principle, and then deduce from that principle more specific moral duties. Moore, on the other hand, explicitly rules out reasoning to fundamental moral principles; since these principles are self-evident, Moore denies that there are, properly speaking, any reasons for them. Thus, we find in Moore a distinctively intuitionist account of a priori knowledge, as opposed to Kant’s rationalist account. Moore’s account is intuitionistic because the reason why we believe, and ought to believe, fundamental moral principles is that they are self-evident propositions that appear true to us.

Moore did not hold that all moral knowledge is intuitive. In the Principia he maintained that the utilitarian principle was analytic, hence, knowledge of this principle would not require a special intuition. But he later acknowledged that one cannot define “right”, because the open question argument can be used against definitions of “right”, including the utilitarian definition. (“This action produces the most good consequences, but is it right?” is an open question. Corresponding open questions count against efforts to define “ought”, e.g., “This action produces the most good consequences, but ought I do it?”) So Moore was driven to hold that the utilitarian principle was synthetic, and known a priori via intuition (Moore 1912). However, since Moore held that one ought to do what produces the most good, one would have to engage in empirical investigation of the consequences of various types of action to determine what one is obligated to do. So on Moore’s view, one would not simply intuit that one ought to keep promises or ought not to kill.

A more interesting reason why Moore did not hold that all moral knowledge results from direct intuition was that he denied that intuition is infallible. On his view, it can appear to one that a false moral proposition is self-evidently true.[5] Thus, according to Moore, it is possible for the moral propositions one intuits to conflict. One resolves any conflicts among the moral principles one intuits—e.g., regarding which sorts of things are good—by considerations of coherence, with some intuitions regarding what is and is not good being rejected precisely because of their conflicts with other intuitions. So while a priori intuition plays a large role for Moore, he did not hold that one attains moral knowledge exclusively by carefully focusing one’s attention on various moral propositions and then simply intuiting whether or not they are true.

3.2 Prima Facie Moral Principles and Intuitionism

W. D. Ross (1930) is for many the paradigm intuitionist (see entry on William David Ross). He held both pluralism:

There is no single, fundamental moral principle.

and intuitionism:

We can have intuitive, a priori knowledge of moral propositions.

Even though (P) is not the focus of this entry, it might be useful to review Ross’s position on it. Ross provided principles specifying various grounds of duty by using the concept of prima facie duty. Ross thought of prima facie duty as a tendency to be a duty, not as a kind of duty. He held that we have prima facie duties to keep promises and tell the truth, to provide reparation for harms we have done, to perform acts of gratitude, to insure just distributions, to benefit others, to improve ourselves, and not to harm others. He held that an act is a prima facie duty in virtue of some one component of its nature, e.g., being a promise keeping. But a given act can have more than one morally significant feature, and in virtue of some features it might be prima facie right while also being prima facie wrong in virtue of other features. Imagine a mob enforcer has taken a contract to kill someone. The act of fulfilling his contract would be a prima facie duty in virtue of keeping a promise, but it would be prima facie wrong in virtue of harming, indeed, killing, a person. The act would be wrong all-things-considered. One’s all-things-considered duty, according to Ross, is determined by the entire nature of an action. Ross held that it is not possible to provide a general ranking of prima facie duties according to their stringency, with more stringent duties always trumping less stringent duties if they conflict. And he did not think it is possible to provide any other sort of general rule for determining which prima facie duty will take precedence in cases of conflict. Therefore, even if we had a set of principles identifying every prima facie right making feature and every prima facie wrong making feature—which Ross did not claim to have provided—and even if we had complete knowledge of the non-moral features of all actions, we could not mechanically deduce which actions we would be duty bound to perform.

Turning now to (I): Ross held that his principles specifying prima facie duties are self-evident. Here is a significant passage from Ross articulating his view:

That an act, qua fulfilling a promise, or qua …, is prima facie right, is self-evident; not in the sense that it is evident from the beginning of our lives, or as soon as we attend to the proposition for the first time, but in the sense that when we have reached sufficient mental maturity and have given sufficient attention to the proposition it is evident without any need of proof, or of evidence beyond itself. It is self-evident just as a mathematical axiom, or the validity of a form of inference, is evident…. In our confidence that these propositions are true there is involved the same trust in our reason that is involved in our confidence in mathematics; and we should have no justification for trusting it in the latter sphere and distrusting it in the former. In both cases we are dealing with propositions that cannot be proved, but just as certainly need no proof. (1930: 29–30)

Ross here not only provides some clarification of his notion of self-evidence, but also commits himself to a number of theses that are typical of, or typically associated with, intuitionism (meaning (I) specifically). By identifying these theses, we can begin to get a clearer picture of Ross’s intuitionism.

Ross claims that some propositions regarding prima facie duties are self-evident. However, as Ross understands the self-evidence of moral propositions, it is both stronger and weaker than it is according to (SE).

The self-evidence Ross attributes to moral propositions is weaker in that whereas on (SE) a self-evident proposition will be evident for any person who understands it, according to Ross a self-evident moral proposition is evident for any person who has attained sufficient mental maturity and given the proposition sufficient attention. Hence, on Ross’s conception, a self-evident proposition, PSE, might not be justified for some, and perhaps even many, who understand it; PSE may not be evident to persons who understand it if they either lack sufficient mental maturity or have not considered PSE sufficiently.[6] Depending upon what is required for sufficient mental maturity and sufficient consideration, self-evident moral propositions might be evident, in virtue of their self-evidence, for precious few actual individuals. Here’s one way to think about it: Rossian self-evidence has less epistemic potency—a person must satisfy more conditions for a self-evident moral proposition to be evident than merely understanding it.

If the requirements for sufficient maturity and consideration are minimal, then there will be little difference between self-evidence as defined by Ross and (SE). But Ross’s approach would include a “fudge factor” that might be useful. It could, e.g., enable him to avoid purported counterexamples where S understands some self-evident moral proposition, PSE, but we are disinclined to grant that PSE is justified for S either because S suffers from some general cognitive deficiency, e.g., excessive credulity, or the circumstances in which S understands P are problematic for some reason, e.g., S is exhausted or distracted. Ross could simply point out that S lacks mental maturity or has failed to give PSE sufficient consideration, and thereby avoid having to say that S has a justification for PSE.

Ross’s more restricted conception of self-evidence has another potential advantage. We were all taught about morality. When children, we were told, “Don’t hit!” “Share your toys”, “You ought not lie”, etc. And when older, most of us encountered situations where it was not clear to us what we should do, so we sought the advice of someone we trusted. In some of these cases the moral propositions at issue may have been self-evident, but at first the truth of these propositions was not obvious to us, so we believed on the basis of testimony. One might address these moral cases in the way we’ve suggested the standard story could address analogous logical and mathematical cases. That way of addressing the cases is not obviously mistaken, but one might balk at the thought that a person who understands a self-evident proposition automatically has a justification for that proposition even before it is apparent to the person that the proposition is true.

Ross’s stronger requirements for self-evidence might provide a more satisfactory account. Since on his view self-evident propositions are evident for any person who has attained sufficient mental maturity and given the propositions sufficient consideration, he could deny that a child first being taught simple moral principles has a justification for these principles and deny that a math student who has been introduced to an “obvious” truth, but has not yet had a chance to give it any consideration, would have a justification for the truth. Ross could make the more plausible claim that if we had a justification for these propositions at first, it was only because of testimony. We did not, at first, have justifications for these propositions on our own. Later, when we were mature and had given these propositions due consideration, they would be evident to us on their own.

Ross’s conception of self-evidence is stronger than the standard understanding because he held self-evident propositions are certain. In the passage quoted, Ross does not explicitly claim that self-evident propositions are certain, but he suggests they are when he claims that self-evident moral propositions are like mathematical axioms and logical truths. And two paragraphs later he explicitly claims that our judgments regarding prima facie duties are certain. (SE) asserts only that self-evident propositions are evident, not that they are certain.

Three more elements of Ross’s view deserve mention. First, the standard story has it that self-evident propositions can be justified without additional evidence, but does not rule out being justified in believing a self-evident proposition on the basis of evidence or even proof. But Ross claims that self-evident propositions cannot be proved.

Second, Ross allowed that a person might come to be justified in believing one of his general principles regarding prima facie duties via what is sometimes called “intuitive induction”. One recognizes prima facie duties in particular cases first, and then comes to apprehend the general principle. Thus, for example, one intuits in a number of particular cases where one has promised, that one has a prima facie obligation to do what one has promised, and then one “sees” that one has a prima facie obligation to keep promises. Intuitive induction is supposed to produce a priori knowledge. When one knows on the basis of an intuitive induction the justification for the general principle is not derived from one’s justifications regarding the particular cases, as one would be in a standard enumerative induction. Since Ross held that principles regarding prima facie duties are self-evident, he was committed to the claim that their justification does not depend upon anything else. So the idea must instead be that thinking about the particular cases either enables one to truly understand the general principle or is involved in giving it sufficient consideration, whereupon one comes to see that it is true.

Third, Ross denied that propositions regarding all-things-considered duties in particular cases are self-evident. Indeed, he denied that one can know what one’s all-things-considered duty is in any actual case; he held that this was a matter of “probable opinion”. In Ross’s view, a prima facie duty results from some one property of an action, e.g., that it is a promise keeping or that it benefits some person. But one’s all-things-considered duty results from the entire nature of an action. So one reason we cannot know our all-things-considered duty is that we cannot know whether we have identified all the features of an action that are morally relevant. And even if we could, there is the additional problem that prima facie duties can conflict, and it is not self-evident how such conflicts should be resolved.

4. A Priori Justification and Late 20th Century Naturalism

While hugely influential, Moore’s open question argument is far from unassailable. One influential response points out that it implausibly assumes any correct definition or analysis must be obvious. According to this response, the open question argument implausibly assumes the correct response to the paradox of analysis is to deny that any analysis could be both correct and informative (see entry on analysis). So, the open question argument is no longer taken as decisive. In addition, a majority of philosophers do not want to admit non-natural entities into their ontologies. Finally, many judge that non-cognitivist and anti-realist theories cannot really do justice to the status of morality. It therefore is no surprise that naturalist ethical theories, which hold that moral properties and facts just are natural properties and facts, gained prominence towards the end of the 20th century. One such view, analytic naturalism, directly contradicts Moore by holding that all ethical terms have naturalistic analyses. It might seem that a priori justification would play a prominent role in at least those naturalistic theories that offer analyses of moral terms, but as we will see, this is not so obvious (see entry on moral naturalism).

We will focus primarily on the role of the a priori in analytic naturalism. However, perhaps a good entry point into the view is via comparison with a very different view: Cornell realism.

4.1 Cornell Realism

Cornell realism (so named because its best known proponents are associated with Cornell University) is a version of naturalistic realism; it holds that there are moral properties (and thus moral facts), but that moral properties are natural properties.

Epistemologically, there are two significant features of Cornell realism. First, it accepts a coherence theory of justification. Second, it applies to moral epistemology the claim from the philosophy of science that observations are theory-laden. According to coherentism, beliefs are not justified individually, but holistically, in virtue of their membership in a coherent system of beliefs. Especially within ethics, a coherent system of beliefs is often referred to as being in a state of “reflective equilibrium” (see entry on reflective equilibrium). The term “reflective equilibrium” is also used to refer to an idealized method via which inquirers bring their moral beliefs into coherence by reflecting on their considered moral judgments and general principles intended to capture these judgments, and eliminating any conflicts that emerge by making adjustments to either the considered judgments or the general principles. Neither considered moral judgments nor general principles are always favored. What the inquirer revises in each case of conflict is determined by what seems most likely to be true to the inquirer. A number of commentators on reflective equilibrium have observed that it is a sophisticated contemporary version of intuitionism in which considered moral judgments, or more properly, the considered judgments and moral principles that seem most likely to be true, play essentially the same role in determining the moral theory eventually accepted that self-evident moral intuitions did for earlier intuitionists. Reflective equilibrium may allow for initially credible considered judgments and moral principles to be revised more than one would expect to see traditionally understood intuitions being revised, but in the end what seems to be true upon reflection determines the system of judgments and principles accepted in reflective equilibrium. Hence, one might be tempted to assume that those who accept reflective equilibrium, such as Cornell realists, are committed to a priori justification playing a significant role in moral epistemology even though what plays the role of intuitions is not assumed to be self-evident. As we will see, this temptation should be resisted.

Let’s begin by noting that one influential criticism of reflective equilibrium is that what seem to function as intuitions are just what seem to the inquirer to be true; there is not even the pretense that these have some special status, such as self-evidence. Earlier intuitionists might be criticized for claiming propositions are self-evident when they are not. But reflective equilibrium may lead inquirers to do nothing more than build a coherent moral system around strongly held beliefs that in fact have no positive epistemic status. (We cannot pursue this criticism further but for an important early response see Daniels 1979).

Observation of the vapor tracks made by charged particles in a cloud chamber is a favorite example used to illustrate theory-laden observation. A scientist could not observe, say, a positron, if the scientist did not already believe various theories, e.g., regarding sub atomic particles and how such particles will affect the medium in the cloud chamber when they pass through it. But this does not mean that experienced scientists make a theory-neutral observation of what happens in a cloud chamber and then draw inferences regarding the sub atomic particles from their theories and the theory-neutral observation. That might have been what scientists had to do early on in the development of the cloud chamber and the relevant theories. But now when experienced scientists watch what happens in a cloud chamber, they will spontaneously and non-inferentially form beliefs about positrons, muons and the like; such spontaneous beliefs are real observations. Experienced scientists make such observations in just the way an ordinary person might observe a dog or cat in the front yard.

Cornell realists hold that the same thing happens in the moral realm. We all hold what is in effect a moral theory. The reasons we come to hold the theory initially are not important, so long as the theory is close enough to the truth. Richard Boyd (1988), for instance, suggests that our background moral theory identifies moral goodness with those properties that are conducive to the satisfaction of human needs, both physical and psychological. Having internalized this theory, we are able to make moral observations. For example, when we see photographs of the prisoners at the Abu Ghraib prison during the American occupation of Iraq we certainly recognize that treating persons in the ways depicted frustrates some significant psychological needs. But this will not be our primary reaction. When we view these photographs we spontaneously judge that the treatment of the prisoners was wrong or abusive (where it should be emphasized that the latter involves a strong moral component). This spontaneous moral belief may be dependent upon our background moral views; if we did not accept some moral theory we would not have made it. But, according to the Cornell realists, the belief is still an observation because it is theory-laden rather than being inferred from a theory conjoined with various non-moral observations. It is what happens in science, and as in science, the fact that moral observations are theory-laden does not prevent them from helping to support our moral theory. As in science, explanatory relations are important, e.g., the fact that the prisoners at Abu Ghraib were wrongly treated, where this fact of being wrongly treated is something like the natural fact of their being seriously harmed, is part of the best explanation of our observing that what was done to them was wrong. On this view, neither the moral theory nor the moral observations are epistemologically prior; both are justified in virtue of the coherence of the entire system of moral beliefs.

The interesting feature of Cornell realism, for our purposes, is that despite the fact that spontaneous moral beliefs—that some refer to as intuitions—play a significant role, a priori justification plays no significant role in its moral epistemology. Both our more particular moral beliefs and our moral theories will be justified in virtue of their coherence, not their self-evidence; the considered moral judgments that are significant members of the coherent system of moral beliefs, and that some see as old-fashioned intuitions, are interpreted as observations, not rational insights. For Cornell realism, the justification of our moral beliefs crucially depends upon experience, specifically, moral observation.

4.2 Analytic Naturalism

Cornell realism holds that moral properties cannot be a priori analyzed as any natural properties, though they can be empirically discovered to be identical to certain natural properties. In contrast, analytic naturalism holds that moral properties can be analyzed in terms of natural properties. One influential version of analytic naturalism applies to moral properties a strategy that was developed for dealing with mental properties, which is why the view is also called moral functionalism, flagging the similarity to functionalism in the philosophy of mind. We will focus on this version of analytic naturalism, specifically Frank Jackson’s (1998) exposition. (For another version see Stephen Finlay 2014.)

To a first approximation, analytic naturalism holds the following: There are many statements containing moral terms that we find obvious or intuitive—moral platitudes, if you will. These statements constitute a sort of folk moral theory. Here are some examples: “intentional killing is normally wrong”, “pain is bad”, “virtuous people are more likely to do the right thing than vicious people”, “a person who judges that she ought to do something normally feels some motivation to do it”. Collectively, such statements fix the reference of moral terms, i.e., they determine what moral terms refer to. If a person denied enough of these statements, we would conclude that the person did not use moral terms with the same meaning as the rest of us. According to analytic naturalism, moral terms have their meaning holistically, as a result of the role they play in the system of moral statements that make up folk morality. Significantly, many of these statements relate moral properties to each other, as does the statement that virtuous people are more likely to do the right thing.

There is an immediate problem. Since current folk morality is made up of all the moral statements that many people find obvious, given the level of moral disagreement, folk morality is unlikely to be consistent. If it contains inconsistent statements folk morality will not be able to determine the reference of moral terms, since an inconsistent description does not apply to anything. Moreover, parts of it that seem obvious to many people are likely to be grounded in superstitions, depend upon empirical views that are mistaken, and in various other ways not be able to stand up to critical reflection. So current folk morality must be cleaned up. One way to think about cleaning up folk morality is as trying to bring it into reflective equilibrium. But however it is done, the point is to mold current folk morality into a coherent, reflectively defensible system of moral beliefs: a mature folk morality. Analytic naturalism claims that the meaning of moral terms is given by the role they occupy in the statements that constitute mature folk morality.

To see more specifically how this works, imagine writing down all the statements of mature folk morality as one long conjunction. Simplifying, suppose mature folk morality consists of only the first three examples above:

Intentional killing is normally wrong and pain is bad and virtuous people are more likely to do the right thing than vicious people.

We can transform these statements so that they explicitly reference moral properties and replace each moral property term with a distinct variable:

Intentional killings normally have the property w and pain has the property b and people with the property v1 are more likely to perform actions having the property r than people having the property v2.

We then bind all these variables with existential quantifiers to get:

There exists a property w and a property b and a property v1 and a property r and a property v2 such that intentional killings normally have the property w and pain has the property b and people with the property v1 are more likely to perform actions having the property r than people having the property v2.

We now have a sentence that says there are five properties that fulfill the roles played by the moral properties we began with. But that’s not good enough to single out moral properties by their playing these roles, since there might be other properties that also play these roles. To exclude this possibility, we need to add a claim saying that only one property plays each role, i.e., a clause that states that any property that makes all the statements containing w true is identical to w, any property that makes all the sentences containing b true is identical to b, and so on. We can abbreviate this clause as Uniqueness. It is now possible to define any moral term using the complicated sentence we have just constructed. For example:

Wrongness is the property w such that: there exists a property b and a property v1 and a property r and a property v2 such that intentional killings normally have the property w and pain has the property b and people with the property v1 are more likely to perform actions having the property r than people having the property v2 and Uniqueness.

The claim that this simple statement correctly analyzes wrongness is not very plausible. But that is because we simplified, including only three statements from mature folk morality. Analytic naturalism holds that the extremely complex sentences constructed in the same way using all of mature folk morality provide analyses of moral terms. This position is much more plausible, although still controversial.

One might at this point question why the analyses of moral terms analytic naturalism constructs would be naturalistic, i.e., define moral terms in purely “descriptive” terms, given that the roles played by moral terms are partly determined by their relations to other moral terms. A crucial element of the view that we must now explain addresses this question. Analytic naturalism holds that a central tenet of folk morality is that moral properties supervene on natural properties. This means that it is impossible for two situations to differ morally without there also being some natural difference. Jackson argues that the supervenience of the moral on the natural, or as he prefers, on the “descriptive”, entails that moral properties are natural properties.

Take any ethical statement E. Since moral properties are supervenient or consequent upon descriptive properties, no possible world where E is true can be made up only of moral facts. There will also have to be descriptive facts about this world, so there will be a sentence, likely an extremely long and complex sentence, that completely specifies the descriptive facts about the world. There will be such a purely descriptive sentence for every possible world where E is true. Let these sentences be D1, D2, D3, … We can disjoin all these descriptive sentences to get D = (D1 or D2 or D3 or …). D will also be a descriptive sentence; it is made up entirely of descriptive sentences put together using “or”, which is not a moral term.

Now, although it is an odd sentence—a very long disjunction—there is an important fact about D: it entails E and it is entailed by E. If E is true, then one of the disjuncts of D must be true, because D contains a disjunct describing every world where E is true; hence, D will be true as well. On the other hand, if D is true, then one of its disjuncts must be true, say it is Dn. E could not be false in a world described by Dn because Dn is included as a disjunct of D. Hence, if E were false in a world described by Dn it would be possible for there to be two worlds that were exactly alike in all descriptive respects with the moral statement E being true in one of these worlds but false in the other. The supervenience of the moral on the descriptive tells us that this cannot happen—there can be no moral difference unless there is some descriptive difference. So D entails E.

Jackson concludes,

The same line of argument can be applied mutatis mutandis to ethical and descriptive predicates and open sentences: for any ethical predicate there is a purely descriptive one that is necessarily co-extensive with it.

It follows that ethical properties are descriptive properties. (1998: 122–123)

One could question Jackson’s assumption that necessarily co-extensive properties are the same, but we cannot here pursue that issue. What analytical naturalism offers so far is an analysis of moral terms and an argument that moral properties are natural, or descriptive. But exactly which descriptive properties are identical to the moral properties? Analytic naturalism does not tell us this now. It claims that once we have attained a mature folk morality, we will be able to determine which natural properties fulfill (closely enough) the roles of the various moral properties.[7]

Given that analytic naturalism provides analyses of moral terms—more exactly, a procedure for constructing such analyses once we have a mature folk morality—one might conclude that various moral propositions will be a priori justified, most significantly, the definitions of moral terms. Jackson claims as much. Explaining the “a priori” supervenience of moral on descriptive properties, e.g., he writes,

It is an implicit part … of our understanding of ethical terms and sentences that they serve to mark distinctions among the descriptive ways things are. (1998: 125)

He also claims that the characterization of the role played by rightness and the other moral terms in mature folk morality is a priori while the identification of exactly which natural properties play these roles is a posteriori, since this would require empirical investigation. Jackson describes mature folk morality as

the best we will do by way of making good sense of the raft of sometimes conflicting intuitions about particular cases and general principles that make up current folk morality. (1998: 133)

Mature folk morality is just the result of subjecting current folk morality to sustained critical reflection.

It is worth noting, however, that although Jackson’s description of the status of the supervenience of the moral on the natural is suggestive, he does not explicitly claim that even this is self-evident. Although his descriptions of folk morality, e.g., as

the network of moral opinions, intuitions, principles and concepts whose mastery is part and parcel of having a sense of what is right and wrong, and of being able to engage in meaningful debate about what ought to be done (1998: 130)

suggest that one could determine, a priori, the content of folk morality, folk morality is also clearly something held by a community of people rather than an individual. This suggests that empirical inquiry would be needed to determine what belongs to the folk morality of a community, including even the community to which one belongs. Finally, there is the critical reflection that produces mature folk morality. Jackson does not describe this reflection in much detail. He mentions reflective equilibrium as one example, but reflective equilibrium is understood in various ways, and most include empirical elements. So while there are some reasons to think analytical naturalism allows for significant a priori moral justification and knowledge, there are also grounds for doubt. (For an argument that analytic naturalists must make use of a priori equivalences between moral and descriptive features, see Smith 2000.)

5. Moral Particularism and Justification

Moral particularists accept some disambiguation of at least one of the following two theses:

  1. There exist no true moral principles.
  2. One should not use moral principles in the course of moral deliberation.

If any version of the first thesis is true, then a fortiori there is no a priori knowledge of any moral principle, since there are no true moral principles. Moreover, particularists who accept the first thesis are distinct from Rossians in that they reject the existence of true pro tanto moral principles such as that promise-keeping is a pro tanto duty. (Contemporary particularists, and moral philosophers more generally, tend to prefer ‘pro tanto’ to Ross’s ‘prima facie’, which even Ross admitted was unsatisfactory immediately upon introducing it. The problem with ‘prima facie’ is that it means at first glance, but a prima facie duty is not something that seems to be a duty at first glance, but something that would be a duty if it is not overridden in some way. ‘Pro tanto’ means to that extent, and a pro tanto duty is something that would be a duty sans phrase, if it were not overridden in some way.) Thus, particularists believe that one cannot know a priori any pro tanto principle. However, as we’ll see, these particularists nevertheless think one can attain knowledge, even a priori knowledge, of particular moral facts.

Most particularists also accept the second thesis. In some cases, particularists accept the second thesis because they accept the first (Dancy 2005, McDowell 1979). In other cases, particularists reject the first thesis but accept the second: they admit that there are some true moral principles, but hold that those principles are nevertheless not the sorts of things that should play a role in deliberation (Guarini 2006). However, all particularists who accept the second thesis tend to adopt a similar moral epistemology—let’s call the second thesis “abstinence”.

There are other particularists who accept the first thesis and reject the second, and admit that there are some false moral principles—distinct from pro tanto moral principles—that are appropriate to use in some deliberative situations (Little 2000). Let’s call this view “rule of thumb” particularism.

5.1 Abstinence

Jonathan Dancy accepts versions of both the first and second thesis, and he accepts the second thesis in part because he accepts the first. Dancy holds that there are two types of principles: absolute and contributory. An absolute moral principle specifies a sufficient condition for the instantiation of a moral property, while a contributory moral principle specifies that a feature has an intrinsic moral valence (see entry on Dancy’s moral particularism). Dancy holds that neither sort of true principle exists, and thus neither sort of principle can properly play a role in moral deliberation—after all, using false moral principles could lead us to act correctly for the wrong reasons, or to act incorrectly (Dancy 2005: 3).

Moreover, Dancy holds that neither sort of principle is necessary for responsible moral deliberation. In this respect, Dancy’s view is similar to Moore’s, albeit only on the level of particular moral facts. According to Dancy, morally sensitive people can intuit the morally relevant features in a context, thereby intuiting the moral reasons in that context, and reliably come to a correct moral conclusion about how they ought to act, even without the use of a principle that specifies how to weigh one’s reasons. (In this latter respect, Dancy’s view is also similar to Ross’s.) In some cases, Dancy has suggested that we can understand this deliberative process by looking to connectionist machines or Roschian prototype theory (Dancy 1999).

Particularists rarely put their account of moral knowledge in terms of justification. But when particularists do put their view in terms of justification (see below) they claim that the justification involved is a priori. The thought seems to be this: if one can issue a moral verdict in a particular case on the basis of the moral reasons one is presented with in that case, then one must know what those reasons are, as well as how to weigh them to reach a verdict. But, according to particularists, there are no principles one can use to know those things; thus, one must see—through the exercise of intuition—what one’s reasons are and how to weigh them against each other. That is, one must intuit propositions such as R is a reason to φ in this case and In this case, on balance, the reasons support φ-ing. Particularists seem committed to a version of the modified standard view of a priori justification. There is a distinct experience of rational “seeing”” in virtue of which one is a priori justified in believing these propositions regarding a particular case. If the propositions one is thereby justified in believing are self-evident, it seems that they are self-evident only in the attenuated sense that it is possible to have rational insight into their truth, and hence possible to be justified in believing them, solely on the basis of understanding them and thinking about them. It is also worth taking note that the moral propositions particularists hold that we are a priori justified in believing are relative to a particular context: what one can come to see is that something is a reason to φ for a particular agent in a particular situation or that the balance of reasons support φ-ing for this particular agent in this particular situation.

The role of past experience in present moral deliberation complicates the particularist’s claim that moral beliefs are justified a priori. On the one hand, particularists claim that past experience plays an important role in deliberation, even for the morally mature agent—for instance, one often judges that R is a reason in the present context because R was a reason in a relevantly similar context in the past (see the entry on Dancy’s moral particularism). But on the other hand, the belief one arrives at through this kind of reflection on past experience is nevertheless a priori, according to particularists. How can we make sense of the conjunction of these two claims?

Perhaps we can try to answer this question by looking at what abstinence particularists—Dancy in particular—have to say about Kant. Dancy writes that particularists agree with Kant that moral judgments are synthetic a priori. According to Dancy, Kant inferred from this that moral judgments must also be necessary and universal (2007); but particularists reject this inference, and hold that moral judgments are synthetic a priori and yet are contingent and particular. Dancy writes,

Does it follow from this [that moral facts are contingent and not universal] that they [moral facts] are not knowable a priori? I don’t think so. After all, even when all the empirical information—that is, the information that we think of as ordinarily available to the senses—is in, we still have to determine which aspects of the present situation, as revealed to us in experience, count which way as reasons. That decision seems to take us beyond anything that the senses can inform us about…. Even if we have the benefit of previous experience [that in the past, the fact that I was dealing with someone in distress was a reason to go gently]…, the most we can get out of that is the recognition that her distress is probably a reason. Now this sort of knowledge would only be a posteriori if the evidence on which it is based is a posteriori. And that just returns us to the primary question here: in a case where we don’t have the benefit of previous experience, is the “process” by which we come to recognize that her distress is a reason, one that can be thought of as taking us from a posteriori knowledge (that she is in distress) to another a posteriori knowledge (that her distress is a reason to go gently)? And the answer seems to me to be no. If our decision that it is a reason is capable of counting as knowledge, then, it seems that it will have to be a priori knowledge that is at issue, since we only have two choices—a priori and a posteriori—and the latter is ruled out. (Dancy 2007)

Dancy appears to endorse this argument:

  1. If I come to know/justifiably believe a moral proposition, then I’m either relying on past moral experience or I’m not.
  2. If I’m not relying on past moral experience, then my conclusion is not known/justified a posteriori.
  3. An item of knowledge/a justified belief is either known/justified a priori or a posteriori.
  4. Thus, if I’m not relying on past moral experience, then my conclusion is known/justified a priori. (2, 3)
  5. If I’m relying on past experience and the past conclusions I’m relying on are known/justified a priori, then my present conclusion is known/justified a priori.
  6. Thus, if I’m relying on past moral experience, then my conclusion is known/justified a priori. (4, 5)
  7. Thus, if I come to know/justifiably believe a moral proposition, my knowledge/justification is a priori. (1, 4, 6)

The contentious premises in this argument are premises 5 and 2. One might offer the following sort of counterexample to premise 5. Let’s say that in the past, I’ve added together many pairs of even numbers; and in each of those cases, I’ve known/justifiably believed (a priori) that the sum of the two numbers was also even. Then someone asks me: is it always the case that the sum of two even numbers is itself even? Assume that, for whatever reason, I’m genuinely uncertain of the answer—I don’t see the answer intuitively, or perhaps I doubt my more general mathematical intuitions. Nevertheless, I realize that in the past, whenever I’ve added two even numbers the sum has itself been even. Thus, I inductively infer that the hypothesis is correct: the sum of two even numbers is always itself even.

This example seems like a paradigm case of one coming to know/justifiably believe an a priori proposition a posteriori. So, with the distinction between an a priori proposition—a proposition amenable to a priori justification—and a priori justification/knowledge in place, one might be tempted to reject premise 5.

Moreover, more support is needed for premise 2. Many paradigm cases of a posteriori justification do not rely on past experience. Take, for example, your belief that the traffic light is red. Past experience, in this case, only provides you with the relevant concepts needed to understand the proposition the traffic light is red. What justifies your belief is the current experience of the traffic light’s being red—and surely this yields a posteriori justification! Perhaps Dancy could say something like this: if I infer a moral claim from an empirical matter of fact (as when I infer that the fact that I’m dealing with someone in distress is a reason to go gently on the basis of my experience of her distress), then I’m going beyond my empirical experience in a way that’s different from when I infer that the traffic light is red on the basis of my empirical experience. But Dancy would need to say more about this distinction to explain why the former is an example of a priori justification and the latter an example of a posteriori justification. (For further arguments against the particularist’s claim that it’s possible to have a priori knowledge of particular, contingent moral facts, see McKeever and Ridge 2006, especially chapter 7.)

Nevertheless, Dancy’s take on Kant, in spite of his argument’s weaknesses, gives us some insight into how Dancy must see the role of experience in a priori justification. Dancy must think that when I infer on the basis of my current experience of a particular situation that R is a reason to φ, my inference is different from the kinds of inferences that yield a posteriori justification, and for this reason particularism is compatible with moral knowledge being a priori.

5.2 Rule of Thumb Particularism

According to rule of thumb particularists, one need not give up the use of all moral principles in moral deliberation, because there are some false moral principles that are reasonable to employ. Margaret Little, for instance, thinks that there are no true moral principles (not even principles that express pro tanto reasons or obligations), but that there are false, defeasible principles that can nevertheless provide presumptive epistemic warrant for moral beliefs. Little holds that we can know with reasonable certainty—on the basis of experience and testimony—what sorts of contexts we’re likely to encounter, as well as which features tend to count as reasons (and for what) in those sorts of contexts. She writes,

The judgement that a given principle such as “lying is wrong” will help rather than mislead a moral novice reflects a judgment about the sorts of contexts she is likely to encounter, just as our agreement that it is better training to tell beginner drivers “Never slam on the brakes” instead of “Stomp on the gas whenever you see another car” reflects a judgement that the student will most likely be facing our world of crowded highways and not the post-apocalyptic world of Mad Max movies. (Little 2000: 295)

This view—that there are defeasible moral principles we can legitimately use in deliberation—may seem at odds with the particularist claim that there are no pro tanto moral principles. However, Little sees no such tension. The existence of a principle that expresses a pro tanto reason or obligation entails that certain features have intrinsic moral natures that give them a default “moral valence”. To say, “Lying is pro tanto wrong”, is to assert that lying has a default negative moral valence, that the feature of being a lie in and of itself makes an action worse, even if that feature’s moral contribution could be outweighed by other considerations. However, according to Little, the existence of defeasible generalizations doesn’t entail any such thing; it simply turns out that lying tends to be wrong in the contexts most humans tend to encounter, even though lying, in and of itself, has no intrinsic moral valence. Since the latter is (close to) a mere defeasible statistical generalization, its use can allow one to justifiably come to moral beliefs even though (a) it’s strictly false and (b) it strictly says nothing about the intrinsic moral nature of a property.

This isn’t to say that Little thinks this is the only way we come to hold justified moral beliefs—perhaps we could achieve moral knowledge or justification by engaging in a cognitive process like that described by Dancy (a process by which one intuits, in a context, what the reasons in the context are and how one ought to weight them against each other). But Little does think that particularism will be too demanding if it requires that one form all moral beliefs in the way Abstinence prescribes.

To sum up, rule of thumb moral particularism makes room for a posteriori moral knowledge and a posteriori moral justification. Although it leaves open the possibility that some moral knowledge and justification is a priori (in the way Dancy describes), it denies that all moral knowledge/justification is a priori; rule of thumb particularists hold that one can justifiably infer at least some moral conclusions from experience, testimony, and (experience-supported) beliefs about the kinds of contexts one is likely to encounter.

6. A Priori Justification and Early 21st Century Intuitionism

Ethical intuitionism fell on hard times in the second half of the 20th century. But as the century closed and moving into the 21st century, a number of able defenders of the view came forward, e.g., Robert Audi (2004), Michael Huemer (2005), Russ Shafer-Landau (2005), Ralph Wedgwood (2007) and John Bengstrom, Terence Cuneo, and Russ Shafer-Landau (2019). (For good introductions to the recent discussion of intuitionism see Stratton-Lake 2002 and the entry on intuitionism in ethics.) Perhaps the resurgence of ethical intuitionism is in part a result of the increased attention philosophers have been paying to the role of intuition in philosophical inquiry more broadly. (A good starting point for this topic is provided by the essays in DePaul and Ramsey 1998, and see the entry on intuition.) We will close with an examination of the version of this “new intuitionism” presented by Audi—which he calls “moderate rationalist intuitionism” (Audi 2020)—focusing on the epistemological side of his position.

Audi’s version of intuitionism is very much in the spirit of the earlier intuitionism espoused by Moore and especially Ross. He moderates a number of elements of their intuitionism, highlights others, and arguably breaks with at least Ross on one significant point. We will begin with two ways in which his intuitionism softens elements of theirs.

First, earlier intuitionists did not consistently distinguish between two roles for necessity or self-evidence. Moral intuition might consist in apprehending that some moral proposition is necessary, or that it is self-evident. Or moral intuition might consist in just apprehending some moral proposition’s truth, while the proposition is in fact necessary or it is in fact self-evident. As a result, the earlier intuitionists often suggest our knowledge of fundamental moral principles is grounded in recognition of either the necessity or self-evidence of these principles. This imposes too strong a requirement on the a priori justification of moral principles. We cannot expect ordinary people to possess technical, philosophical concepts such as necessity and self-evidence. But there is no need to exclude ordinary people who lack these concepts from having a priori knowledge of ordinary moral propositions, e.g., that pain is bad or that promising to do something provides a moral reason for doing it. And even if an ordinary person does have the concepts of necessity and self-evidence, there is no reason to deny that the person knows ordinary moral propositions a priori when she or he believes them on the basis of understanding them, without noting their modal status (as necessary) or epistemic status (as self-evident). Doing so is not required by the standard account of self-evidence. Audi is very clear about the distinction between apprehending the necessity or self-evidence of a proposition, and apprehending the truth of a proposition that is necessary or self-evident. He does not require the former in order to have a priori knowledge of fundamental moral principles (2004: 41–45).

Audi stresses a second point, one we mentioned when discussing Ross. The earlier intuitionists held that there was no reason or evidence for self-evident moral principles and that they could not be proven. Examining why they might have made such strong claims would take us too far afield. It is sufficient to note that there is no need for intuitionists to make them. What’s important for their overall position is the possibility of being non-inferentially justified in believing fundamental moral principles. This does not require that it is impossible to provide reasons or evidence or even a proof for any moral principle. Audi’s intuitionism takes the more moderate position that self-evident moral principles can be justified without reasons, evidence or proof (2004: 51–54).

There is an important element of Ross’s intuitionism that Audi does not moderate, but instead makes more of than Ross. We previously noted that Ross’s conception of self-evidence is more restricted than the standard conception in that self-evident propositions are evident to those who have reached sufficient mental maturity and given them sufficient attention, rather than to anyone who understands them. The more restricted understanding allows an explanation of why people who understand a self-evident proposition might nevertheless not have a justification for believing it. On the plausible assumption that there is a close connection between what is evident for a person and what a person believes, Ross’s weaker conception also suggests an explanation of why some people who understand a self-evident proposition might believe it while others do not. Audi uses different terminology from Ross, formulating the relevant condition on self-evidence in terms of “adequate understanding”. But for Audi adequate understanding requires rather more than mere semantic comprehension, and, in the end, his view is probably quite close to Ross’s. Audi’s view of adequate understanding emerges when he explains how reasonable people could disagree about self-evident moral propositions as well as how one might continue to be justified in spite of disagreement (see 2015: 67–72). So Audi develops and does important work with the possibilities Ross’s more restricted conception of self-evidence opened up, but Ross did not much explore.

We now come to the point where Audi arguably breaks with much earlier thought regarding intuitionism. A second element of the earlier intuitionism that Audi emphasizes concerns the connection between intuition and belief. Neither Moore nor Ross made much use of “belief” and cognate terms. One can nevertheless make a fairly strong case that Moore probably would not have agreed that intuitions are beliefs. Ross is more difficult, but there is a strong temptation to interpret him as holding that intuitions are beliefs when he writes, e.g., that “the moral convictions of thoughtful and well-educated people are the data of ethics” (1930: 41). Many who have written about intuitions or intuitionism follow Ross so interpreted, assuming that intuitions are beliefs. Audi follows the lead of a number of contemporary writers on intuition (beginning with Bealer 1998) in recognizing the significance of what Audi calls “episodic intuitions”. Episodic intuitions are “intellectual seemings—a phenomenal, attentional sense of the truth of the proposition in question” (Audi 2015: 61). When we have an episodic intuition, we tend to believe the proposition intuited. But it is significant that one can have an episodic intuition without believing. Bealer illustrated the point with the naïve comprehension axiom of set theory. He reports that when he considers this axiom on its own, it seems true to him. But he does not believe the axiom, because he knows that it leads to paradox.[8] Interestingly, the intuition persists in spite of the recognition that the axiom is false. Many people share Bealer’s experience. Bealer notes that his example is a purely intellectual analog of the Müller-Lyer illusion: In spite of knowing that the lines in the illusion are equally long, they continue to seem—visually—to have different lengths.

It follows that episodic intuitions are not beliefs. Some writers hold that episodic intuitions are dispositions or felt dispositions to believe (see, e.g., Sosa 1998 and Williamson 2007). Others hold that episodic intuitions are sui generis propositional attitudes (see, e.g., Bealer 1998 and Huemer 2005). Audi seems to side with those who hold episodic intuitions to be sui generis propositional attitudes.

Bealer’s example shows that we can have episodic intuitions of false propositions and propositions that are not self-evident. Audi argues that one might adequately understand a self-evident proposition and fail to have an episodic intuition of it using as an example the proposition that “a child can be borne by its grandmother” (2015: 65). He claims that this proposition is self-evident—to figure out why it is true, think of Oedipus Rex—but denies that it is intuitive, noting that some people even have an episodic intuition of its falsehood.

Audi claims that Ross and other earlier intuitionists realized that not all intuitions had self-evident propositions as their objects. It is not obvious that they did, but we cannot pursue the issue. They certainly did not make a sufficient fuss about episodic intuitions to avoid being widely interpreted as holding that the intuitions responsible for our knowledge of morality are all beliefs in self-evident propositions. So Audi at the very least breaks with one common understanding of the earlier intuitionist position.

Episodic intuitions are epistemically and methodologically important for Audi. Here is a representative passage:

An episodic intuition, as an experience, does not stand in need of justification and may confer it. Like sense experience, it is only a fallible indicator of truth; but much as we cannot navigate the physical world without sense experience, we cannot adequately pursue truth in ethics or elsewhere without intuition. (2015: 65)

It is very clear that on the earlier intuitionist view, the justification for fundamental moral principles was a priori. What about Audi’s intuitionism? Since he does allow that some moral principles are self-evident, and that when a person believes such a self-evident proposition on the basis of adequate understanding, the person knows, he recognizes a place for a priori moral knowledge. But what about beliefs in moral propositions that are not self-evident, but are formed on the basis of episodic intuitions? Audi holds such beliefs can be justified, but is the justification a priori? As is indicated by the analogy with sense experience that Audi stresses, episodic intuitions are decidedly experiences. When a belief formed on the basis of an episodic intuition is justified, its justification depends upon the experience and hence is not independent of experience except for the experience necessary to acquire the relevant concepts. One can regard such beliefs as justified a priori only if one adopts the modified standard view of the a priori, which holds a priori knowledge and justification to be independent of perceptual, introspective, memorial and all other experiences—except for the experience of rational intuition. (For a more recent treatment of these issues, see Audi 2020.)

In closing, it is interesting to note that the version of contemporary intuitionism defended by Huemer (2005) also pushes one towards the modified standard view. The epistemological side of Huemer’s ethical intuitionism is a natural outgrowth of his general epistemological position, which he calls phenomenological conservativism. According to phenomenal conservativism, if it seems to one that a proposition is true, then one is prima facie justified in believing that proposition. Significantly, the specific kind of seeming—perceptual, from memory, by reasoning, or otherwise—is irrelevant to the seeming’s capacity to justify. Huemer’s phenomenological conservativism holds that all our beliefs are based on how things seem, and hence that unless seeming true justifies us in believing, we could not be justified in believing anything. Phenomenal conservativism drives one to the modified standard view of the a priori because the intellectual seeming is what justifies. One might be concerned that the modified standard view understands the distinction between rational intuition and all other kinds of seemings to be very significant epistemically—it is what marks the crucial distinction between the a priori and the empirical—but for phenomenological conservativism it is all just seemings, with no kind of seeming playing any different epistemological role from any other kind of seeming. One might allay the concern by noting that the modified standard view already admitted a role for experience in a priori justification, but distinguished the experience of rational intuition or intellectual seeming from all other kinds of experience. Nevertheless, when considering contemporary versions of moral intuitionism, especially when combined with phenomenological conservativism, it is hard not to notice that, if intuitive moral knowledge as these views conceive it is a priori, then the operative conception of the a priori has strayed a considerable distance from the old root idea of independence from experience.


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