Supplement to Morality and Evolutionary Biology

Evolutionary Biology and Appeals to Natural Teleology in Ethics

One way in which evolutionary biology may play a modest role in metaethics is by raising difficulties for appeals to natural teleology in the attempt to account for ethical normativity. Following Aristotle, philosophers have been intrigued by the natural norms associated with what seem to be objective proper functions and ends associated with living things. We speak of a defective heart valve, for example, in connection with the idea of its proper function, where this seems objectively grounded in facts about the life of the kind of organism in question: if a type of structure has a proper function in members of a given species, and this particular one is failing to perform that function in normal circumstances, then we can say that it is defective. And if we can apply these functional and normative concepts at the level of physiology, it seems equally possible to apply them at the level of psychology and behavior, as is common in ethology when speaking of the functions of behavioral patterns associated with fighting, fleeing, mating, and so on. Perhaps, then, the same conceptual framework of natural proper functions, ends, and associated evaluative claims applies equally to human life at the level of thought, feeling and behavior.

Indeed, some philosophers have thought that this might be precisely the way to provide an objective and naturalistic account of ethical normativity, with ethical judgments about an individual’s character traits, for example, being a special case of evaluative judgment associated with natural functional claims. Just as a heart valve may be defective if it has properties that make it fail to fulfill its function in the life of such organisms, so too a person’s will might be defective if it has properties (i.e., ‘vices’) that make it fail to fulfill its function in the life of human beings. This might seem to tie into the intuitively attractive idea that virtues are excellences of character that promote human flourishing, while vices are traits that inhibit our flourishing (Foot 2001; Thompson 1995, 2008).

Evolutionary biology raises significant challenges to any such approach to understanding ethics, though this is not as straightforward as it might at first seem. Evolutionary biology does not automatically undermine the very idea of proper functions and ends in biology, as some have suggested. While neo-Darwinian evolutionary theory does soundly reject any appeal to teleology in the process of evolution itself, there is a large literature in contemporary philosophy of biology defending the legitimacy of employing teleological concepts in connection with adaptations. For example, we plausibly attribute to the heart the proper function of pumping the blood (which is not merely something it happens to do, as it happens to make a certain distinctive noise), which occurs for the sake of circulating the blood and distributing nutrients and removing wastes (a teleological explanation for why the heart pumps the blood), and so on. The natural selection background of adaptive traits is in fact often at the heart of contemporary accounts of biological functions and ends. (See the entry linked above for details.)

Nor are these accounts limited to the physiological or morphological levels. On typical accounts of natural functions and ends, they extend to the spheres of psychology and behavior in many animals. It is plausible, then, to suppose that similar appetitive, emotional, and other psychological dispositions in human beings have similar proper functions; and if there are uniquely human psychological adaptations, as evolutionary psychologists claim, then these plausibly have biological functions as well. So the problem is not that the application of teleological concepts in biology has been discredited by Darwinism, or that it must be limited to physiology and cannot pertain to psychology and behavior.

The problem with appeals to natural teleology in ethics is rather that it is hard to see how we can employ teleological concepts in non-arbitrary ways without appealing precisely to the evolutionary causal histories that have given shape to and organized these traits into coherent functional systems. We must, for example, be able to distinguish non-arbitrarily between proper functions or ends and mere accidents—even useful ones, since the concepts of proper function and end are richer than that of a beneficial effect (even a statistically common one). But if we want to speak non-arbitrarily of the proper function of a trait or structure T, distinguishing this from other potentially useful but accidental effects that cannot properly figure into teleological explanations of T, then it seems unavoidable (or so many have argued) to look in some way to the distinction between the effects that figured into the natural selection history that shaped the trait (e.g., pumping rather than noisemaking, in the case of the heart) and effects that did not. There are many versions of this broadly “etiological” approach, many of which are more complicated than just identifying functions individually with selected effects. But there is a fairly broad agreement that some version of this approach will be necessary in order to make non-arbitrary sense of intuitive talk of what a trait T is for, i.e., what T does not merely “function to” do but has it as its proper function to do, which provides a certain kind of explanation (a teleological one) of T and supports normative claims about tokens of T.

This poses a difficulty for attempts to understand ethical normativity in terms of natural teleology because it seems to undermine the sort of welfare-based conception of natural teleology that would be necessary for a teleological naturalist approach to ethics to get off the ground. Recall that the reason such an approach might seem attractive in thinking about ethics is that ethics plausibly has to do with norms associated with human flourishing, and it might initially appear that natural teleology also involves norms associated with species-typical flourishing (Foot 2001). If, however, natural functions and ends in living things are structured by special relations established through the process of evolution through natural selection, i.e., non-incidental relations between traits and a special subset of their effects that figured into the selection process, then natural teleology will not ultimately or generally be about the welfare or flourishing of organisms (FitzPatrick 2000).

As discussed in section 2.2, the evolutionary principles according to which organisms are put together and conditioned as functional systems are not driven ultimately or generally by considerations of organismic flourishing or need-satisfaction. They have instead ultimately and generally to do (roughly) with whether a given trait T does a better job of propagating copies of the alleles A that tend to result in its expression, as compared with alternative traits T* produced by rival alleles A*, resulting in greater proportional representation of A in the gene pool in successive generations. This will often favor traits that promote the welfare of the organisms in question, but often it will not; and even where it does, it is only because of the ultimate effect on the relevant germ-line gene propagation, not because of the significance of welfare as such, which will be irrelevant in cases where it doesn’t also contribute relevantly to gene propagation, e.g., where it doesn’t also promote reproductive output (Dawkins 1982).

For these reasons, a welfare-based conception of natural functions and ends is problematic. Suppose, as suggested above, that an organism’s teleological profile is indeed shaped by the facts of the evolutionary history that ultimately explain how it was put together as the organized functional system it is. In that case, organisms will be teleologically organized ultimately and generally toward the end (roughly) of passing along germ-line copies of their genes as well as or better than rival conspecifics (this being the unifying effect non-incidentally promoted by all of the organism’s proper-functional traits)—rather than toward the end of flourishing as such in any richer, intuitive sense. Since this has little to do with what we would think of as ultimately and generally relevant to ethical normativity when applied to the human case, it seems doubtful that the normative framework provided by natural teleology can be of any help in thinking about the normative framework of ethics (FitzPatrick 2000; on the other side, however, see Casebeer 2003 for a defense of such an approach, Lott 2012 for a defense of Foot and Thomson against FitzPatrick’s objections, and Moosavi 2019 for a defense of Foot’s neo-Aristotelian account based on an alternative, “organizational account” of biological function that is oriented around organismic flourishing after all, while allowing that the details of such flourishing for human beings lie outside the scope of biological inquiry).

It could conceivably have been different. If natural teleology were the result of benevolent intelligent design with human flourishing in view, as a kind of analogue of artificial teleology for a divine designer, then we might be able to understand natural functions and ends ultimately in terms of the good or flourishing of the organisms in question. In that case, it might make sense to think of ethical norms as a species of natural teleological norms as applied to the reason-involving sphere of human life (practical deliberation, feeling, choice and action). If, however, the true account of the structures of functions and ends we find in living things is a result of evolution rather than intelligent design, and we need to appeal to the evolutionary history behind the assembly of those structures in order to understand them as such, then the overall shape of natural teleology will look very different, and it will hold out little hope for serving as the basis of ethical normativity when applied to human life. This is one way, then, in which evolutionary biology seems to have a clear and direct bearing on certain philosophical projects in metaethics, undermining approaches that once appeared promising but may no longer be viable.

Copyright © 2020 by
William FitzPatrick <>

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