Morality and Evolutionary Biology

First published Fri Dec 19, 2008; substantive revision Wed Dec 23, 2020

An article in The Economist (21 February 2008, “Moral thinking”), sporting the provocative subtitle “Biology Invades a Field Philosophers Thought was Safely Theirs”, begins with the following rumination:

Whence morality? That is a question which has troubled philosophers since their subject was invented. Two and a half millennia of debate have, however, failed to produce a satisfactory answer. So now it is time for someone else to have a go.[1]

And the article closes with the line “Perhaps [biologists] can eventually do what philosophers have never managed, and explain moral behavior in an intellectually satisfying way.” These passages epitomize a growing theme in the popular and scientific media, echoing claims made forty years ago with the emergence of sociobiology, when E.O. Wilson suggested that “the time has come for ethics to be removed temporarily from the hands of the philosophers and biologicized” (Wilson 1975, 562). For their part, moral philosophers will hasten to point out that they are not primarily in the business of “explaining moral behavior” in the sense of causally explaining the origins of our capacity for moral judgment or of various associated emotional and behavioral dispositions. If a moral philosopher asks “whence morality,” she is more likely to be concerned with the justification of moral principles or the source and nature of obligation. Still, there are important potential connections between the scientific explanatory issues and philosophical ones, opening the way for profitable interdisciplinary inquiry.

Section 1 provides an overview of the issues and a sketch of the connections between them, highlighting important distinctions we will need throughout. Sections 2, 3 and 4 then go on to explore critically the three main branches of inquiry at the intersection of morality and evolutionary biology: Descriptive Evolutionary Ethics, Prescriptive Evolutionary Ethics, and Evolutionary Metaethics.

1. Overview: Basic Issues, Questions, and Distinctions

Very little in the study of human life has been left untouched by developments in evolutionary biology, and inquiry into the nature of morality is no exception. With the recognition that we, like all other living things, belong to a species that has evolved through natural selection comes the acknowledgement that evolutionary processes have likewise shaped us deeply. How deeply?

Evolutionary explanations are commonplace when it comes to questions about our physiological nature—why we have opposable thumbs, say, or a bipedal posture. But even a brief look at other animals affords countless examples of adaptive psychological and behavioral traits as well—appetites for food or sex, fear responses, patterns of aggression, parental care and bonding, or patterns of cooperation and retribution; and these traits are likewise often best explained as biological adaptations, i.e., traits that evolved through natural selection due to their adaptive effects. (We will go through a striking example involving cooperative behavior in section 2.2.) This raises the question: to what extent might human psychological and behavioral traits similarly reflect our own evolutionary heritage?

When it comes to morality, the most basic issue concerns our capacity for normative guidance: our ability to be motivated by norms of behavior and feeling through judgments about how people ought to act and respond in various circumstances (Joyce 2006, Kitcher 2006a,b, 2011, and Machery and Mallon 2010). Is this human capacity a biological adaptation, having perhaps conferred a selective advantage on our hominin ancestors by enhancing social cohesion and cooperation? (‘Hominin’ refers, as did ‘hominid’ until very recently, to Homo sapiens together with fossil species of ape to which Homo sapiens are more closely related than we are to chimpanzees; these include the Australopithecines, extinct species of Homo, etc., making up the tribe Hominini within the sub-family Homininae.)

If so, then it would be part of evolved human nature to employ moral judgment in governing human behavior, rather than a mere “cultural veneer” artificially imposed on an amoral human nature (de Waal 2006). This would be a significant result, and it is only the beginning of the intriguing questions that arise at the intersection of morality and evolutionary biology. Researchers are also interested in the possibility of more specific forms of evolutionary influence. Are there, for example, emotional adaptations that influence the very content of moral judgments and behavior, even today?

For example, many of us believe that among our various moral duties, we have special and stringent duties toward family members. Might this ‘moral intuition’ be attributable, at least in part, to an evolved tendency to favor members of one’s kin group over others, analogous to similar traits in other animals? Even where moral beliefs are heavily shaped by culture, there might be such evolutionary influences in the background: evolved psychological traits may have contributed to the shaping of cultural practices themselves, influencing, for example, the development of “family first” cultural norms that inform our judgments. Similarly with a tendency more generally to favor members of one’s own group (however defined) over outsiders.

The above sorts of questions, which are receiving growing attention in the sciences, all pertain to morality understood as a set of empirical phenomena to be explained: it is an empirical fact about human beings that we make moral judgments, have certain feelings and behave in certain ways, and it is natural for the sciences to seek causal explanations for such phenomena. At the same time, however, it is a very complex matter—and one often neglected outside of philosophy—how such empirical, explanatory projects are related to the very different sets of questions and projects pursued by philosophers when they inquire into the nature and source of morality.

Moral philosophers tend to focus on questions about the justification of moral claims, the existence and grounds of moral truths, and what morality requires of us. These are very different from the empirical questions pursued in the sciences, but how we answer each set of questions may have implications for how we should answer the other. As we will see, though the two sets of issues are distinct, the scientific explanatory projects raise potential challenges for certain philosophical views, and at the same time attention to philosophical issues raises doubts about some of the explanatory claims made in the name of science, which often rely on controversial philosophical assumptions. Progress in this area will not be made either by doing moral philosophy in isolation from the sciences or by taking morality out of the hands of philosophers and looking to scientific inquiry in isolation. More promising would be a careful examination of the ways in which the scientific and philosophical projects inform each other.

1.1 Three Kinds of Appeal to Evolution in Evolutionary Ethics

Talk of ‘evolutionary ethics’ may suggest a well-defined field of inquiry, but in practice it can refer to any or all of the following:

  1. Descriptive Evolutionary Ethics: appeals to evolutionary theory in the scientific explanation of the origins of certain human capacities, tendencies, or patterns of thought, feeling and behavior. For example: the appeal to natural selection pressures in the distant past to explain the evolution of a capacity for normative guidance, or more specifically the origins of our sense of fairness or our resentment of cheaters. (See section 2.)
  2. Prescriptive Evolutionary Ethics: appeals to evolutionary theory in justifying or undermining certain normative ethical claims or theories—for example, to justify free market capitalism or male-dominant social structures, or to undermine the claim that human beings have a special dignity that non-human animals lack. (See section 3.)
  3. Evolutionary Metaethics: appeals to evolutionary theory in supporting or undermining various metaethical theories (i.e., theories about moral discourse and its subject matter)—for example, to support a non-cognitivist account of the semantics of moral judgment (the idea that moral judgments do not purport to represent moral facts but instead just express emotions, attitudes or commitments), or to undermine the claim that there are objective moral values, or to cast doubt on whether we could have justified beliefs about such values. (See section 4.)

All three types of project have broadly to do with how neo-Darwinian evolutionary theory might bear on our understanding of ethics or morality. The driving questions, concerns, methodologies and implications, however, differ greatly among these three lines of inquiry.

Importantly, there are no simple or straightforward moves from the scientific projects in A to the philosophical projects in B or C. Arguments for or against such moves require difficult philosophical work. Moreover, philosophical issues relevant to C can have an important bearing on at least some of the scientific explanatory projects in A. This puts important constraints on how much can confidently be said in favor of such scientific explanations given ongoing controversy over the philosophical issues.

It is, for example, a matter of live debate in contemporary metaethics whether there are knowable moral truths—correct answers to at least some questions about what is morally good or bad, right or wrong. If there are, as many philosophers (and non-philosophers) believe, then this will likely make a difference to the explanation of at least some of our moral beliefs and behaviors. Our belief in equal human dignity, for example, along with derivative beliefs about the wrongness of slavery or rape, might be sufficiently explained by our having grasped the moral truth that human beings have such dignity and so should not be treated as “mere means” (see section 2.4). Similarly, the belief that we have moral obligations to mitigate suffering even among distant strangers might be explained at least in part by our having grasped the moral fact that pointless suffering is intrinsically bad and that this gives us good reason to mitigate it where we can.

If this is so, then scientists will be overreaching if they claim that “causal explanations of brain activity and evolution…already cover most known facts about behavior we term ‘moral’” (Wilson 1998, 54). Instead, a significant amount of moral judgment and behavior may be the result of gaining moral knowledge, rather than just reflecting the causal conditioning of evolution. This might apply even to universally held moral beliefs or distinctions, which are often cited as evidence of an evolved “universal moral grammar” (Mikhail 2011). For example, people everywhere and from a very young age distinguish between violations of merely conventional norms and violations of norms involving harm, and they are strongly disposed to respond to suffering with concern (Nichols 2004). But even if this partly reflects evolved psychological mechanisms or ‘modules’ governing social sentiments and responses, much of it may also be the result of human intelligence grasping (under varying cultural conditions) genuine morally relevant distinctions or facts—such as the difference between the normative force that attends harm and that which attends mere violations of convention.

We will look in more detail later at this and other possibilities for explaining moral judgment and behavior. The point so far is just that there are plausible philosophical accounts of at least some moral judgment and behavior that appeal to independent exercises of judgment—perhaps in grasping moral truths, or perhaps just in forming reflective commitments—rather than to causal conditioning by evolutionary factors. There is a danger, then, of begging central questions if we draw general conclusions about “the” explanation of “our” moral thought and behavior based on scientific considerations—as is common in discussions of scientific work in this area. We may instead need a plurality of explanatory models. The best explanation for deeply reflective moral judgments may look quite different from the explanation for unreflective psychological dispositions we share with other primates, and there may be mixed explanations for much that lies in between.

1.2 The Empirical and Normative Senses of ‘Morality’

As a final preliminary point, it is useful to clear up one persistent source of confusion in discussions of morality and evolution by distinguishing between two very different senses of ‘morality’ and describing more explicitly the different sets of questions associated with them.

  1. The Empirical Sense of ‘Morality’

People coming from a scientific perspective, who are interested in descriptive evolutionary ethics, speak of morality as something to be explained scientifically—as in familiar talk of “how morality evolved”. Here ‘morality’ refers, as noted earlier, to a certain set of empirical phenomena, such as the observed capacity of human beings to make normative judgments, or the tendency to have certain sentiments such as sympathy or guilt or blame, or certain ‘intuitions’ about fairness or violence. Just as we can inquire into the origins and functions of other traits, such as human linguistic capacities, we can inquire into the origins and functions of the various psychological capacities and tendencies associated with ‘morality’.

The sense of ‘morality’ in the above questions may be called the empirical sense of the term, and it is in this sense that scientists speak of “the evolution of morality,” using such tools as comparative genomics and primate studies to shed light on it (Rosenberg 2006; de Waal 1996 and 2006). Such explanatory projects will be discussed in section 2.

  1. The Normative Sense of ‘Morality’

In contrast to the above, there is a very different use of the term ‘morality’ in what may be called the normative sense. Consider the question: “Does morality require that we make substantial sacrifices to help distant strangers?” Such a question arises from the deliberative standpoint as we seek to determine how we ought to live, and it is a normative rather than an empirical question. We are not here asking an anthropological question about some actual moral code—even that of our own society—but a normative question that might lead us to a new moral code. When we use ‘morality’ in the normative sense, it is meant to refer to however it is we ought to live, i.e., to a set of norms that ought to be adopted and followed.[2]

Philosophers employ this normative sense of ‘morality’ or ‘moral’ in posing a variety of both normative and metaethical questions: What does morality require of us? Does morality have a purely consequentialist structure, as utilitarians claim? What kind of meaning do claims about morality in the normative sense have? Are there moral truths—i.e., truths about morality in the normative sense—and if so, what are they grounded in and how can we come to know them? Is morality culturally relative or at least partly universal? (Note that this is not the same as the anthropological question whether or to what extent morality in the empirical sense varies from culture to culture.)

While morality in the normative sense is not an empirical phenomenon to be explained, there are still important questions to ask about how evolutionary theory may bear on it. Can we look to our evolutionary background for moral guidance, gaining insight into the content of morality in the normative sense (as claimed by proponents of prescriptive evolutionary ethics)? (Section 3) Does evolutionary theory shed light on metaethics, helping to resolve questions about the existence and nature of morality in the normative sense (as claimed by proponents of evolutionary metaethics)? Does it, for example, lend support to nihilism (the idea that there is really no such thing as morality in the normative sense) or to skepticism (the idea that even if there are truths about morality in the normative sense we cannot know them, or at least could not know them if they were objective truths)? (Section 4)

Having distinguished various issues and questions, we may turn now to consider first the scientific explanatory projects concerning morality in the empirical sense.

2. Descriptive Evolutionary Ethics: Explaining Morality in the Empirical Sense

Evolutionary explanations for morality in the empirical sense are offered at different levels, and this makes for very different explanatory projects with different implications. Some typical explananda in accounts of “the evolution of morality” are:

  1. The general capacity for normative judgment and guidance, and the tendency to exercise this capacity in social life;
  2. The capacity for certain sentiments and the ability to detect them in others;
  3. The tendency to experience and to be motivated by certain sentiments in certain types of situation;
  4. The tendency to make certain particular kinds of moral judgment or inference, or to have certain characteristic moral intuitions (i.e., a ‘moral sense’);
  5. The tendency to exhibit certain particular types of behavior in certain types of situation (as a result of D);
  6. The tendency of societies to exhibit certain particular systems of norms or types of practice (due to D and E).

2.1 Levels and Types of Explanation: Some Possibilities

It is uncontroversial that there will be evolutionary explanations of some sort for the very general capacities and tendencies in A and B: we are evolved creatures, and our psychological capacities, like other complex capacities, are outcomes of evolutionary processes. But this does not by itself settle whether these capacities and tendencies are themselves adaptations, having evolved through natural selection because of their adaptive effects. That is the most common view (further explored below), but there are alternatives.

It is possible, for example, that our capacity to make moral judgments is a spin-off (side-effect or by-product) of our non-moral intellectual capacities, which latter are adaptations.[3] On this view, we tend to make moral judgments because we are intellectual and reflective creatures, not because natural selection has specifically given us this moral capacity and tendency as an adaptation; the role of natural selection would be indirect, supplying more general capacities as adaptations, from which specifically moral tendencies spring independently (Ayala 2006; Prinz 2008, Machery and Mallon 2010).

The deeper point, however, is that whichever position one takes on the role of natural selection in the emergence of generic capacities for moral judgment, this does not settle how best to account for other, more specific tendencies, such as C-F. In particular:

  • Even if (1) our capacity and tendency to make moral judgments is an adaptation that evolved through natural selection, it remains possible that (2) the content of particular moral judgments is derived autonomously, i.e., free from causal shaping by particular elements in our evolutionary background—in roughly the way that the contents of our beliefs in physics or philosophy seem to be (see section 2.4 below).
  • Alternatively, even if (1*) our capacity and tendency to make moral judgments is not itself an adaptation, it remains possible that (2*) the content of particular moral judgments is deeply shaped by evolved emotional dispositions that have affected the content of moral judgments since human beings began making them. Such emotional adaptations may thus have influenced cultural norms throughout history and may continue to influence our moral judgments, and hence our behavior, today.

And of course there are other possibilities: 1 might be combined with 2*, or 1* might be combined with 2, and both 2 and 2* could also be weakened to apply only to some judgments, while others are explained in other ways, as suggested earlier. There are, then, many possible stories to be told about the origins of our moral judgments and behavior.

Since our concern is with morality, the crucial issue to begin with is the origins of moral judgment: for morality has not merely to do with certain emotions and behaviors (such as sympathy and altruism) as such, but with the exercise of moral judgment about how one ought to behave in various social circumstances (Joyce 2006, ch. 2; Korsgaard 2006; Kitcher 2006c, 2011; Machery and Mallon 2010). Certain emotions and behaviors are then relevant too insofar as they relate to the exercise of such judgment, but in the absence of moral judgment they seem only to belong to proto-morality.

Still, many discussions employ a looser notion of ‘morality’ that refers simply to certain kinds of socially positive emotion or behavior, such as psychological altruism (defined below). Since accounts of the origins of moral judgment rely on these ideas as well, and these emotions or behavioral dispositions are also often appealed to as causal influences on the content of moral judgment, it is worth starting with a look at the issue of psychological altruism, distinguishing it from merely biological altruism.

2.2 Biological and Psychological Altruism

Many discussions of morality and evolutionary biology focus largely on the issue of altruistic feeling and behavior. This can be confusing because in addition to psychological altruism there is also biological altruism, which is found in many species. (See Kitcher 2011, part I, for a comprehensive discussion.) Psychological altruism involves caring about others’ welfare and deliberately benefiting them for their own sake, with no restriction on the type of benefit involved. By contrast, biological altruism has nothing essentially to do with intentions or motives, and it pertains only to ‘benefits’ to others that increase their reproductive fitness (boosting their genetic contribution to future generations).

Though psychological altruism is different from biological altruism, there are a variety of possible explanations of the evolution of psychological altruism that appeal to the same factors that explain the origins of biological altruism, namely:

  • Kin selection or ‘inclusive fitness’ theory (Hamilton 1964);
  • Selection pressures leading to teamwork, reciprocal altruism (Trivers 1971; Maynard Smith 1982; Axelrod 1984) and indirect reciprocity (Alexander 1987; Joyce 2006); and
  • Group selection (Sober and Wilson 1998).

It would take us too far afield to survey all these biological accounts in detail, the background for which is already treated in the entry for biological altruism; there are also many excellent and accessible summaries of such accounts and their application to psychological altruism (e.g., Joyce 2006, ch. 1). We will settle here for one detailed illustration of one way in which biological altruism can be given an evolutionary explanation, followed by a sketch of the ways in which this and other evolutionary mechanisms might likewise explain the emergence of psychological altruism—keeping in mind that this is all just one part of explaining morality proper, to which we return in the next sub-section.

The very idea that biological altruism can come about through natural selection may initially seem puzzling. One way of characterizing natural selection, after all, is in terms of “selfish genes”: natural selection occurs when a variant of a gene (an allele) at a given locus tends to cause a modification of a bodily or behavioral trait (a phenotypic trait) in a way that, in the overall environment, tends to cause that variant of the gene to increase its relative frequency in the next generation; this then increases the representation of the associated trait modification as well. Typically this happens when the phenotypic modification is one that causes the organism to have greater reproductive success: if, in the overall context, allele A causes its carrier to have a trait T that causes the organism to have more offspring than other organisms in the population who carry rival allele A* and display alternative trait T*, then A will be inherited and carried by more organisms in succeeding generations; and that means that T will likewise be displayed by more organisms (Dawkins, 1989). But how do we get from “selfish genes” increasing their representation in the gene pool, via improving the reproductive success of their carriers, to such things as cooperation and biological altruism? It turns out there are many ways.

To take one dramatic example, consider social insect colonies, and in particular, the Hymenoptera (bees, ants and wasps). In these colonies we find such an extreme degree of cooperation—division of labor (queen, workers, soldiers, etc.), food-sharing, information sharing—that it is tempting to view the entire colony as a single functioning organism. Indeed, in the case of stinging worker honey bees, there is not only cooperative labor but also, when necessary, the ultimate sacrifice in defense of the hive (at least where the invader is a mammal, stinging of which proves fatal to the bee as the barbed sting is torn out upon being deposited in the victim). How can such striking cooperation and self-sacrifice be explained in evolutionary terms?

One important fact to notice is that the colony is one large family: typically, the workers are sisters—daughters of the queen. Return to the idea of “selfish genes” described above: what ultimately increases an allele’s representation in the gene pool is its having some phenotypic effect that causes copies of that allele to be in more organisms in succeeding generations. That normally happens when the phenotypic effect causes the organism to have greater reproductive success, but it can equally happen if it causes the organism’s close kin to have greater reproductive success: for close kin are likely to carry copies of that same allele, which means that greater reproductive success for kin likewise propagates copies of the allele. So while an allele that causes an organism to engage in sex more often may thereby spread, so might an allele that causes an organism to help a sibling to reproduce (as by aiding survival); either way, that allele will be helping to propagate copies of itself in the next generation, which in turn means that the helping behavior it causes will likewise spread over time (Dawkins 1989, 171–77).

This mechanism of “kin selection” can explain how worker bees evolved such apparently ‘selfless’ traits, focused on aiding the queen’s survival and reproduction. In fact, the situation is even more interesting and extreme: workers have evolved to serve the queen’s reproduction at the complete expense of their own, as they are sterile. This extreme biological altruism, however, may be explained by the same principles, with the addition of the fact that due to a genetic peculiarity of the Hymenoptera (their haplodiploidy), sisters are more closely related to each other genetically than they would be to their own offspring.[4] This means that natural selection will actually favor worker traits that help their mother reproduce (thus making more sisters, who are especially likely to carry copies of the gene for that same trait, making it spread), over traits in workers aimed at personal reproduction. This could explain how worker sterility evolved, as traits focused on helping the queen took precedence over personal reproduction, and it explains how even suicidal behavior could have been selected for as propagating the genes that cause it (Dawkins 1989, 174–75). (It is worth noting, however, that the theory of kin selection and inclusive fitness is highly complex and has received renewed critical scrutiny in recent years. For a recent special collection of articles on the topic see Royal Society Open Science on Inclusive Fitness).

This is only one example of one way in which biological altruism can evolve: there are others, which are not restricted to kin and are explained using game-theoretic or group dynamic models (again, see the entry on biological altruism for details). The crucial point is just that any kind of genetically-based trait can evolve if it happens to have the right kind of feedback effect on the genes that influence it. This brings us, then, to the sort of trait we are more interested in: a disposition for psychological altruism, as defined above.

Again, while it may initially seem puzzling that evolution should give rise to psychological altruism, rather than merely to selfishness, there is nothing paradoxical about it: a genetically-based disposition for psychological altruism will evolve just in case such a trait, in the relevant circumstances, promotes the propagation of the genes that bring it about (and does so more effectively than alternative traits produced by rival alleles). And this can again happen in various ways.

The basic idea is that psychological altruistic dispositions can evolve as proximate mechanisms or “modules” for promoting the biological advantages relevant to the forms of selection listed above. In some cases, these adaptive psychological mechanisms will involve specifically targeted or conditional altruistic motivations, involving capacities for discrimination to focus benefits on kin or on reciprocators. In other cases, the selection pressures will give rise to less discriminating altruistic sentiments and tendencies as the simplest and most cost-effective mechanisms for promoting adaptive cooperative behaviors in a given environment. If our hominin ancestors tended to live in circumstances where the opportunities for ‘wasting’ altruism in non-fitness-enhancing ways (e.g., on ‘outsiders’) were sufficiently few and far between, then a simple, undiscriminating (though limited) sense of concern and altruism may have promoted fitness at far less cost than more discriminating forms, evolving more readily. One advantage of this hypothesis is that it might help explain some sorts of concern and altruism that are otherwise hard to make sense of in evolutionary terms.

For example, suppose you receive a letter from UNICEF soliciting contributions for health and nutrition programs for children in Darfur, and you are moved to send a check. This is not merely selective altruism toward kin or likely reciprocators, but altruism toward strangers who are in no position to reciprocate, and it might therefore seem puzzling from a purely biological point of view: such ‘indiscriminate altruism’ isn’t biologically adaptive in the way more selective altruism might be; your helping children in Darfur isn’t helping to propagate your own genes, so it may seem mysterious how such a trait could have evolved through natural selection. But a trait that is not presently adaptive may once have been. In the environment in which our hominin ancestors lived, where there was little positive contact with outsiders, even relatively indiscriminate altruism would tend to benefit kin or potential reciprocators, and so might have been a simple adaptive mechanism on the whole.

If so, then your presently non-adaptive altruistic behavior in our current global environment could in principle be an expression of an evolved, indiscriminate altruistic tendency—an adaptation that is largely no longer adaptive, and so would amount to a kind of ‘misfiring’ of formerly adaptive instincts (Dawkins 2006, 220–21; Kitcher 2006b). It would be in this way on a par with our taste for fatty foods—originally evolved for its adaptive effects though it is no longer beneficial in today’s fast food economy—though in the case of altruism the ‘misfiring’ has happier results. Of course, it’s also possible (as discussed in section 2.4) that your altruistic tendency isn’t itself an adaptation at all, but is instead rooted in values that you’ve developed, through moral reflection in your cultural context, independently of specific evolutionary influences. Or it may be some combination of the two.

This area of inquiry remains largely speculative, since it is one thing to develop models for how psychological altruism could in principle evolve, and quite another to show convincingly that a given form of natural selection has in fact played the relevant role in actual human evolutionary history. There may be doubts, for example, whether there was sufficient pair-wise engagement in iterated prisoner’s dilemma games to explain the evolution of reciprocal altruism according to some of the most familiar game-theoretic models (Kitcher 2006a,b). In any case, it is time to return to the issue of moral judgment, which is crucial to the explanation of morality proper, and goes beyond mere altruistic feeling and behavior. The following sub-section describes one leading hypothesis.

2.3 Explaining the Origins of Morality: From Psychological Altruism to the Evolution of Normative Guidance

Kitcher (2006a,b; 2011) has proposed a three-stage account of the evolution of morality. It begins with the evolution of an early but fragile form of psychological altruism among hominins in the context of “coalition games” in mixed adult groups. The social structure would have been similar to that of contemporary chimpanzees and bonobos, where cooperation among the relatively weak (or those in weak stages of life) is beneficial to them, but strategic calculation is infeasible. These conditions may have led from simpler forms of biological altruism developed through kin selection to the evolution of a psychological altruistic disposition involving “a blind tendency to respond to the preferences of another animal with whom you might engage in cooperative activity,” as a simple but effective mechanism for promoting advantageous participation in coalitions and subcoalitions (Kitcher 2006b). (This is the ‘indiscriminate’ altruism discussed in the previous sub-section.)

Because this disposition was both limited and unstable, however, and competed with powerful selfish drives, there was a continual threat of social rupture and loss of cooperative advantage. This in turn would have made ongoing peacemaking a necessity, thus limiting the size of viable cooperative units and the scope of cooperative projects, as well as imposing significant costs through the devotion of time and energy to peacemaking activities. An example would be extensive mutual grooming going well beyond what is necessary for hygiene, of the sort found in chimpanzee societies.

The next phase, according to this hypothesis, was a transition to much larger groups with more extensive cooperative activities, through the evolution of a capacity for emotionally laden normative guidance, without which such arrangements would not have been possible. (See also Gibbard 1990, ch. 4.) With the emergence of a capacity to make and follow normative judgments, reinforced by coevolved reactive emotions such as guilt and resentment, and the development of rules and social practices promoting and enforcing group loyalty and cooperation, a new psychological mechanism came into being for reinforcing the previously unstable altruistic tendencies and promoting large-scale social cohesion and stability. The advantages of membership in coalitions and subcoalitions would be conferred on hominins who had facility with such normative guidance—including a strong sense of obligation and tendency toward social compliance—and who thus acted consistently on these altruistic tendencies, acquiring the reputation for being good coalition partners and participating in a broader array of cooperative projects.

If this hypothesis is correct, it might explain not only the origins of our general capacity for normative judgment and motivation, but also the widespread tendency for social rules or norms historically to emphasize such things as group identity, loyalty and cohesion, and to focus largely on the regulation of violence and sex; and it might help to explain widespread dispositions toward social conformity, concern with reputation and social standing, tendencies for group-wise scorning or punishment of the disloyal, and the power of emotions such as resentment, guilt and shame.

In the final phase, this sort of “proto-morality” of norms and reactive emotions would then be supplemented over thousands of years with various paths of cultural evolution, leading to the development and fleshing out of the much more sophisticated systems of moral beliefs, practices and institutions with which we are familiar, from the earliest historical examples right up to our present moral cultures (Kitcher 2006a, 2011). There is, of course, a great deal of leeway in the last part, concerning the details of the transition through cultural evolution from hominin proto-moralities to contemporary moral systems, which allows for some very different possible stories. Some accounts will attribute great influence to evolved, “domain-specific psychological modules” (such as a dedicated mechanism that automatically generates a feeling of concern when confronted with suffering) in shaping the content of our moral feeling, judgment and behavior, both through shaping our cultures and more directly; other accounts, while not denying some such influence, will emphasize very different factors as influencing the content of at least some of our moral beliefs (such as the “capacity for open-ended normativity” cited by Buchanan and Powell 2015, 2018, 2019). This brings us to the next major topic.

2.4 Autonomous Moral Reflection and the Explanation of Reasoned Moral Judgment and Behavior

So far, we have focused on scientific projects that treat morality in the empirical sense as calling simply for causal explanation, as by appeal to evolutionary influences. This is unexceptionable with regard to the origins of the general human capacity for moral judgment: clearly some causal explanation is required, and an evolutionary explanation is plausible. But things are much more complicated when we consider the explanation of the actual content of moral judgment, feeling and behavior.

We have had a taste above of the way in which scientists might propose to explain our particular moral attitudes or judgments by appeal to specific evolutionary causes as filtered through cultural developments. Human beings have a strong, emotionally-laden sense of basic fairness, resentment of cheaters, and a desire that they be punished, all of which finds expression in both cultural norms and individual moral judgments. You might experience such feelings if you’ve been the victim of a scam, morally condemning the perpetrators. And some of these psychological traits may have analogues in other species. For example, Sarah Brosnan and Frans de Waal (2014) argue that “evidence indicates that [inequity aversion, i.e., negative reactions to unequal rewards for similar tasks] is widespread in cooperative species under many circumstances”--though some have disputed this and offered alternative hypotheses to explain the behavior, based on further research (Engelmann, Clift, Herrmann, and Tomasello 2017).[5] In the simplest case, an animal protests when it sees a companion receive a superior reward for a similar task, as in a well-known study with brown capuchin monkeys, though similar effects have now been observed even in non-primates, such as dogs and crows. In the more complex case, chimpanzees sometimes react negatively to inequity even where they are the ones receiving the greater reward. A natural evolutionary hypothesis for the simpler case is that such a disposition protected against ‘wasting’ cooperative efforts where they were not fitness-enhancing. Similarly, a natural explanatory hypothesis for the more complex form of inequity aversion is that it evolved in creatures with sufficient predictive capacities and emotional control because it preserved beneficial cooperative relationships that could be threatened by such inequities, thus proving fitness-enhancing on the whole given the benefits of continued cooperation (Brosnan and de Waal, 2014). All of this might suggest good prospects for causal explanation of human moral traits in terms of evolved psychological traits. Indeed, Brosnan and de Waal explicitly hypothesize that the evolved complex response observed in champanzees is what “allowed the development of a complete sense of fairness in humans, which aims not at equality for its own sake but for the sake of continued cooperation” (Brosnan and de Waal, 2014).

Caution is needed here, however. Our moral judgments and resulting behaviors cannot just be assumed to be mere causal upshots of some such biological and psychological forces, on a par with the cooperative activity of bees or the resentment felt by capuchin monkeys (or even the broader unease apparently felt by chimpanzees) over unequal rewards for equal work. When a rational agent makes a judgment, whether in the sphere of morality or in such areas as science, mathematics or philosophy, the proper question is not in the first instance what caused that judgment to occur, but what reasons the person had for making it—for thinking it to be true. It is those reasons that typically constitute an explanation of the judgment. They explain by bringing out what the person took (rightly or wrongly) to be the justification for the belief in question—the considerations showing the belief likely to be true. All of this complicates the explanatory project in relation to the thoughts, feelings and actions of rational agents.

It is helpful to illustrate the general point first with other kinds of judgment, and then to return to morality. Consider some judgments in mathematics, philosophy and science:

M: There is at least one prime number between 5,000 and 10,000.

P: If identity claims such as ‘water = H2O’ are true, then they are necessary truths (i.e., true in all possible worlds).

S: There is no such thing as absolute simultaneity.

How do we explain someone’s believing something like M, P or S? We normally need to know her reasons for believing it to be true, which we can then go on to assess as good or bad reasons for such a belief. Either way, we typically take her reasons—and the reasoning associated with them—to explain her belief, which is why we engage seriously with her reasons as such in critical discussion, and go on to inquire into their merits. If, for example, we ask a person why she believes M, and she cites a proof she has found convincing, showing that for any natural number n > 1 there is at least one prime number between n and 2n, we normally take this as a sufficient explanation for why she believes M. What we do not normally do is to appeal directly to independent causes, such as evolutionary or other biological or psychological influences to explain people’s beliefs in these areas. Such independent explanations for beliefs can sometimes be correct, as in the case of someone given a post-hypnotic suggestion, in which case we may regard her judgment as merely caused and the reasons offered as mere rationalization. But this is not the norm.

The reason why we normally explain beliefs such as M, P or S by appeal to the reasons the person gives for them is that we normally assume that the person is capable of intelligent reflection and reasoning and has arrived at her belief for the reasons she gives as a result of that reflection (whether or not the belief is ultimately correct). We assume in general that people are capable of significant autonomy in their thinking, in the following sense:

Autonomy Assumption: people have, to greater or lesser degrees, a capacity for reasoning that follows autonomous standards appropriate to the subjects in question, rather than in slavish service to evolutionarily given instincts merely filtered through cultural forms or applied in novel environments. Such reflection, reasoning, judgment and resulting behavior seem to be autonomous in the sense that they involve exercises of thought that are not themselves significantly shaped by specific evolutionarily given tendencies, but instead follow independent norms appropriate to the pursuits in question (Nagel 1979).

This assumption seems hard to deny in the face of such abstract pursuits as algebraic topology, quantum field theory, population biology, modal metaphysics, or twelve-tone musical composition, all of which seem transparently to involve precisely such autonomous applications of human intelligence. Even if there are evolutionary influences behind our general tendency to engage in certain kinds of mental activity, or behind some of our motives in these pursuits (e.g., if a given musician or poet is motivated to compose music or poetry in order to impress a potential mate), this would not show that the activity is governed in its details by such influences (cf. Buchanan and Powell 2015, 2018, and 2019). And again, this assumption of autonomy is borne out in our normal explanations of beliefs such as P above: we take a person at her word that what explains her believing P, for example, is that due to philosophical arguments she’s read and has found convincing she takes ‘water’ to work like a proper name and thinks that it follows from this that ‘water’ refers to whatever molecular compound it picks out in the actual world in all possible worlds in which the compound exists.

Few would deny the autonomy assumption altogether. To do so in the name of providing alternative evolutionary causal explanations of our beliefs would risk self-defeat: for if we lack the relevant intellectual autonomy across the board, then even the biologist’s beliefs about evolutionary biology and its implications would just be attributable to such biological causes, rather than to reasons that provide real warrant for such beliefs within a rational framework with truth-tracking integrity. The challenge to the autonomy assumption is therefore more likely to come in a selective form.[6]

This brings us back to moral judgment. As with M, P and S, people typically have reasons for their moral judgments, and whether or not we agree with them, we typically take those reasons to explain why they believe what they do. Consider again the moral judgment mentioned earlier:

MJ: The person who cheated me did something wrong and should be punished.

Just as with M, P and S, someone making this judgment will have reasons that she takes to justify this claim, ultimately tying into her overall conception of right and wrong. And we tend to take this at face value as an explanation of why she believes MJ, unless we have special reason to suspect distorting causes, such as prejudice leading to misperception and rationalization. We tend to think that a person has the moral beliefs she does as a result of background moral reflection and reasoning, within her cultural context. In other words, we tend to treat a person’s moral beliefs much as we treat her reasoned mathematical, scientific, or philosophical beliefs, applying the autonomy assumption in seeking to explain why she believes what she does.

One potential lesson from evolutionary biology, however, is that even if the autonomy assumption equally applies in principle to the sphere of moral judgment, it may be a mistake just to assume that most moral judgment and behavior is in fact a result of the exercise of such autonomous reflection, reasoning and judgment. The autonomy assumption, after all, says only that we have the capacity for relevantly autonomous reflection and judgment; it does not imply that we always exercise it. Perhaps the human capacity for autonomous thinking is exercised only in some cases, while in others the process that leads to moral belief is largely influenced by evolved psychological dispositions, such as emotional adaptations. While such a situation may not tend to arise in relation to our mathematical, philosophical, or scientific thinking, our evolutionary history may have given rise to emotional dispositions that play a significant role in at least some of our moral thinking, feeling and behavior. (See section 2.5 below.)

One plausible story, then, is that while many of our more reflective and reasoned moral judgments involve autonomous exercises of domain-general intelligence, many other less reflective moral judgments are largely attributable to evolutionary influences—both through direct conditioning of people’s moral judgments by evolved, domain-specific psychological dispositions and through background influences on cultural factors. On this hypothesis, we cannot treat moral judgments as a homogeneous set, but must recognize that they can come about in very different ways, requiring a plurality of explanatory models. While a model of autonomous reasoning might apply to some moral beliefs and behaviors, a model appealing to evolutionary causal influences will apply to others. And often some combination of models may be necessary, as in cases where both evolutionary influences and our own independent moral reflection might lead to similar judgments, overdetermining them.

For example, even if it is true that evolutionary pressures favoring caring for offspring have strongly influenced our attitudes towards our children, it does not follow that this is the complete explanation for why we believe we have special obligations to care for our children and for why we behave as we do toward them. It may be part of the explanation, while another part may have to do with an autonomous recognition of the appropriateness of special parental care: we see that we have good reasons to take special care of our children, which ought to motivate us even if we weren’t already motivated by instinctive feelings. We might also employ autonomous, domain-general comprehensive moral reasoning to recognize that our instinctive feelings shouldn’t always be followed, e.g., in cases where considerations of justice constrain certain pursuits of benefits for one’s own children, providing genuine overriding reasons to refrain from unjust actions. (We will consider another plausible example of overdetermination involving judgments about the much discussed ‘Trolley cases’ in section 3.)

2.5 The Challenge to the Autonomous Reflection Model: Post Hoc Rationalization of Emotionally Caused Judgment

Advocates of an autonomous reflection model of moral judgment grant that various causal influences—likely including evolutionary ones—often play some role in moral thought and feeling. But opponents who hold a deflationary view of the role of autonomous reflection seek to press the challenge here more fully. To expand the potential reach of the evolutionary influence model of moral judgment, they typically combine that causal model with what may be called the ‘mere rationalization hypothesis’ with regard to the reasons people give for moral judgments that are really shaped by evolutionary factors.

On this view, our giving of reasons for our moral beliefs in such cases is interpreted as mere post hoc rationalization. Rather than engaging in autonomous reflection and reasoning, and coming to believe certain moral propositions for the reasons that emerge from that reflection (as with M, P and S), what is happening instead according to this hypothesis is that (1) our moral beliefs are simply caused by emotions or ‘moral instincts’ we have largely due to our evolutionary background, and (2) we then invent rationalizations for these resulting beliefs in order to try to make sense of them to ourselves, unaware of their real causal origins (Haidt 2001; Wheatley and Haidt 2005; Knobe and Leiter 2007; Leiter 2007).

For example, when someone judges that abortion is wrong, it may be that “the anti-abortion judgment (a gut feeling that abortion is bad) causes the belief that life begins at conception (an ex post facto rationalization of the gut feeling)” (Haidt 2001, 817). On this model, our moral reasonings and justifications (or at least those to which the model is supposed to apply) are just so much window dressing for beliefs that are more like post-hypnotic suggestions than they are like M, P or S; just as with post-hypnotic suggestions, people go to great lengths to provide rationalizations in an attempt to render their moral beliefs intelligible to themselves. The difference is that instead of a hypnotist, the causal agents are emotional dispositions stemming from our evolutionary past.

The basic idea that some moral beliefs are susceptible to this sort of debunking explanation is not new. Moral philosophers have long recognized that people have often been led to moral judgments based on self-interest or prejudice, for example, and then rationalized their views, inventing justifications for positions held due to other causes. A plausible example would be a judgment such as:

MJ2: Interracial marriage is morally wrong.

While such a judgment was not uncommon just a few generations ago, most readers of this article will recognize MJ2 to be not only false, but also likely to have stemmed from racial prejudice, with much of what was said to justify it being mere post hoc rationalization for a view more attributable to the causal influence of prejudice than to the workings of autonomous reflection and reasononing. Most philosophers today would say something similar about a moral belief still held by many people, especially within traditional religions:

MJ3: Homosexuality is morally wrong.

The reason why philosophers tend to find a ‘mere rationalization hypothesis’ plausible for such beliefs as MJ2 and MJ3 is that (i) the justifications offered for them have consistently failed to stand up to critical reflection, and (ii) there are plausible alternative explanations for why people have really come to hold such beliefs, such as that they have misconstrued personal feelings of disgust as perceptions of objective moral wrongness, and projected those feelings onto the world as ‘moral impurity’.[7] Together, these considerations lend support to the hypothesis that the justifications offered are mere rationalizations, and that the beliefs are best explained by appeal to emotional causes.

The central question is: How broadly does the deflationary model of the ‘mere rationalization hypothesis’ apply to moral judgments, and to what extent are evolutionary influences implicated in those cases?

At one extreme, someone might deny that the autonomy assumption applies to the moral domain at all: we either lack these capacities in the domain of moral thought, or at least never exercise them. Such a claim seems to have little plausibility, however. Why should it be that human intelligence and innovation know virtually no bounds in other domains—as illustrated by feats of autonomous inquiry and creativity in quantum field theory, algebraic topology, modal metaphysics, or symphonic composition—and yet when it comes to moral thinking we remain stuck in ruts carved out for us by evolution, slavishly following patterns of thought prescribed for us by evolved, domain-specific mechanisms, with all of our cultural developments providing mere variations on those themes?

The very fact of human self-consciousness makes such a picture unlikely: for as soon as we are told that our thinking is constrained along evolutionarily given paths, our very awareness of those influences provides the opening to imagine and to pursue new possibilities. If you are told, for example, that you are evolutionarily conditioned to favor your group heavily over outsiders in your moral judgments, you are able, as a reflective agent, to take this very fact into account in your subsequent moral reflection, deciding that this favoring is unwarranted and thus coming to a new, more egalitarian moral view.[8] Analogously, it may be true that we possess dedicated mechanisms for ‘reading’ faces as trustworthy or threatening, and often make split-second judgments on this basis; but this doesn’t preclude our ability to revise such judgments, as when we reflect on the behavior of someone with ‘trustworthy facial features’ and realize that he is actually a scoundrel.

It is noteworthy that the leading proponent of the mere rationalization hypothesis, Jonathan Haidt (2001), does not take the extreme position of denying the autonomy assumption. He grants that such capacities exist and are sometimes exercised, singling out the moral deliberations of philosophers as likely examples (2001, 828–29). His claim is just that such exercise of autonomous reasoning in the production of moral judgment is rare; in the vast majority of cases, our judgments result from immediate ‘intuitions’ reflecting emotional causation. But there are many questions to raise even about this qualified claim (despite its generously letting philosophers, at least, off the hook).

Even where our judgments are based on immediate ‘intuitions’, it may be that these intuitions are often themselves informed by prior acts of reflection and reasoning (Pizarro and Bloom 2003), or are partly cognitive responses to objective features of situations that may outrun our ability (prior to philosophical reflection) to articulate them—much as a chess master may ‘see’ that a certain move is best prior to being able to articulate exactly why (Kamm 1996, 2007). Similarly, the input from the autonomous reasoning of philosophers and some religious leaders may well influence the background ethical sensibilities of whole societies, thus influencing moral judgment even where there is no lengthy reasoning occurring in the particular case. There are also important philosophical worries about the methodologies by which Haidt comes to his deflationary conclusions about the role played by reasoning in ordinary people’s moral judgments.

To take just one example, Haidt cites a study where people made negative moral judgments in response to “actions that were offensive yet harmless, such as…cleaning one’s toilet with the national flag.” People had negative emotional reactions to these things and judged them to be wrong, despite the fact that they did not cause any harms to anyone; that is, “affective reactions were good predictors of judgment, whereas perceptions of harmfulness were not” (Haidt 2001, 817). He takes this to support the conclusion that people’s moral judgments in these cases are based on gut feelings and merely rationalized, since the actions, being harmless, don’t actually warrant such negative moral judgments. But such a conclusion would be supported only if all the subjects in the experiment were consequentialists, specifically believing that only harmful consequences are relevant to moral wrongness. If they are not, and believe—perhaps quite rightly (though it doesn’t matter for the present point what the truth is here)—that there are other factors that can make an action wrong, then their judgments may be perfectly appropriate despite the lack of harmful consequences.

This is in fact entirely plausible in the cases studied: most people think that it is inherently disrespectful, and hence wrong, to clean a toilet with their nation’s flag, quite apart from the fact that it doesn’t hurt anyone; so the fact that their moral judgment lines up with their emotions but not with a belief that there will be harmful consequences does not show (or even suggest) that the moral judgment is merely caused by emotions or gut reactions. Nor is it surprising that people have trouble articulating their reasons when they find an action intrinsically inappropriate, as by being disrespectful (as opposed to being instrumentally bad, which is much easier to explain).

To return to our central question: it remains unclear just how much of human moral judgment is susceptible to the mere rationalization hypothesis, or when it is, how much of a role is played by evolutionary influences on emotions. The mere rationalization hypothesis is best supported when we have independent reason to reject an appeal to autonomous reflection, as when a moral judgment is implausible in itself and we have a very likely debunking causal explanation of why someone might nonetheless be led to believe such a thing. Such is the case with MJ2 and MJ3 above, and perhaps many other traditional moral judgments focused on sexual taboos, notions of ‘impurity’, in-group loyalty (from tribalism to nationalism), hierarchical authority relations, and rigid gender roles. But this does not provide grounds for a deflationary approach across the board.

Many moral beliefs—for example, concerning the moral irrelevance of sexual preference, the moral equality of persons of all races and nationalities, or moral obligations even to future generations in far away countries—are much more plausible candidates for being upshots of autonomous moral reflection and reasoning. Indeed, many philosophers take them to be plausible candidates for moral truths, grasped through reflection that reveals good reasons for believing them, which is therefore what explains our moral beliefs and behavior in these cases.

These claims may, of course, be disputed. Even if it is granted that our judgments are often the products of our reasoning, pace Haidt (2001), it remains possible that our reasoning itself is distorted by evolutionary influences. This may be especially worrisome given the role played by intuitions in moral reasoning (unlike with mathematical reasoning, say), even in determining our acceptance of premises in arguments: insofar as there are concerns that our intuitions may be distorted by evolutionary influences, there will equally be worries about our moral reasoning (Sinnott-Armstrong 2005).

It remains unclear, however, just how far such worries really extend, even if it is granted that moral intuition and reasoning are often subject to such distorting influence. It is hard to see, for example, how some people’s moral belief that we should impoverish ourselves and limit our own reproduction in order to help distant strangers, or even that we should cease having children altogether, could be explained in terms of the distortion of their reasoning by evolutionary influences. The striking range of moral beliefs itself, both across and within cultures, seems like good evidence of significant input from autonomous moral reflection—moral thought going beyond exercises of evolved “neurocomputational systems” or “social contract algorithms” or “inference engines” with domain-specific goals and special inference procedures designed for solving particular adaptive problems (Cosmides and Tooby 2008). Even if there are indeed such special modules devoted to reasoning about obligation and entitlement, as posited by evolutionary psychologists, the question is how much they explain, and whether they really exclude significant input from autonomous moral reasoning.

These issues remain challenging and controversial. But the controversies are as much ongoing philosophical ones as scientific ones, and it is therefore unlikely that scientific results will settle them. Science will plainly not settle, for example, whether or not there are moral truths; and if there are, they will likely play an explanatory role with regard to at least some of our moral beliefs—something we will miss if we approach these issues from an exclusively scientific point of view.

A duly cautious claim about the explanatory role of evolution with respect to morality in the empirical sense might therefore be:

The Modest Evolutionary Explanatory Thesis: evolutionary forces may adequately explain certain capacities and tendencies associated with moral thinking, feeling and behavior, and may explain or partially explain some of the content of our moral thought, feeling and behavior, insofar as it is influenced (individually or via influences on cultural development) by those tendencies.

3. Evolutionary Biology and Normative Ethics: Prescriptive Evolutionary Ethics, Corrective Evolutionary Ethics, and the Question of Moral Progress

In section 1.2, we distinguished between the empirical and normative senses of ‘morality’. This section deals with morality in the normative sense. Does evolutionary biology shed light on the content of morality in the normative sense? That is, in thinking about how we ought to live, do we get any insight from evolutionary theory? And does evolutionary biology have any significant implications for thinking about the prospects for moral progress?

3.1 Spencer

The project of attempting to derive normative conclusions from the facts of evolutionary biology is most commonly associated with Herbert Spencer and his “Social Darwinist” admirers. Spencer was, by all accounts, a more gifted and subtle thinker than he is typically given credit for today. (See the entry on Spencer.) Still, we may treat his views briefly here, as his arguments concerning evolutionary biology and ethics were based on deep misunderstandings of evolution. This is not to deny the historical interest of his views. It may be surprising to learn, for example, that Spencer himself gave a central place to harmony and mutual aid in the “permanently peaceful societies” he viewed as the pinnacle of evolution in its “highest phase”—something one does not typically associate with “Social Darwinism”, but which comes directly from Spencer’s (largely non-Darwinian) conception of evolution.

Spencer (1879) conceived of evolution as a teleological process, directed toward the production of progressively “more evolved” (in the sense of “superior”) forms manifesting a greater “totality of life”, i.e., a greater richness of thought, feeling and action, as well as greater length of life. Human behavior is “more evolved” than the behavior of other animals, and the harmonious and mutually supportive behavior of people in “permanently peaceful societies” (where “self-maintenance and race-maintenance” is pursued without hindering others in the same pursuit) is “more evolved” than the behavior of savages or of members of less harmonious societies; that is, the former is the “highest form of conduct” because it subserves the greatest “totality of life” embodied by harmonious and happy human social life, where the latter is taken to be the final end of evolution.

All of this, of course, is inconsistent with Darwinism, which denies that evolution is a teleological or end-directed process, gives no meaning to Spencer’s notions of “more evolved” forms or conduct (whereby human beings, for example, are “more evolved” than other species, or ethical conduct is “more evolved” than unethical conduct), and focuses on reproductive fitness rather than on Spencer’s notion of the “greatest totality of life in self, in offspring and in fellow man,” among other fundamental differences (Rachels 1990). Spencer’s views on morality and evolution may therefore be set aside as historically interesting but unhelpful to contemporary discussions based on a better understanding of evolutionary biology.

3.2 Biology and the Autonomy of Ethics

Even philosophers sympathetic to ethical naturalism (the view that moral facts are themselves natural facts of some sort) have typically been wary of attempts to derive conclusions about morality in the normative sense from facts about evolutionary history. This is especially so when they are clear (unlike Spencer) about the principles governing Darwinian evolution through natural selection. From the fact that a certain trait is an adaptation, which evolved through natural selection by virtue of its positive feedback effects on germ-line replication of the alleles that generate the trait, nothing at all seems to follow about whether it is morally good or right, or something we ought to embrace and foster. Certain dispositions may be present in us for good evolutionary reasons without any implication that these traits benefit us, or are moral virtues or produce behaviors that are morally right.

A brief survey of some of the traits that are likely biological adaptations in a number of species—such as a tendency to kill ‘step-children’ or to philander—ought to convince us that even if similar tendencies are likewise adaptations in human beings, present in us for similar evolutionary reasons, this would be no argument at all that we ought to engage in such behaviors. Clearly the burden would be on the prescriptive evolutionary ethicist to explain why a trait’s having been good at propagating the alleles coding for it tens or hundreds of thousands of years ago should be thought to have anything at all with the rational or moral justification of our embracing it. And the prospects for meeting this burden have never seemed strong: it is hard to see how such evolutionary facts can possibly have normative authority or force for a rational agent (McDowell 1995). Regardless of why one has a given trait, the question for a rational agent is always: is it right for me to exercise it, or should I instead renounce and resist it as far as I am able? (Korsgaard 2006).[9]

This suggests that ethics, like mathematics, is an autonomous subject in the sense that it has its own “internal standards of justification and criticism”, such that its conclusions cannot be justified by other forms of inquiry such as evolutionary biology (Nagel 1979, 142; McDowell 1995 and 1997a,b). Normative ethical conclusions are justified through first-order ethical reflection and argument, just as mathematical propositions are justified through mathematical reasoning, rather than through learning more about our evolutionary past or about what is happening in our brains when we engage in these forms of reasoning (Rachels, 1990). It would seem to be as much of a mistake to try to answer ethical questions by examining fMRI scans or studying our evolutionary history as it would be to try to solve mathematical problems by such means (except, perhaps, insofar as evolutionary theory may shed light on some present, morally relevant empirical facts, as discussed below).

Still, some have argued that empirical psychological studies (and related evolutionary hypotheses—see section 4.2) can have normative ethical implications. In particular, it has recently been argued that scientific evidence supports consequentialist ethical theories over deontological ones (Greene 2003, 2008, Singer 2005). Consider a famous pair of hypothetical cases much discussed by moral philosophers (Thomson 1985):

Trolley: a runaway trolley is heading toward five people on the track ahead, who cannot get out of the way; it cannot be stopped, but there is a switch you could flip that would divert it onto a side track containing only one person;

Bridge: a runaway trolley is heading toward five people on the track ahead, who cannot get out of the way; you are standing on a bridge over the track, and if you shove the very large person next to you off the bridge and in front of the trolley, the crushing of his body will stop the trolley before it reaches the five.

Most people respond to these cases by saying that Trolley is permissible while Bridge is not. But what explains this difference in moral response? Many philosophers have argued for deontological constraints prohibiting murdering some to save others, as in Bridge; they regard the case of diverting a public threat toward lesser harm, as in Trolley, as an exception, and offer principled reasons for doing so, thus justifying our treating the two cases differently (e.g., Thomson 1985). Greene (2008, 42–44) dismisses such normative explanations as unconvincing and takes a very different tack, highlighting another difference between Trolley and Bridge: whereas the harm done in Bridge (shoving a man to his death) is “up close and personal”, the harm done in Trolley (by flipping a switch) is not. This difference corresponds to a difference in the strength of emotional response, the response to “personal” harm being much stronger; and this in turn corresponds to a difference in the brain regions most active when the cases are contemplated: Bridge tends to activate areas associated with social/emotional processing (the posterior cingulate cortex, the medial prefrontal cortex, and the amygdala) while Trolley produces activity in areas associated with higher cognition (the dorsolateral prefrontal cortex and the inferior parietal lobe).

Greene takes this to support the hypothesis that what accounts for people’s different moral responses to Trolley and Bridge (and countless other cases) is simply the difference in emotional response, which in turn ties in to evolutionary explanations. Given the need in our evolutionary past for mechanisms to restrain interpersonal violence within cooperating groups, “it should come as no surprise if we have innate responses to personal violence that are powerful but rather primitive,” predating the evolution of complex reasoning and now competing with our more reasoned responses (Greene 2008, 43). Deontological intuitions, such as our condemnation of the violence in Bridge, thus represent evolved “alarm-like emotional responses” which are subsequently rationalized rather than resulting from moral reasoning (see the discussion of Haidt in section 2.5); by contrast, our responses to more abstract harm such as Trolley reflect complex cognitive processes, as do consequentialist responses generally, including cases where people overcome their initial negative emotional responses (in cases like Bridge) and decide that the right thing to do is whatever produces the best overall consequences.

Greene’s claim, then, is that this casts doubt on deontological ethical theory: far from giving us good reasons to refrain from certain utility maximizing acts, it merely gives expression to emotional relics of our evolutionary history. A rational morality will move beyond such alarm-like emotions and take us, through genuine reasoning, in the direction of consequentialism.

As with Haidt’s claims about moral judgment (section 2.5), there are many philosophical questions to raise about such appeals to experimental data to draw philosophically loaded conclusions (Appiah 2008, Berker 2009, Dancy 2014, Railton 2014, FitzPatrick 2018). It is hardly surprising, after all, that people have strong emotional reactions to blatant rights violations such as shoving an innocent person off a bridge in front of a trolley to be crushed for the greater good. Such emotions would equally be expected on deontological models. Nor does the speed with which we make negative moral judgments in such cases show that the judgments are merely emotion-driven: even if there is not explicit reasoning going on in each case, the emotion-laden intuitive responses may be informed by background moral reflection and formation (Pizarro and Bloom 2003, Dancy 2014, Railton 2014). Philosophers who are less skeptical of the normative explanations for our judgments will find it plausible that such reflection has made us intuitively sensitive to morally relevant distinctions—such as the distinction between doing something to a public threat to direct it toward least harm vs. assaulting an innocent person and using his harm to bring about less overall harm; that sensitivity then shows up in our intuitive moral judgments, which are no less justified just because they provoke strong emotions.

Indeed, philosophers who believe there are good reasons for distinguishing morally between Trolley and Bridge are unlikely to be convinced by the above debunking explanation, for the following reason. Suppose we vary Bridge to equalize the cases for the factor Greene emphasizes: instead of having to shove the man off the bridge, all you have to do in Bridge Lever is flip a switch, and the switch will activate a lever that knocks the bystander off the bridge in front of the trolley. These cases are now equalized to be “impersonal”: neither now involves violence that is “up close and personal”. But does this variation change our moral response? If it does not, and we find Bridge Lever again objectionable (just like Bridge) while allowing for Trolley, then Greene’s proposed explanation would not work: we would need a different explanation for this pair of cases, such as the reason-giving explanation deontological philosophers would give. Even with regard to the original pair of cases, while Greene may be right that evolved dispositions against personal violence play some role in explaining our reactions, this needn’t be the whole explanation. It may be that this is another case of overdetermination (see section 2.4).

3.3 Corrective Uses of Evolutionary Biology in Normative Ethics

A less problematic kind of appeal to evolutionary theory has been made even by those who fully recognize the autonomy of ethics and the role of autonomous moral reflection. Darwinian evolutionary theory implies that many other beliefs about the natures and origins of living things are false. Human beings are not members of a species created by a special act of a divine designer, but members of an evolved species related by common ancestry to every other species on Earth. So insofar as certain ethical views rely on assumptions about special creation, they will be refuted by the success of evolutionary theory. More weakly, insofar as certain ethical views have traditionally been supported by claims about special creation, they will to that extent lose some of their support. This would not show that they are false or even unjustified, as there may be alternative sufficient support for them. But in removing some of their common support, evolutionary theory would pose a significant challenge to those who had relied on that support (Rachels 1990).

Rachels takes such an approach against the common belief that human beings have a special moral dignity that is much higher than the status enjoyed by non-human animals. Such a belief has traditionally been rooted in the idea that we are separate from other living things, having been created specially in the image of God and endowed with souls, giving us a special moral status. If evolutionary theory is true, however, then this support is undermined: since Homo sapiens evolved from other species, there is no sharp biological separation between Homo sapiens and the rest of the living world; there is instead a continuum through evolutionary history, with no species created separately, in a divine image, or infused with special souls. Thus, those who have based their beliefs about the speical moral status of human beings on a creationist picture have a problem: that picture is false, and the true picture does nothing to support such a view.

Again, however, this does not show that the common view of special human dignity is false or even unjustified. There may be other forms of support for it that do not depend on creationist assumptions. Many would argue, for example, that although we are related to other animals, we are very different from even our closest primate relatives, as (not to put too fine a point on it) a trip to the zoo followed by a visit to the Library of Congress or the Metropolitan Museum of Art will confirm. The vastness of the differences between human and other forms of life on Earth is not erased by pointing out that human beings got to be the way we are through contingent evolutionary processes acting on brains similar to those of extant apes, together with thousands of years of cultural evolution. It is these real differences—regardless of how they came about—that plausibly ground differences in the moral status of human beings and other animals.[10]

There are more straightforward ways in which evolutionary biology, as well as results from empirical moral psychology, can play a corrective role in normative ethics. Evolutionary biology and comparative genetics might, for example, be used to undermine false claims about race, which underlie racist ethical claims. Experimental psychology might be used to cast doubts on the moral condemnation of homosexuality by supporting the debunking hypothesis that such judgments stem from projected disgust. More generally, psychological experiments can expose typical human pitfalls in moral judgment and behavior—tendencies toward cruelty in conditions of power inequality, or toward exaggerated moral condemnation when experiencing disgust or stress. If we understand these facts about ourselves, we can more effectively pursue and realize normative goals such as non-violence or fairness by avoiding circumstances that lead to cruelty, or by watching for and correcting distorting influences on our judgment (Glover 2000; Appiah 2008, 49, 71–72, 110–11, 124; Buchanan and Powell 2018). As noted earlier, however, the normative goals themselves will not have been set for us by evolutionary biology or psychology. That task falls to informed moral reflection.

3.4 The Question of Moral Progress

The idea of moral progress features prominently in reflection on the history and future of moral thought and practice. While it may be difficult to assess whether a society has made moral progress on the whole over some period, it is not hard to find plausible examples of progress along particular dimensions. The elimination of the Atlantic slave trade, for example, and the development of the modern human rights movement are compelling examples of widespread moral progress. There are also plausible avenues to further progress through improved conformity with legitimate moral norms and through improvements in moral concepts, reasoning, and understanding. We might then wonder: what are the drivers of such moral progress (and likewise of moral regression when it occurs)? And how might evolutionary biology bear on the prospects and strategies for achieving moral progress (and avoiding moral regression)? Allen Buchanan and Russell Powell take up these issues in wide-ranging theoretical work that potentially has practical implications for a number of current social and political problems, as discussed below (Buchanan and Powell 2018, 2019; Buchanan 2020; see also the symposium discussion of the 2018 book in Analyse & Kritik 41(2), 2019).

Different metaethical stances (see section 4) yield different understandings of what moral progress might consist in as well as different explanations for how moral progress has historically come about. A moral realist, for example, will tend to conceive of moral progress in terms of achieving a more accurate grasp of objective moral truths and refining of our practices and institutions to align more closely with them; and plausible examples, such as the widespread liberalization of moral practices over the past few centuries, will be explained largely by appeal to growing insight into moral truth (Huemer 2016). By contrast, those who reject such appeals to objective moral truths but wish to retain some notion of moral progress (perhaps one that is extensionally very similar) will formulate a different conception of progress and offer socio-cultural explanations of progressive changes that do not rely on appeals to improved insights into moral truth (Kitcher 2011). We will here set aside the many complex issues attending these different approaches and focus on this question: what bearing might our evolutionary past have on our prospects and strategies for achieving the sorts of changes most agree would constitute moral progress?

Suppose that the trend toward greater inclusivity with respect to the scope of moral consideration—i.e., the elimination of racial and gender barriers to the attribution of full human moral status, and the extension of substantial moral considerability to a wide range of non-human animals—counts as moral progress. One pessimistic thought that might arise here on the basis of evolutionary considerations is that human moral psychology may have evolved in such a way as to place inevitable constraints on the possibilities for achieving robust and sustained progress in these respects. While our evolved moral psychology may contain certain altruistic elements, these may be ultimately parochial, given the nature of the selection pressures faced by our Pleistocene ancestors and assuming, as most discussions do, that the long Pleistocene Epoch (roughly 2.6 million years ago to 11,700 years ago, is the one primarily relevant to the biological evolution of human psychological traits).[11] That is, these elements may be focused on kin and members of a perceived in-group, with other countervailing dispositions posing strong obstacles to extending that altruism to outside groups. Even if we have some capacity for autonomous moral thought, enabling at least some to grasp more inclusive moral truths, there may be such powerful evolutionary constraints built into human moral psychology that such ideas are unlikely to take hold and motivate progressive changes in a widespread and sustainable way. There may be evolutionary limits to the basic moral progress that we evolved primates can realistically hope to achieve: we may just be saddled with a largely exclusivist, tribalist morality.

Buchanan and Powell refer to this pessimistic idea as “evoconservatism,” and they note that it has been used to argue against social and political movements organized around such “cosmopolitan moral reform.” And on the other side of that same evolutionary coin, “evoliberals” share the same premise about the constraints imposed by evolution on human moral psychology but instead argue that since the progressive goals are sufficiently desirable, we should look for biotechnological interventions to alter human nature in such a way as to make them realistically achievable. Buchanan and Powell reject both views because they reject the underlying picture of evolved human moral nature. Instead, they argue that the striking shifts that have already occurred toward more inclusive morality, as well as consideration of the conditions under which moral regression has occurred, support a very different, more nuanced picture of evolved human moral psychology—one without such pessimistic implications for deep and lasting moral progress.

On their “biocultural” view, it is not just that human rationality allows significant scope for autonomous moral reasoning that can lead to greater inclusivity (as discussed in section 2.4 above), but that our evolved moral psychology itself contains the seeds for such a shift (though it equally contains the seeds for potential moral regression). They key idea is that our evolved moral nature is neither inherently tribalist nor inherently inclusivist, but contains both dispositions; their expression, however, is conditional on the particular socio-institutional environmental conditions that obtain (or are at least perceived to obtain). In some conditions tribalistic dispositions will be engaged, while in other conditions inclusivist dispositions can dominate. This is their “adaptive plasticity” model of evolved human moral psychology, according to which evolution has disposed us to think and behave in certain ways under one set of (perceived) conditions, and in very different ways under another set of (perceived) conditions—this having been fitness-enhancing in our evolutionary history. In particular, our tribalist tendencies are activated when “cues of out-group threat” are perceived (whether real or not), involving competition, disease, undermining of in-group cohesion, and so on; by contrast, our inclusivist tendencies are activated when such cues are less abundant or salient.

The hypothesis is that these adaptively plastic traits served the biological interests of Pleiostocene humans well, achieving the joint benefits of tribalism under conditions where it was fitness-enhancing and more inclusive morality under conditions where tribalism was counterproductive and greater inclusivity was beneficial. For us today, this constitutes a mixed inheritance: on the one hand, it provides us with the seeds for moral progress insofar as we can foster and maintain the socio-institutional contexts that allow more inclusive dispositions to flourish; on the other hand, it saddles us with vulnerability to destructive tribalism when we find ourselves (or even just perceive ourselves to be) in circumstances characterized by sufficient out-group threat cues. Buchanan and Powell argue that this makes human beings dangerously susceptible to moral regression due to the manipulation of perceptions through demagogic populism, for example—a danger that is exacerbated where disinformation is rapidly spread through social media. If they are right, then the situation is ripe for media-savvy politicians to manipulate popular beliefs in ways designed to trigger the threat cues that energize tribalist tendencies in thought, feeling and behavior for political gain—from reflexive anti-immigrant nationalist sentiment to racially charged scapegoating during a pandemic.

While these dangers cast doubt on the conviction that moral progress is inevitable or even the natural default, the model proposed by Buchanan and Powell leaves open a realistic hope for continued and deepening moral progress: it is possible for humanity to make and sustain deep moral progress, without being hamstrung by any inbuilt evolutionary constraints; but it will require ongoing cultural efforts to foster and sustain the socio-institutional circumstances that enable the better aspects of human moral nature to predominate (Buchanan, forthcoming). This is the practical message of this biocultural theory of moral progress: moral progress is possible for us without the need for biotechnological modifications of human nature; but such progress is also fragile and cannot be taken for granted (Buchanan and Powell 2018).

4. Evolutionary Metaethics

While evolutionary facts may do little to illuminate the content of morality in the normative sense (apart from shedding light on morally relevant facts), they are sometimes thought to tell us something about the existence and nature of morality in the normative sense. (See section 1.2 for the notion of morality in the normative sense.) A number of philosophers have claimed that evolutionary theory can be used to debunk certain metaethical theories and perhaps to support others. One relatively modest project along these lines would be to use evolutionary biology to undermine Aristotelian appeals to natural teleology in human life to account for ethical facts, along the lines of Foot (2001). This evolutionary-based critique of “teleological naturalism” in ethics (FitzPatrick 2000) is discussed in the

Supplement on Natural Teleology in Ethics.

Other projects involve using evolutionary biology to try to undermine traditional moral realism—the view that moral judgments can be true (accurately representing moral facts) when construed literally, that their truth does not depend on our evaluative attitudes, and that we can know at least some of these truths. Such arguments are taken to support moral skepticism (according to which we cannot possess moral knowledge) or moral antirealism (for example, views that construe moral truths as functions of our evaluative attitudes, or expressivist views according to which moral judgments function to express attitudes, acceptance of norms, etc., rather than to represent moral facts, or error theoretic views according to which all moral judgments are false).

4.1 General Evolutionary Debunking Arguments

As discussed in section 2, evolutionary accounts of the origins of our capacity to be guided by moral judgments do not require any appeal to the comprehension of moral truths by our hominin ancestors, or even to the existence of such truths. Such stories require only claims about natural selection pressures having favored the development of such a capacity and tendency because of the positive effects such traits had on biological fitness (Kitcher 2006a, 176, and 2011; Joyce 2006, 131, 184; Street 2006, 127 f.; Griffiths and Wilkins 2015). Should this fact undermine our confidence in the existence of moral truth or in the possibility of moral knowledge (at least if moral truths are understood to be objective, i.e., independent of our evaluative attitudes)?

Proponents of epistemic ‘evolutionary debunking arguments’ think it should, arguing either that evolutionary considerations support moral skepticism (Joyce 2006, 2013, Forthcoming) or that they at least undermine traditional moral realism by providing a defeater for our moral beliefs if correctness for moral beliefs is construed in a realist fashion as accurate representation of objective or independent moral truths (Street 2006, 2008). (For discussion of these arguments, see Copp 2008, Kahane 2011, Enoch 2011, Skarsaune 2011, Shafer-Landau 2012, Berker 2014, Fraser 2014, FitzPatrick 2014a,b and 2017a,b, Vavova 2015, Rini 2016, Levi and Levi 2020, among many others.)

On the face of it, the mere fact that natural selection would not have ‘designed’ our moral faculties to track moral truths accurately (as it plausibly designed our perceptual faculties to track facts about medium sized objects in typical human environments) is not obviously problematic. There are, after all, lots of cases where we seem to be able to grasp genuine truths even though those truths play no role in the story of how our basic mental capacities evolved. We are able to grasp truths of quantum field theory or higher dimensional topology or, for that matter, philosophy (or so we are assuming in even engaging in this debate) even though those truths had nothing to do with why the basic mental capacities underlying these abilities evolved in our Pleistocene ancestors. Those capacities evolved in response to selection pressures in ancestral hunter-gatherer environments, and we have simply learned how to develop, train and exercise them in cultural contexts to discover truths that go far beyond any that were relevant to the evolution of those underlying capacities. Philosophers who endorse some form of moral realism have typically believed that we’ve done the same thing in grasping moral truths (see sections 2.4–2.5).

Suppose, however, that evolutionary influences not only did not design our faculties to track moral truths, but did positively shape them in ways that have pervasively conditioned the content of our moral thought and feeling, through evolved emotional dispositions or “domain specific modules” that provide us with inherited moral instincts that shape our beliefs. Debunkers have claimed that this is the case and argued that it has deep metaethical implications. Though there are a variety of formulations of such arguments, with somewhat different targets (some attacking moral knowledge itself, others seeking only to undermine moral realism by showing that it would saddle us with moral skepticism), a core argument based on the work of Sharon Street may be spelled out roughly like this:

Evolutionary Debunking Argument:

“Our system of evaluative judgments is thoroughly saturated with evolutionary influence,” because of the role natural selection played in shaping our underlying psychological dispositions (Street 2006, 114). But natural selection shaped those dispositions simply according to which variations best contributed to the biological fitness of our hominin ancestors, rather than in ways that would be expected to track independent moral truths as such, even if they existed. That is, natural selection rewarded moral belief-forming dispositions that yielded whatever moral beliefs led to behaviors that caused hunter-gatherers to out-reproduce their peers and propagate their genes more effectively, regardless of whether or not these beliefs happened accurately to represent a realm of independent moral truths. (The same would have been true for religious beliefs and theological truths: all that mattered were the relevant effects on genetic propagation, as through increased cooperation and rule following based on belief in a watchful god, assuming the religious belief-forming dispositions were under genetic control and subject to selection pressures. Theological truth or falsity was beside the point.) But since realists do not understand moral truths simply to be a function of what helped Pleistocene hunter-gatherers to maximize their reproductive output, it would be a sheer coincidence if our evolutionarily shaped moral beliefs happened to align with the moral truths, accurately representing them. And we are not justified in thinking that any such sheer coincidence has taken place. Therefore, we cannot have any justified confidence that our moral beliefs accurately represent independent moral truths of the sort posited by realists. That is, our justification for our moral beliefs would be defeated by these evolutionary considerations, at least if truth for moral beliefs consists in accurately representing independent moral facts, as realists maintain. (Epistemic internalists may deny that the facts cited above would by themselves render our moral beliefs unjustified, even on a realist model. But even they should agree that once we become aware of those facts our moral beliefs would thereby be rendered unjustified, at least given a realist model of what it would be for them to be true.) So realism saddles us with skepticism. And if such skepticism is implausible, then realism must be rejected in favor of an antirealist view (such as moral subjectivism) that would still allow for justified moral beliefs despite evolutionary influences and our awareness of them (Street 2006, 2008).

One response to this argument, on behalf of naturalistic realism, grants the claim of pervasive evolutionary influence on the contents of moral beliefs but challenges the claim that this should undermine our confidence in these beliefs. David Copp (2008), for example, has argued that on the conception of moral truths implied by his society-centered moral naturalism, it is plausible to suppose that a moral psychology shaped by natural selection in social contexts would yield moral beliefs that track moral truths at least reasonably well as a first approximation. On such a view, moral truths are grounded in moral standards having to do with codes that would enable societies to meet their basic needs (continued existence, stable cooperation among members, internal harmony and peaceful relations with other societies). Given the account of the evolution of human moral psychology sketched in section 2.3, involving the evolution of a capacity for normative guidance in connection with promoting social stability and cooperation (ultimately, of course, because of effects on genetic propagation), and further contributions of cultural evolution toward the development of moral codes fostering those same goals, many of our moral beliefs would naturally have to do with conditions for social stability and cooperation. Since on the proposed naturalistic view this is just what moral truths are about, there would thus be a tendency for our moral beliefs to have been shaped in ways that do tend to track moral truths, especially combined with continued cultural developments for correcting beliefs or attitudes that fail to contribute to these social goals.

Street (2008) has replied to this proposed way out of the problem, in part, by noting that Copp’s strategy relies on his intuitions about what the moral truths are, as reflected in his society-centered moral theory. But those are precisely the intuitions of an evolved theorist, ex hypothesi influenced by the same evolutionary factors that influenced the moral beliefs in question. So of course we can expect there to be a decent alignment between our evolutionarily shaped moral beliefs and the moral truths described by a moral theory spun by the very same evolutionarily shaped mind. Such a move, she argues, therefore cannot really help the realist. It would be different if God independently (and convincingly) revealed to us what the moral truths are, so that we could then go check our moral beliefs against them and perhaps discover that they line up pretty well; but instead, all we’re doing is comparing our moral beliefs with a purported list of moral truths yielded by a theory we find plausible precisely because it is appealing to our evolved sensibilities (though see Locke 2014 and FitzPatrick 2014b for some complications here).

Similar and even worse worries arise for a subset of non-naturalists who grant the debunkers’ claims about pervasive evolutionary influence on our moral beliefs and also insist that moral properties and facts have played no role at any point in the formation of our moral beliefs, which have instead been caused by some ‘third factor’ that happens to have brought about the desired correlation (Wielenberg 2010, Enoch 2011). One can, of course, tell a story about some such third factor: perhaps the ‘evolutionary aim’, survival and reproduction, also happens to be good, so that in giving us moral beliefs that promoted survival and reproduction evolution also happened to give us moral belief dispositions that are largely accurate (Enoch 2011). But the question is again how one is entitled to rely on moral intuitions (e.g., that survival and reproduction are good) in telling that story, even after granting that those intuitions are simply the product of ‘morally blind’ causes, i.e., causes operating entirely insensitively to moral properties and facts. There are also deeper difficulties concerning oversimplifications in such accounts (e.g., regarding the ‘evolutionary aim’) and the fact that on this approach the correlations between moral beliefs and moral truths ultimately rest on a mere accident, raising doubts about whether such accounts can really make sense of the kind of moral knowledge and understanding realists think we have (Bedke 2009, FitzPatrick 2014b).

Realists have further resources, however, which can be deployed to supplement a move such as Copp’s, in a way that blocks the above dialectical worry raised by Street. Street’s objection to Copp, after all, has teeth only if the realist has already granted the strong claims about “tremendous” and pervasive evolutionary influence “saturating” our moral beliefs across the board. It is far from clear, however, why realists should accept such strong claims to begin with. As discussed in section 2, it seems doubtful that the scientific evidence itself supports such strong claims about the etiology of ‘our’ moral beliefs. Even if there is significant evolutionary influence on the content of many of our moral beliefs, it remains possible that many of our moral beliefs are arrived at partly (or in some cases wholly) through autonomous moral reflection and reasoning, just as with our mathematical, scientific and philosophical beliefs.

Consider how a moral realist will approach the above debunking argument. It is intended to show us that realism is untenable, which of course means that this conclusion cannot just be assumed from the start. Yet if we begin the argument allowing that there may be independent moral truths, then why should we accept the initial claim about the pervasive influence of evolutionary forces on the content of our moral thinking in the first place? If there are independent moral truths, then we may plausibly have grasped many of them through autonomous exercises of our capacities for moral reflection, whereby we have come to recognize good reasons for thinking certain moral propositions to be true, by correctly grasping that certain features of actions are wrong-making, say.

For example, your belief that human trafficking is wrong is plausibly best explained by citing your reasons for holding it: you believe it’s wrong for the reasons you give, such as the fact that it causes tremendous suffering and deprivation, violates the basic dignity and rights of its victims, and so on. From a realist perspective, these features you cite in giving your reasons for the belief are in fact wrong-making features of human trafficking, i.e., features that make trafficking wrong and therefore make true the moral proposition that human trafficking is wrong. On this picture, you therefore believe that trafficking is wrong because it is wrong and you’ve come to recognize the moral fact that it is wrong by recognizing the reasons why it is wrong (FitzPatrick 2016).

Unless realism has already been rejected for other reasons, then, this picture is an open possibility at the start of the debate, which means that the realist is entitled to hold that many of our moral beliefs are in fact not merely caused by evolutionary and other ‘morally blind’ influences, but are instead well-grounded responses to moral reality. That is, the realist need never grant the debunker’s strong claims to the effect that our moral beliefs across the board are saturated with evolutionary influence (see section 2). Perhaps some are and some aren’t, and the proportions will depend on the extent to which we’ve successfully exercised autonomous reflection in arriving at our moral beliefs, which is a wide open question. If there are enough autonomous beliefs in the mix, and we can identify them, then the rest of the argument will not go through (FitzPatrick 2014a,b; 2016, 2017a,b).[12]

The debunking argument would be strengthened if we had good reason to be skeptical about autonomous moral reflection. In this vein, Street claims that whatever moral reflection and reasoning we engage in is limited merely to assessing “thoroughly contaminated” evaluative beliefs using “tools of rational reflection [that are] equally contaminated” (Street 2006: 124). The problem, however, is that this claim is based upon the very premise in question: the tools of reflection are allegedly thoroughly contaminated because of the “tremendous” evolutionary influence on the content of “our” moral judgments across the board; yet our question is why we should believe the latter in the first place. Until we are given independent reason to discount the power of moral reflection so radically, treating it as nothing more than using some rotten apples to judge other rotten apples, we seem to have little reason to dismiss the possibility of autonomous moral reflection, and therefore little reason to accept the initial claim of pervasive “saturation” of our moral beliefs with evolutionary influence.

Street actually casts her argument in terms of a “Darwinian dilemma” for realists, which centers around the following question: what is the relation between the evolutionary shaping of moral judgments and the independent moral truths posited by realists? (Street 2006, 109). As already noted, the best scientific accounts suggest that there would be no special relation here, even if such moral truths existed. But if there is no special relation between this evolutionary shaping and independent moral truths, then we would have no reason to trust our moral beliefs, which are as likely to be off-track as on-track, leading to moral skepticism. So the realist seems to face a dilemma: reject the best available science or lose all justification for our moral beliefs.

As brought out above, one way out of the dilemma for a realist is simply to deny that the evolutionary influence on the content of our moral beliefs is as pervasive as Street claims. The realist can grant that where such influence does exist we cannot assume that it would have pushed our beliefs toward moral truth: it may accidentally have done so in some cases (e.g., influencing us to think we have obligations to care for our children) and it might have been distorting in others (e.g., influencing us to downplay obligations to those who do not belong to our in-group). But this is not a problem if we also have a culturally developed capacity for autonomous moral reflection and reasoning that allows us to attain moral knowledge despite the presence of some unreliable influences. Realists will claim that we don’t need natural selection to have given us moral beliefs that track moral truths, any more than we need this in science or philosophy: all we need is for natural selection to have given us faculties that we can develop, train and use in ways that reliably track moral truths, and enough freedom from evolutionarily given instincts that we can so exercise those faculties.

Finally, Street challenges the realist to specify what faculty or capacity might ground our capacity to arrive at independent moral truths, how the former evolved, and how the latter could plausibly have arisen as a byproduct of it. She claims that there is no plausible story to be told here, since the capacity to grasp independent moral truths would have to be “a highly specialized, sophisticated capacity” akin to the human eye, and no such entity could plausibly emerge “as the purely incidental byproduct of some unrelated capacity that was selected for on other grounds entirely” (Street 2006, 142–43). But the realist’s story needn’t take that form. The claim will be just that our capacity to grasp moral truths—like our capacity to grasp philosophical truths about metaphysical necessity, say—is simply a byproduct of our general capacities for critical reasoning, combined with the evolved capacity for forming and employing normative concepts in our thinking and decision-making.

A related but somewhat different debunking argument focuses on the origins of moral concepts (Joyce 2006, chap. 6). It begins with the claim that we have a complete non-moral genealogy of our moral beliefs—a complete explanation of how we’ve come to believe what we do, which does not require any appeal to moral truths. Instead, we explain the origins of our moral concepts—such as fairness, justice, and guilt—in evolutionary terms, recalling that natural selection would have rewarded genetic propagation, not the tracking of moral truths, in shaping them; and then we explain our beliefs employing those moral concepts in familiar sociological and psychological terms. The claim is then that the existence of such a non-moral geneaology of moral beliefs makes the notion of moral truths “explanatorily superfluous”—just as truths about witches are explanatorily superfluous given a complete genealogy of beliefs about witches that does not involve any appeal to truths about witches. And if moral truths are explanatorily superfluous, then we should not posit them, any more than we posit truths about witches: we should remain agnostic about moral truth and give up any claims to moral knowledge. In other words, evolutionary biology leads to moral skepticism.

The critical questions about this argument parallel those raised about the previous one. Even if it is granted that crude versions of our concepts of fairness or guilt originated through evolutionary processes in our hominin ancestors, independently of any connection to moral truths, it remains possible that through cultural evolution we have developed refined conceptions of fairness or guilt that can be employed in epistemically respectable ways (FitzPatrick 2014a). Regardless of how and why the concept of fairness originated, why should we doubt that we can today use a refined conception of fairness to state moral truths, such as the truth that race-based voting laws are unfair and wrong? If there are grounds of skepticism about this they would have to lie in reasons to doubt the soundness of our first-order moral arguments about fairness, rather than in claims about how and why a crude version of the concept first arose (Nagel 1997).

Absent such doubts, it’s not clear why the mere fact of historical evolutionary influence should undermine our confidence in our moral claims. To draw an analogy, should a theist give up her belief just because crude, ancestral forms of religious belief can be causally explained without appeal to theological facts? Perhaps she will if she finds no good reasons for her own belief, and concludes that it is to be explained along similar lines. But if she has reflected on the matter and been persuaded by a “cosmological argument from fine tuning,” for example, then it seems she might reasonably maintain her belief, taking her employment of the concept of a deity to be epistemically legitimate despite the fact that other employments are subject to debunking evolutionary, sociological and psychological explanations.

In general, the worry about Joyce’s debunking argument is similar to the worry about Street’s: unless we start out already assuming (against the realist) that there are no knowable moral truths, it is hard to see why we should accept Joyce’s premise that we possess a complete non-moral geneaology of moral judgment, and hence that it is explanatorily superfluous to posit moral truths. Whether or not the non-moral geneaology is complete is precisely what is in question in ongoing metaethical debates: realists, who posit knowable moral truths, can reasonably hold that the correct explanation for at least many of our moral beliefs does appeal to moral truths or facts that we have grasped, while anti-realists, who deny the existence of such truths, claim that the correct explanation for all of our moral beliefs involves no such appeal. The issue remains controversial. So unless one has independently settled that issue against realism, one is unlikely to accept the premise that there is a complete non-moral genealogy of our moral beliefs: there may well be a partial non-moral genealogy, for the sorts of reasons Joyce gives, but it will be complete only if none of our moral beliefs are the result of our having grasped moral truths; and this negative claim will be very unlikely if there are in fact knowable moral truths (since we would plausibly have grasped some of them, and they would thus figure into the explanation of some of our moral beliefs). We should therefore feel compelled to grant Joyce’s premise that there is such a complete non-moral genealogy only if we have already given up on the idea of knowable moral truths. But that makes it hard to see how the argument as a whole can be used to persuade anyone who doesn’t already accept its conclusion.

It is worth noting that the appeal to evolution to support general skeptical worries about ethics is not in fact new: it goes all the back to Darwin himself. Consider the following provocative, fanciful reflection (later echoed closely by E.O. Wilson 1978, 204–206), which at least suggests a skeptical argument closely related to the debunking arguments examined above:

It may be well first to premise that I do not wish to maintain that any strictly social animal, if its intellectual faculties were to become as active and as highly developed as in man, would acquire exactly the same moral sense as ours. In the same manner as various animals have some sense of beauty, though they admire widely different objects, so they might have a sense of right and wrong, though led by it to follow widely different lines of conduct. If, for instance, to take an extreme case, men were reared under precisely the same conditions as hive-bees, there can hardly be a doubt that our unmarried females would, like the worker-bees, think it a sacred duty to kill their brothers, and mothers would strive to kill their fertile daughters; and no one would think of interfering. Nevertheless the bee, or any other social animal, would in our supposed case gain, as it appears to me, some feeling of right and wrong, or a conscience (Darwin 1871, 73).

The argument at least suggested by this passage is that our moral sense, which generates our moral beliefs, has the shape and content it has because of the contingencies of human ecology; had creatures with a very different ecology, such as bees, come to be rational, they would thus have developed a very different moral sense suitable to their ecology. But then which of these very different moral senses could be expected reliably to track moral truths (if they exist)? The answer seems to be: neither (unless we simply relativize moral truths to various possible ecologies, taking such truths to reduce to facts about effective genetic propagation—though as we saw in section 3, such a move has little moral plausibility). For moral senses are contingent products of particular ecologies in a way that cannot be expected to track independent and stable moral truths. We and the hypothetical rational bees will thus have very different moral outlooks, each of which is explicable in terms of our respective ecologies and will seem quite natural to those who occupy the relevant ecology (while the other’s outlook will seem bizarre), but neither of which seems to have any claim to be a reliable guide to moral truth (as usually conceived). This imaginary exercise in perspective thus seems to support moral skepticism: the very idea of independent, stable moral truths will seem suspect (playing no role in the explanation of the origins of various possible moral senses), and our confidence that our moral sense would track them in any case will seem unwarranted.

What such an argument overlooks, however, is precisely the factor of autonomous moral reflection that the bees’ imagined rationality would bring with it (see sections 2.4–2.5, and McDowell 1995). True, we might expect relatively unreflective and tradition-bound bees to speak of “sacred duties” to kill brothers or fertile daughters, in a way that lines up with the relevant genetic relations that figured into the evolution of their given moral senses. But we could equally expect more reflective bees (the buzzing philosophers among them) to raise the question whether they really had good reason to do everything that their evolution has disposed them to do in the service of maximizing their genetic propagation. These more philosophical bees might consider the possibility that some potential goods of bee life, in the context of ongoing innovations in rational bee culture, might be available to them if they resisted certain impulses and acted differently; and this might lead to the development of at least partly autonomous moral norms, and hence moral senses that are a complex mixture of inherited dispositions and rational judgment.

If bees became rational, then, there is no reason to suppose that their moral sensibilities would simply reflect their ecology any more than human moral sensibilities simply reflect human ecology: to the extent that they are really rational, we should expect some autonomous reflection, and perhaps even significant overlap with autonomous human moral reflection, as we both strive for something beyond the merely biologically useful (FitzPatrick 2000, 355–56, and 2017b). This is not to suggest, of course, that moral truths or objective moral norms, if they exist, will be exactly the same for human life and for rational bee life, or for actual human life and human life imagined under vastly different ecological circumstances. On any plausible view of morality, there will be significant variation in moral principles and/or their applications where there is significant variation in the basic facts of life. Just as we could never live just like bees, bees could never live just like humans, and no reasonable morality would demand such a thing. Even a realist, then, will grant a significant degree of cross-species moral relativism (or counterfactual moral relativism for deeply different courses of human evolution). But it needn’t be the extreme and implausible relativism linking true moral standards simply and directly to ecology, and whatever moral truths might obtain for each species might well be accessible to members of each species through autonomous moral reflection, with at least some points of convergence.

4.2 Selective Evolutionary Debunking Arguments

Before leaving the topic of evolutionary debunking arguments, it should be noted that in addition to the general arguments considered above, which are aimed at debunking morality (or in Street’s case, debunking a realist construal of morality) as a whole, there are also evolutionary debunking arguments meant instead just to target a selected range of moral beliefs as epistemically suspect. Such selective debunking arguments may be deployed by moral realists who reject general debunking arguments in this domain but nonetheless wish to use similar tactics to discredit certain kinds of moral belief as part of advancing their own normative ethical project. They might argue, for example, that while the deontological beliefs held by their opponents can be successfully debunked by appeal to evolutionary considerations, their own utilitarian ethical beliefs are immune from such debunking, stemming from autonomous rational reflection rather than from evolved psychological modules shaped by the distorting influences of natural selection.

This is the strategy adopted by Katarzyna de Lazari-Radek and Peter Singer (2014) in an effort to support Sidgwick’s principle of Universal Benevolence, i.e., impartial utilitarianism. That principle is inconsistent not only with moral egoism but with any moral stance that incorporates limited forms of partiality (such as special duties to family and friends even when not utility-maximizing, or constraints against taking certain means when promoting utility, or moral permissions to favor oneself or loved ones to some degree over strangers). So in order to discredit such competing moral views, they claim that one can tell debunking evolutionary stories to ‘explain away’ these non-utilitarian moral beliefs as unreliable products of distorting evolutionary influences: people believe such things only because natural selection shaped human moral psychology in the direction of selfishness and at best parochial altruism, for Darwinian reasons having nothing to do with moral truth. Then, in effect, they treat the possibility of telling such debunking evolutionary stories as sufficient to undermine epistemic justification for the targeted moral beliefs. At the same time, however, they maintain that their own favored ethical beliefs, involving strict impartiality, are invulnerable to any similar treatment, so that we can remain confident in the rationality of utilitarian morality.

There are reasons to doubt whether this sort of theoretically ambitious but selective evolutionary debunking strategy is a viable or stable one (Kahane 2011 and 2014, Rini 2016, FitzPatrick 2017a). A natural worry is that if such debunking arguments really worked against opponents of utilitarianism in the manner suggested, then similar arguments could equally be deployed against utilitarianism if we play by the same rules. The selective debunking arguments used by de Lazari-Radek and Singer give a great deal of negative epistemic weight to the mere existence of possible debunking explanations which, if true, would clearly pose a problem for the targeted beliefs (even though it remains a wide open question whether such explanatory stories are in fact true). That is, they give great weight to the mere ability to tell a plausible debunking story according to which non-utilitarian moral beliefs would turn out to be problematically rooted in ‘contaminated starting points’ (psychological dispositions resulting from morally blind evolutionary forces) that have merely been refined over time by culturally conditioned causal influences operating equally blindly to moral truths. This raises problems for them, however, because one can easiliy enough come up with similar debunking stories about utilitarian beliefs, according to which they would equally turn out to be problematically shaped by morally-blind evolutionary forces that contaminated the starting points.

Here is just one way such a story could go (FitzPatrick 2017a). Recall the possibility discussed in sub-sections 2.2 and 2.3, that in early ancestral environments involving mostly small in-group interactions, where there were relatively few opportunities for ‘wasting’ altruistic tendencies on outsiders, natural selection gave rise to some fairly indiscriminate dispositions involving sympathy and altruism. (Or again, recall the adaptive plasticity model from Buchanan and Powell 2018, discussed in section 3.4, which posits environmentally sensitive inclusivist tendencies as part of evolved human psychology.) As long as such indiscriminate altruism contributed more to fitness in that environment than it detracted from it through occasional ‘misfirings’ of such sentiments and behaviors directed at non-cooperators, it could very well have evolved as a simple fitness-enhancing mechanism (Kitcher 2006b). Someone who wishes to debunk impartial utilitarianism might then tell a story according to which the utilitarian’s impartial sympathy and concern is nothing but an extension of this evolved psychological trait, whereby it is systematically ‘misfiring’ (from a biological point of view) in our current environment. More precisely, the story would be that current utilitarian beliefs represent a cultural refinement of such evolved tendencies via an application of reasoning, such as the consistency reasoning utilitarians employ in arguing for an “expanding circle” of moral concern and an increasingly impartial altruism. The debunker will claim that however rational such inferential steps may be in themselves, they are still just operating on certain moral starting points that are ‘contaminated’ by evolutionary influence: namely, deeply ingrained moral intuitions about the intrinsic badness of suffering wherever it occurs, or the goodness of pleasure, which trace back to evolved psychological dispositions to recoil at suffering and injury, and to feel sympathy for others. Basic utilitarian moral intuitions, no less than non-utilitarian intuitions, may ultimately be nothing but illusions foisted on us by our evolutionary history, rooted in contaminated starting points (Ruse 2006). In both cases, proponents of the moral views in question have moved well beyond the original evolved dispositions, through culturally-developed reasoning that has refined them in various ways. But if this doesn’t save non-utilitarian moral beliefs given the debunking story about the contaminated starting points, then it won’t save utilitarian moral beliefs either.

Now de Lazari-Radek and Singer might reasonably wish to counter such debunking attacks by claiming that even if there are such evolutionary influences at the root of their intuitions about the badness of suffering or the propriety of impartial altruism, the reflection and reasoning that has taken place over centuries of sophisticated moral inquiry has not merely provided for more consistent applications of evolutionarily contaminated dispositions: it has instead amounted to the intellectual discovery of good reasons to believe the contents of utilitarian moral claims to be true. This philosophical possibility certainly remains on the table and hasn’t been shown not to obtain simply because an aspiring debunker can tell a debunking story according to which it doesn’t. And such a reply would indeed be a plausible response to the debunker, making precisely the point emphasized earlier in section 4.1, in responding to general debunking arguments. The problem, however, is that if they are entitled to make this response to the debunker on behalf of utilitarian moral beliefs, then so are their opponents on behalf of non-utilitarian moral beliefs: what’s good for the utilitarian goose is good for the non-utilitarian gander.

In other words, to escape evolutionary debunking themselves, it seems that de Lazari-Radek and Singer will have to allow that the mere existence of a possible evolutionary debunking explanation for a set of moral beliefs does not undermine epistemic justification for them. It matters whether or not that story is actually the correct explanatory story, including its claim that the beliefs in question are exhaustively accounted for simply in terms of the morally-blind, extraneous causes in question, rather than partly through rational grasp of good reasons for believing their contents to be true; and merely being able to tell a debunking story does not establish such a strong claim. Once this is recognized, however, the same principle applies to just the sorts of debunking arguments they have deployed against non-utilitarians, who can thus avoid them in the same way.

One or more of the debunking stories could, of course, still turn out to be true, and they do need to be taken seriously as possibilities. The critical points raised here are just, first, that it is unclear whether debunking arguments really have compelling force against those who haven’t already independently rejected the positions being targeted (showing them that their beliefs are really bunk); and second, that it may be hazardous for those who reject general evolutionary debunking arguments in ethics to attempt to use similar arguments selectively against competing normative ethical views. Such potential explanations could, however, still play a supporting role within a broader set of moral arguments, contributing a possible theory of error helping to explain why some people may believe certain moral claims or theories even though they are false.

4.3 Evolutionary Biology and Expressivism

A less ambitious claim made by some antirealists is that the account in section 2.3 of the origins of our capacity for normative guidance at least lends support to or fits naturally with an expressivist metaethical view—the view that moral judgments do not even purport to state moral facts, but instead express non-cognitive states such as attitudes or acceptance of certain norms, etc. (Gibbard 1990; Kitcher 2006a). Suppose the human capacity for normative guidance is indeed an adaptation that evolved in connection with social coordination, cooperation and stability. This capacity involves being in the state of accepting a norm, which we should thus expect to be a standard part of human moral psychology and its capacity for “linguistically infused motivation” (Gibbard 1990, 55). This may lend support to a norm-expressivist approach to normative judgment, insofar as such an approach focuses precisely on the notion of accepting a norm, and the evolutionary story provides good reason to suppose that accepting a norm is a “natural, biological phenomenon” (61).

It is less clear, however, whether anything stronger than this can be said. Suppose it’s true that we evolved a capacity and tendency for normative guidance because of the coordinating social function achieved by the expression of norm acceptance. Not only does this leave open what we now use that capacity to do, but it even leaves open what exactly our ancestors did with it. One possibility is that the activity they were engaged with was non-cognitive: they were merely expressing non-cognitive states comprising attitudes and states of norm acceptance. Kitcher (2006a) suggests that this is the metaethical picture best supported by the evolutionary story. But Joyce (2006, 175–76) has disputed this. Even granting that the biological function of moral judgment is social coordination, the linguistic function of moral judgments could go either way: it may be that the biological function was carried out through non-cognitive expressions of norm acceptance, but it may equally instead be that it was carried out through cognitive judgments involving claims to objective validity. Indeed, the social function might be all the better served if those making moral judgments firmly believe in objective values and assert those beliefs, even if they are in fact making a projective error in doing so, as error theorists claim. Compare: even if religious belief has a biological function (e.g., reducing anxiety), it wouldn’t follow that religious assertions are non-cognitive and so aren’t really assertions, and the story might be more plausible if it is assumed that they are genuine assertions (Joyce 2006, 176, 208; Ruse 2006).

Thus, although the evolutionary story fits naturally with a merely non-cognitivist metaethical view, it may fit equally well with a cognitivist view. If one rejects the existence of moral truths, the latter would then lead to an error theory (Mackie 1977). But as discussed in section 4.1, it is far from clear how much support evolutionary biology itself lends to moral anti-realism or irrealism. It is consistent with plausible evolutionary stories that although our capacities for normative guidance originally evolved for reasons that had nothing to do with moral truths as such, we now regularly employ them to deliberate about and to communicate moral truths. So all three metaethical views discussed here—expressivism, error theory and moral realism—remain on the table.


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