Notes to Neutral Monism

1. Landini focuses on (3). But his insight is more general: criteria like (2) and (3) and (4) make neutral monism compatible with materialistic (or idealistic) monism, as traditionally understood. So long as the basic entities, no matter what their intrinsic nature may be, satisfy the criteria specified in (2), (3), or (4) they are, according to these criteria, neutral. This explains how Landini can argue that Russell is a neutral monist and a physicalist.

2. Though he never presented it as a version of neutral monism, Galen Strawson has explored the idea underlying the Both View at considerable depth (see Strawson 1994: 46–7, 55–9, 72–5; Strawson 2006: 187–8, 238ff; Strawson 2016.).

3. Russell’s treatment of images in his early neutral monist works (1919, 1921) has lead a number of commentators to classify Russell as a dualist of sorts. Russell himself acknowledges that “we seem to find a certain dualism, perhaps not ultimate…as to the causal laws” (Russell 1921: 137) that govern sensations and images respectively. The great difficulty of finding a coherent interpretation of these texts is due, in part, to Russell’s reliance on two different criteria of neutrality: the Neither View and the Law View. It is doubtful that one can have it both ways. But note that Russell never never suggests that images are mental, in the sense of being directed at an object.

4. Note the epistemic risk incurred by admitting inferred entities into the realm of the known. As this risk increases, the epistemic yield of following the method of logical construction diminishes.

5. The reasons for the first inferential step are sated in (Russell 1927a: 278–282). For an extended presentation of the inferences involved in the last two steps, see (Russell 1927a: ch. 20). For Russell’s final thoughts about what we must assume about the world in order to infer the existence of events other than our own sensations, images, and percepts, see (Russell 1948: Part VI).

6. Russell’s views on the epistemic accessibility of our sensations are difficult to pin down exactly. Sensations are the “theoretical core” (Russell 1921: 132) or our percepts. As such they remain “more or less hypothetical” (Russell 1927b: 212). Some of his examples suggests that we can attend to them; others suggest that we cannot get pure sensation before our minds.

7. Russell’s two theses that all fundamental entities are events and that all fundamental entities are neutral entities are distinct, but they combine naturally in Russell’s neutral monism.

8. Here we see C.B. Martin’s “surprising identity” between dispositionality and qualitativity (Martin 2008: 64) being used to further the case of neutral monism. Although John Heil (see below) is a leading advocate of the surprising identity view, his case for neutral monism does not turn on this idea.

9. For the record: Heil does not defend this identity claim as stated in the example. He defends the weaker claim that every token occurrence of pain can be described in a physical vocabulary.

10. The fact that Nagel allows that the neutral properties might give rise to mental or protomental properties, the view ends up being even more complex than presented here.

11. This is a version of the thesis of structuralism about physics. Russell is a prominent defender of this view, hence the name “Russellian monism.” His remark that “the aim of physics, consciously or unconsciously, has always been to discover what we may call the causal skeleton of the world” (1927a: 391; cf. Russell 1931: 132–3) vividly captures the structuralist idea. The best source for current work on Russellian monism is (Alter and Nagasawa 2015).

12. None of the other neutral monists took the suggestion that sensations/percepts might occur in the brain seriously. James mentions the possibility in a footnote, only to dismiss it as “not seriously defensible” (James 1904a: 79). Mach warns against the “absurdity that can be committed by thinking sensations spatially into the brain” (Mach 1886: 27). Petzoldt rails against the “barbaric quid pro quo that lets the psychological sensation get into the brain together with the physiological stimulation” (Petzoldt 1906: 170). And a good deal of Avenarius’s thought is directed against the fallacy of introjection—the fallacy of locating thought (broadly conceived) in the brain.

13. One of Russell’s early criticisms of neutral monism was based on a similar idea:

I cannot think that the difference between my seeing the patch of red, and the patch of red being there unseen, consists in the presence or absence of relations between the patch of red and other objects of the same kind…. (1914b: 148)

But as his doubts about the existence of the self and of the acquaintance relation grew, what had seemed unthinkable gradually came to seem plausible.

Notes to the Supplement

S1. This version of functionalism is known as realizer (or filler, or occupant) functionalism. The most prominent exponents of this reductive method are the materialists David Armstrong (1968) and David Lewis (1966 and 1994), who employed it to reduce mental states to physical states.

S2. For an extended treatment of traditional neutral monism that puts the concept of function front and center, see Banks 2014.

S3. Chalmers suggests that Russell’s structuralism about physics (see section 5.5) can be viewed in functionalist terms: “We might say that physics tells us what the mass role is, but it does not tell us what property plays this role” (Chalmers 2015: 254).

Copyright © 2016 by
Leopold Stubenberg <Leopold.Stubenberg.1@nd.edu>

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