Neutral Monism

First published Thu Feb 3, 2005; substantive revision Mon Oct 3, 2016

Neutral monism is a monistic metaphysics. It holds that ultimate reality is all of one kind. To this extent neutral monism is in agreement with the more familiar versions of monism: idealism and materialism. What distinguishes neutral monism from its monistic rivals is the claim that the intrinsic nature of ultimate reality is neither mental nor physical. This negative claim also captures the idea of neutrality: being intrinsically neither mental nor physical in nature ultimate reality is said to be neutral between the two.

Neutral monism is compatible with the existence of many neutral entities. And neutral monism is compatible with the existence of non-neutral entities—mental and material entities, for example—assuming that these non-neutral entities are, in some sense, derivative of the ultimate neutral entities. Most versions of neutral monism have been pluralist in both these respects. They were conceived as solutions to the mind-body problem. The goal was to close the apparent chasm between mental and physical entities by exhibiting both as consisting of groups of the more basic neutral entities.

Any version of neutral monism will therefore have the answer the following three questions:

  1. What are the neutral entities and what is their nature?
  2. What is the relationship of these neutral entities to matter?
  3. What is the relationship of these neutral entities to mind?

1. Neutrality

Both of the terms that make up the label “neutral monism” are problematical. Because the questions to which the notion of neutrality gives rise are unique to neutral monism, they need to be addressed first. Most versions of neutral monism assume a plurality of basic, neutral entities (these could be substances, events, tropes, universals, etc., depending on the specific version of neutral monism in question). What does it mean for an entity to be neutral? Here are five proposals:

  1. The Neither View: A basic entity is neutral just in case it is intrinsically neither mental nor physical.
  2. The Actual Constituent View: A basic entity is neutral just in case it is a constituent of both physical and mental non-basic entities.
  3. The Possible Constituent View: A basic entity is neutral just in case it can be a constituent of both physical and mental non-basic entities.
  4. The Law View: A basic entity is neutral just in case both mental laws and physical laws are applicable to it.
  5. The Both View: A basic entity is neutral just in case it is intrinsically both mental and physical.

(1)–(5) are not always clearly distinguished; but even when they are, two or more of these criteria may be used concurrently. This invites confusion on the part of the neutral monists, as well as their critics.

Questions arise about the relationships between (1)–(5). (1) and (5) are similar in letting the question of an entity’s neutrality be settled by its intrinsic nature. (2)–(4) answer this question by looking at the relationships of a given entity to other things: to the nature of larger groups of entities of which the given entity is/can be a member: are these groups mental or physical? Or by looking to the kinds of laws that govern the entity in question: are the laws mental or physical? If one is inclined to think that neutrality is a matter of intrinsic nature alone, (2)–(4) will seem misguided. (2)–(4) still might have a place as epistemic criteria—as ways of finding out whether a given entity is neutral. The friends of (1) and (5) can agree that a given entity’s ability to actually or possibly belong to a certain group, or to be governed by certain laws, is due solely to its intrinsic nature. Their disagreement concerns only the question whether this ability is conferred on that entity by its being both mental and physical or neither mental or nor physical. In either case (2)–(4) can only be used to discover which things are the neutral entities.

The traditional versions of neutral monism—those developed by Ernst Mach, William James, and Bertrand Russell (see section 4 below)—accept (1) and reject (2). But some critics of neutral monism, notably Bostock (2012: 190, 195–6), interpret neutral monism as committed to (2). Based on this interpretation of neutrality, Bostock arrives at the striking conclusion that “Russell’s version of neutral monism was never properly ‘neutral’ or ‘monistic’” (Bostock 2012: 190).

It can be argued that none of the traditional neutral monists accept (3). All of them would agree that neutral entities can be a constituent of both physical and mental non-basic entities. But it is doubtful whether any of them would agree that the fact that a basic entity can be a constituent of both physical and mental non-basic entities is sufficient to make it neutral. For it is conceivable that a basic entity that fails to be neutral (according to (1), the Neither View) should figure in the construction of both physical and mental non-basic entities.

Gregory Landini’s influential discussion of Russell’s neutral monism (Landini 2011: ch. 6) illustrates the importance of the distinction between criteria (1) and (3). Landini assumes that (3) captures Russell’s idea of neutrality. This allows Landini to conclude that Russell is a physicalist and a neutral monist (see Landini, 280, 291, 297). According to Landini, Russell is a neutral monist because every basic entity can be a constituent of both physical and mental non-basic entities; and Russell is a physicalist because all basic entities of his system are physical.[1]

(4) is present in the thought of Mach and James. But it plays a prominent part in Russell’s thought. His use of (1) in conjunction with (4), especially in Russell 1921, is confusing, and it has led a number of his critics (Stace 1946; Bostock 2012) to argue that (at least his early) neutral monism is best understood as a form of dualism.

The traditional neutral monists reject (5), but many of their formulations suggest otherwise. It is easy to find passages saying that a given neutral entity is physical and mental. A sympathetic reading of these passages suggests that they are best understood as an abbreviated way of saying that this neutral entity is a member of two groups of neutral entities, one of which counts as physical, the other of which counts as mental. The terms “physical” and “mental” apply to groups of neutral entities, not to individual neutral entities, as Russell points out when speaking about the mental:

“mental” is a character, like “harmonious” or “discordant”, that cannot belong to a single entity in its own right, but only to a system of entities. (Russell 1927b: 209)

But a number of contemporary discussions of neutral monism employ the Both View.

(1)–(5) use the concepts of the mental and the physical (or of corresponding laws) to specify the notion of neutrality. Since the mind/matter distinction can be drawn in different ways, the notion of the neutral will vary accordingly. And if the mental and the physical are defined as complements of each other, thereby ruling out the possibility of entities that are neither mental nor physical, then there cannot be any neutral entities (at least in the neither sense of the term).

Another feature shared by (1)–(5) is that they all fail to meet a condition—discussed by C.D. Broad in his 1925—that an attribute must meet if it is to carve out a class of entities. If neutrality is to be a kind-forming attribute, it “must be a simple attribute, i.e., it must not be analysable into a conjunction or disjunction of other attributes” (Broad 1925: 23). If one accepts this kind of homogeneity constraint on neutral entities, all five criteria of neutrality proposed above fail to pick out a set of entities that are sufficiently simple or homogeneous to form a kind.

A related worry is that (1)–(4) don’t say anything about the nature of neutral entities. (1) says only what they are not; (2)–(4) specify certain roles that neutral entities can play, without telling us anything about the nature of the role occupants. (5) may fare better in this regard; but it raises problems of its own (see below). Some versions of neutral monism embrace this agnosticism about the nature of the neutral base. David Chalmers has outlined the idea of Russellian neutral monism (see section 5.5 below) with “fundamental protophenomenal properties serving as the grounds for both physical and phenomenal properties” (Chalmers 2015: 264). Nothing is known about the protophenomenal other than its ability to ground the two kinds of properties we are familiar with.

Many neutral monists have been more forthcoming, offering examples of neutral entities with which we are familiar. The three traditional neutral monists—Ernst Mach, William James, and Bertrand Russell—all pointed to experience, when attempting to provide examples of neutral entities. Mach speaks of sensations, James of pure experience, and Russell of sensations and percepts. Predictably, this fueled the suspicion that neutral monism is nothing but rebranded phenomenalism. Others have sought the neutral base in the realm of the abstract. Kenneth Sayre, for example, turns to the mathematical theory of information and suggests that the neutral base is to be understood as the “ontology of informational states” (Sayre 1976: 16) that this theory presupposes.

Most traditional versions of neutral monism were based on (1), the idea that the neutral is neither mental nor material. But occasionally the understanding of neutrality is informed by criterion (5): the neutral is that which is both mental and material. This view has been attributed to Thomas Nagel (Godfrey-Smith 2013: 1–2; Skrbina 2005: 237; but see also section 5.4). That which is both mental and material is biased towards neither and hence neutral between them. In this way the both-interpretation captures an intuitive notion of neutrality. Moreover, (5) may tell us much more about the nature of the neutral entities than (1)–(4) do—just how much we learn about the nature of the neutral will depend on how the relevant concepts of the mental and the physical are fleshed out.[2]

The appeal of the Both Interpretation of the idea of neutrality is undeniable. But it invites the conflation of neutral monism with other theories from which is should be distinguished. First, there is the family of theories that attribute fundamental and irreducible mental and fundamental and irreducible material properties, or aspects, or sides to every basic entity (see section 8.3). The Both Interpretation of neutral monism turns it into a version of the dual-aspect theory—a theory that is often viewed as a form of dualism. Second, the Both Interpretation of neutrality makes it difficult to distinguish neutral monism from the identity theory. According to the identity theory “being a pain” and “being a c-fiber stimulation” pick out the very same property (not two distinct and irreducible properties, aspects, etc.). A natural way to state this idea is to say that a given property or state is both mental and physical. And this then invites confusion with neutral monism, stated in terms of (5)—the Both Interpretation. The Neither Interpretation of neutrality allows us to understand neutral monism as a distinct type of theory. Because of its ability to distinguish views that are run together on the Both Interpretation, the Neither Interpretation is preferable.

2. Monism

There is, then, considerable disagreement about how to interpret the notion of neutrality. The notion of monism raises its own problems. But since these are questions faced by all forms of monism, they are, perhaps, not quite as pressing as the problems surrounding neutrality. Much like one can distinguish different versions of neutral monism on the basis of the notion of neutrality that they employ, it is possible to distinguish different versions of the doctrine, based on the various ways in which the notion of monism is understood (see Schaffer 2016). Neutral monism might, for example, be interpreted as a form of existence monism—the view that only a single concrete thing exists; but it might also interpreted as a monism about the kinds of things there are—the view that concrete things, be they simple or complex, are of the same neutral kind. The evidence suggests that all past and present versions of neutral monism have been pluralist on both these counts: they work with a plurality of entities, most particularly, with a plurality of basic neutral entities; and, given their focus on the mind-body problem, they recognize at least mental and physical kinds of entities in addition to the neutral entities. All entities belonging to such non-neutral kinds must, however, count as derivative. In the final analysis, all entities must be basic neutral entities or complexes of basic neutral entities.

The talk about basic entities indicates another pluralist dimension: the known versions of neutral monism work with a layered picture of reality. Basic neutral entities form the bottom level of the hierarchy; the non-basic, non-neutral entities at the higher levels reduce to, or are in some sense derivative from, those lower level neutral entities. So we are dealing with an ontology that recognizes a plurality of levels or layers in reality.

And even within the level of the basic neutral entities we can distinguish those versions of neutral monism that hold that all basic entities belong to a single category, from those that distinguish two or more categories of neutral entities. Russell’s later version of neutral monism seems to be monistic (in this particular sense): all neutral entities are events. But it is easy to envision a neutral monism that countenances neutral substances and neutral properties among the basic neutral entities.

3. The Relationship between Neutral and Non-Neutral Entities

Most extant versions of neutral monism seem to acknowledge that, in addition to the basic neutral entities, there exist derivative, non-basic, and non-neutral entities—mental and physical entities, for example. This raises the question about the relationship between these two kinds of entities. Every answer to this question faces two challenges. On the one hand there is the threat of elimination of the non-basic entities (see section 7.1); on the other hand there is the threat that the non-basic, non-neutral entities turn into elements of ultimate reality, thereby putting an end to neutral monism.

The question of the relationship between basic and non-basic entities features prominently in Russell’s thought. The method of logical construction (see section 4.3.1) is his answer to this question. The two other traditional neutral monists—Mach and James—can arguably be characterized as reductionists (for an attempt to develop this claim a little further, see the supplement Reducing Mind and Matter to Neutral Entities). The contemporary discussion of this question is most vigorously addressed by various philosophers in the Russellian monist camp (see section 5.5). There is considerable agreement that the basic neutral entities are related to the non-basic, non-neutral entities by way of the grounding relation. But many questions remain about the precise nature of the relata of the relevant grounding relations (see section 5.5).

4. Traditional Versions of Neutral Monism

Baruch Spinoza (1632–77) and David Hume (1711–76) are often identified as the originators of neutral monism. The case for including Spinoza runs as follows:

Spinoza’s metaphysics of substance has been called neutral monism; it is a form of monism because it allows for only one substance, and it is neutral because he describes the one substance as both a body and a mind (Rosenkrantz and Hoffman 2011: 287)

To classify Spinoza as an existence monist may be permissible. But the neutrality claim is based on the problematical both view of view of neutrality. This suggests that it is best to classify Spinoza as a double aspect theorist (see section 8.3 below). Hume’s case is more difficult to assess. It has been said that the prevalent 20th century interpretation of Hume has been neutral monist (see Flage 1982: 527). H.H. Price’s case for this view has been particularly influential (see Price 1932: 105–6). On the other hand, the neutral monist interpretation of Hume has been vigorously resisted (Flage 1982; Backhaus 1991).

In light of these difficulties it is best to start the genealogy of neutral monism with the big three: Ernst Mach, William James, and Bertrand Russell. Of the three, only Russell uses the label “neutral monism”. But there is widespread agreement that Mach, James, and Russell the three most important philosophers in this tradition. A striking feature of traditional neutral monism—a reflection of the empiricist leanings of its protagonists—is the close tie between the neutral entities and experience. This connection has given rise to one of the most enduring criticisms of neutral monism (see section 7.2). It is therefore important to note that this salient feature of traditional neutral monism need be no part of it (see section 5.1).

4.1 Ernst Mach

Ernst Mach (1838–1916) occupies a central position in the history of neutral monism. He influenced William James and Bertrand Russell and, through them, all of the writers on neutral monism in the English speaking world. His importance for the development in the German speaking world is hard to overestimate. Among the philosophers to build on Mach’s ideas was Rudolf Carnap in his Aufbau (1928). As a physicist who also did physiological and psychological research, Mach strove to adopt an inclusive and economical framework that would allow him to pursue all of these inquiries in a unified and coherent fashion. In the simple components of experience—hot and cold, red and green, sweet and sour, etc.—he finds typical examples of a much larger group of elements whose functional interrelations are studied by the various sciences (see Banks 2014, ch. 1 on the resolute realism of Mach's view). While a given element is, intrinsically, neither mental nor physical, the various groups to which it belongs may display functional relationships that are characteristic of physics or of psychology. In this case the neutral element forms part of the subject matter of physics and of psychology. In the following quotation Mach uses a color and our perception of it to illustrate this point. A single neutral element—the color—gets to be both the physical color of a physical object and our mental perception/sensation of it. The color can be called physical, qua constituent of the one group, and mental (a sensation), qua constituent of the other group, but is the same unchanging and intrinsically neutral element that figures in these two different contexts:

Thus the great gulf between physical and psychological research persists only when we acquiesce in our habitual stereotyped conceptions. A color is a physical object as soon as we consider its dependence, for instance, upon its luminous source, upon other colors, upon temperatures, upon spaces, and so forth. When we consider, however, its dependence upon the retina…it is a psychological object, a sensation. Not the subject matter, but the direction of investigation, is different in the two domains. (Mach 1886: 17–18)

In this way material objects and the ego are dissolved into elements/sensations that are related in certain complex ways. Spelled out for material objects, this reads:

thing, body, matter, are nothing apart from the combinations of the elements,—the colors, sounds, and so forth—nothing apart from their so-called attributes. (Mach 1886: 7)

And the fate of the ego is similar:

The primary fact is not the ego, but the elements (sensations)…The elements constitute the I. I have the sensation green, signifies that the element green occurs in a given complex of other elements (sensations, memories). When I cease to have the sensation green, when I die, then the elements no longer occur in the ordinary, familiar association. That is all. Only and ideal mental-economical unity, not a real unity, has ceased to exist. (Mach 1886: 23–24)

For Mach the world presents itself as “a viscous mass [of elements], at certain places (as in the ego) more firmly coherent than in others” (Mach 1886: 17). The neutral elements (only a minute fraction of which are sensations) and their relations are the basic reality. We draw boundaries around certain groups of elements that are related to each other in interesting ways, because this serves our purposes—the purposes of science and of ordinary life. We can continue to talk about material things and selves; it is economical to do so. But, strictly speaking, “both [object and ego] are provisional fictions of the same kind” (Mach 1905: 9).

The primary source for Mach’s views on neutral monism are a number of essays and chapters contained in his books that were originally published in Mach 1886, 1894, and 1905. The size of these books grew significantly as they went through numerous editions. Some of the important papers on neutral monism are not contained in the available English translations of these works.

4.2 William James

William James’s (1842–1910) uses the term “radical empiricism” for the view he sets forth in James 1912—the view that has become the paradigm of neutral monism. His critique of the relational account of experience—according to which the self directs an act onto an object—was the model upon which Russell later shaped his analysis of experience. James presents this argument as an attack on a particular conception of consciousness. He finds it in the Neo-Kantian tradition and in the early analytic tradition. And today we can find it in philosophies as diverse as existentialism and philosophical naturalism. Roughly, it is the notion of consciousness as a diaphanous, transparent, elusive medium or container of some sort in which the objects of consciousness appear. The objects that are, in this sense, “in” consciousness simply present themselves to us. But the consciousness that makes this kind of object presentation possible eludes our grasp. This thin notion of consciousness is the one James wants to eliminate:

I believe that ‘consciousness,’ when once it has evaporated to this estate of pure diaphaneity, is on the point of disappearing altogether. It is the name of a nonentity, and has no right to a place among first principles. Those who still cling to it are clinging to a mere echo, the faint rumor left behind by the disappearing ‘soul’ upon the air of philosophy. (James 1904b: 2)

His radical proposal is to simply discard this shadowy something and to make do with what remains, with what used to be the object of the conscious act. He introduces the term “pure experience” to stand for this datum. Prior to any further categorization, pure experience is, according to James, neutral—neither mental nor physical:

The instant field of the present is at all times what I call the ‘pure’ experience. It is only virtually or potentially either object or subject as yet. For the time being, it is plain, unqualified actuality, or existence, a simple that. (James 1904b: 23)

Mind and matter, knower and known, thought and thing, representation and represented are then interpreted as resulting from different functional groupings of pure experience (see James 1905: 64).

In perceptual knowledge perceiver and perceived fuse or merge (James uses both terms): one bit of pure experience is the thing perceived as well as the perceiving of this thing. The difference lies only in how this single portion of pure experience is related to other parts of pure experience:

The paper seen and the seeing of it are only two names for one indivisible fact which, properly named, is the datum, the phenomenon, or the experience. The paper is in the mind and the mind is around the paper, because paper and mind are only two names that are given later to the one experience, when, taken in a larger world of which it forms a part, its connections are traced in different directions. To know immediately, then, or intuitively, is for mental content and object to be identical. (James 1895: 110)

Conceptual knowledge is more complex. In the simplest case of conceptual representation we are dealing with

two pieces of actual experience belonging to the same subject, with definite tracts of conjunctive transitional experience between them. (James 1904a: 53)

The first piece of pure experience is the thought—the thinking of it as well as the content that is thought—perhaps it is a thought about Harvard’s Memorial Hall, as in James’s famous example (see James 1904a: 55ff). And, in the simplest case, the second piece of pure experience is the thing—Memorial Hall—that was thought of, as well as the perception of Memorial Hall. The thought has led us to Memorial Hall and now we stand in front of it and see it. It is this function of leading (about the details of which James has much to say) that constitutes the thought’s intentionality, that constitutes the fact that the thought was a thought about a certain thing. Once the thought has lead one to the Hall,

the percept not only verifies the concept, proves its function of knowing that percept to be true, but the percept’s existence as the terminus of the chain of intermediaries creates the function. Whatever terminates that chain was, because it now proves itself to be, what the concept ‘had in mind’. (James 1904a: 60–1)

This is James’s way of reconstructing the idea of representation in a way that does not invoke suspect mental powers of intrinsic intentionality. He values this as a signal achievement of his radical empiricism:

The towering importance for human life of this kind of knowing lies in the fact that an experience that knows another can figure as its representative, not in any quasi-miraculous ‘epistemological’ sense, but in the definite practical sense of being its substitute in various operations, sometimes physical and sometimes mental, which lead us to its associates and results. (James 1904a: 61)

Not all conceptual experience results in knowledge. If the process of leading does not get started, or fails to arrive at an experience of termination, there is nothing that the first piece of experience gets to know. In that case the representation is empty or false.

The essays in which James sets out his radical empiricism are among the most influential and most readable documents of the neutral monistic literature. It is probably fair to say that James converted Russell to neutral monism. And his influence on the neutral monists among the American New Realists is massive. The primary source for James’s views on neutral monism are the essays collected in his 1912.

4.3 Bertrand Russell

Following a series of critical engagements with neutral monism (see especially Russell 1914a,b), Russell adopted it in Russell 1919 and remained a neutral monist for the rest of his long career: “I am conscious of no major change in my opinions since the adoption of neutral monism” is what he says in an interview from 1964 (Eames 1969: 108). But the question whether Russell’s neutral monism is best seen as a single theory or as a sequence of related but significantly different theories, as well as the question which, if any, of these different doctrines should count as versions of neutral monism, have been much debated (see Wishon 2015; Bostock 2012; Stace 1946). Russell’s 1919 and 1921 are generally considered to represent the early versions of his neutral monism. Russell’s 1927a and 1927b contain the mature doctrine. In his later works—Russell 1948 and 1956a—he no longer used the term “neutral monism”. But the doctrine seems largely unchanged.

4.3.1 Logical Constructionism and Neutral Monism

When Russell looks at neutral monism, he sees a theory that embodies the spirit of the “supreme maxim in scientific philosophising” (Russell 1914c: 155) in an especially striking way. This maxim is Occam’s Razor: entities are not to be multiplied without necessity. In one of Russell’s formulations it reads: “Wherever possible, substitute constructions out of known entities for inferences to unknown entities” (Russell 1924: 326). Known entities are those that we know directly or noninferentially; unknown entities are ones we accept only on the basis of inferences from known entities. Russell’s maxim encourages us to discover complex structures of known entities that can play the role the inferred entities were supposed to play. Upon substituting these complex structures—the constructions—for the inferred entities, everything continues to work as before. The point of this complicated procedure is epistemic: we are now no longer burdened with the risky inference to the inferred entity, and the risk of error is reduced. Russell remains agnostic as to the existence of the target entities of construction. They are neither identified with nor eliminated by the corresponding construction. And no claim about supervenience, emergence, constitution, or grounding is implied.

Neutral monism holds out the alluring promise that such constructions can be found for all of the inferred entities of physics, of psychology, and of common sense. All of these bodies of knowledge are preserved, but at a hugely reduced epistemic cost. These are the considerations that drive Russell to embrace neutral monism: it is a perfect fit with his longstanding commitment to the program of logical construction. An added benefit of substituting constructions of neutral entities for physical and mental entities is an elegant solution to the mind-body problem.

Logical construction is a process of discovery, not of manipulation: to logically construct xs out of ys is to discover that ys, when they manifest a certain type of structure, can play the role of xs. Russell’s constructions of a point in space, an instant in time, a table, and of a belief may illustrate the procedure. (i) A Russian doll is a good model of how Russell (following Whitehead) proposes to construct a point in space. The rough idea is to take “the class of all those objects which, as one would naturally say, contain the point” (Russell 1914a: 117) and to substitute this class of nested objects (the structure of ys) for points in space (the xs). (ii) Experienced instants in time (the xs) are constructed by discovering that the experiences of a person, each of which is extended in time, can overlap each other in ways that converge on an instant. It is

a group of events, all belonging to his experience, and having the following two properties: (1) any two of the events overlap; (2) no event outside the group overlaps with every member of the group. (Russell 1927b: 288)

(iii) Rather than viewing a table as the cause of our table sensations, Russell proposes (again just as a first approximation) to view the table as “the set of all those particulars which would naturally be called ‘aspects’ of the table from different points of view” (Russell 1921: 98). (iv) The logical construction that is to take the place of beliefs consists of the following three components:

(a) We have a proposition, consisting of interrelated images, and possibly partly of sensations; (b) we have the feeling of assent, which is presumably a complex sensation demanding analysis; (c) we have a relation, actually subsisting, between the assent and the proposition, such as is expressed by saying that the proposition in question is what is assented to. (Russell 1921: 251)

As these examples show, there is no single method of construction, no single type of structure, suitable for different projects of logical construction. The nature of the xs (the targets of construction) and of the ys (the construction materials) guide the search for structures that will work in the case at hand.

4.3.2 Known Neutral Entities

The initial stock of known entities with which Russell proposes to carry out this grand project of logical construction seems frightfully small and strikingly non-neutral. It consists of his sensations and images—these loom large in Russell 1919, 1921—and his perceptions (percepts)—these play a prominent role in Russell 1927a, 1927b, 1948. Everything else—electrons, apples, galaxies, and selves, etc.—is in need of logical construction.

For an entity to be neutral is to “have neither the hardness and indestructibility of matter, nor the reference to objects which is supposed to characterize the mind” (Russell 1921: 36; cf. 124). Russell never suspected sensations of being material (in this sense). That sensations are mental (in this sense)—that they consist of a mental act of sensing directed at a non-mental object—was, however, a pivotal part of his earlier view. But then his views changed:

I formerly believed that my own inspection showed me the distinction between a noise [the object] and my hearing of a noise [the act of sensing], and I am now convinced that it shows me no such thing, and never did. (Russell 1918b: 255)

All that Russell now finds upon introspecting a sensory episode is a single item “which may be called indifferently a noise or hearing a noise” (Russell 1918b: 255). Switching the example to colors, he writes that

the sensation we have when we see a patch of colour simply is that patch of colour…the patch of colour and our sensation in seeing it are identical. (Russell 1921: 142–3)

And since noises and patches of color are not intentional—they are not directed at anything, they are simply there—sensations are non-mental. This establishes the neutrality of sensations. And because images have the same intrinsic nature as sensations (cf. Russell 1921: 117, 121, 154, 156, 287, 297), they too are neutral.[3] Percepts are composed of sensations and images and inherit their neutrality.

4.3.3 More Neutral Entities: Realism

Russell’s focus on sensations, images, and percepts explains why Russell’s neutral monism has often been dismissed as a form of phenomenalism. But in the preceding section we have seen how Russell argued for the nonmentality of these items. Moreover this criticism overlooks that Russell worked with a vastly expanded set of construction materials. He allows for the enlargement of the realm of the known by a series of cautious inferences.[4] In a first step he argues that “all our percepts are composed of imperceptible parts” (Russell 1927a: 282); second, there are sensations, images, and percepts that are not our own; third, and most importantly, we can infer the existence of vast numbers of entities that “do not form part of any experience” (Russell 1921: 25).[5] In this way Russell arrives at the view “that the world is very full of events” (Russell 1927a: 258), only a vanishingly small number of which are his own experiences.

Our own percepts, images, and sensations[6] occupy a privileged place in this system of entities—they are “what is most indubitable in our knowledge of the world” (Russell 1927b: 139). This knowledge is of a “more intimate qualitative” (Russell 1927a: 389) kind; it reveals the intrinsic character of these entities. But our knowledge of the “physical world [the world constructed out of entities outside my experience] is purely abstract: “we know certain logical characteristics of its structure, but nothing of its intrinsic character” (Russell 1927b: 306–307).

Russell takes all of these different entities to be neutral (in the Neither Sense); and he takes all of them to be events[7], where an event is understood as “something occupying a small finite amount of space–time” (Russell 1927b: 287). The noise and the color patch considered above are typical examples of events. A Russellian event is absolute, in C.D. Broad’s sense: “it should not itself be a state of invariance or of change in the qualities or relationships of any thing” (Broad 1959: 739; see also Maxwell 1978: 385–6 on pure events). According to Russell, physics teaches that events “just happen, and do not happen ‘to’ matter or ‘to’ anything else” (Russell 1927b: 289). This means that we must not think of mental events (or any events) “as consisting of motions of bits of matter” (Russell 1927b: 292), for “matter in motion…is not an event in our sense” (Russell 1927b: 296).

Russell’s neutral monist universe is a plenum of (absolute) events—a vast assemblage of overlapping small occurrences which, given their short lifespan, are constantly replaced by new events. This mass of ever-changing events manifests all sorts of complex dynamic patterns. We have not yet discovered the laws that govern these events and give rise to the formation of these complex dynamic patterns. But we have physics, which describes the behavior of certain groups of law-governed events under the name of matter. And we have psychology, which describes a set of quite different regularities that obtain in very specific regions of this plenum of events—viz. in those regions that are filled by the pieces of matter that are called brains. But all the building blocks of the logical constructions that are matter, and all the building blocks of the logical constructions that are mental stats, have the same nature—they are neutral events.

4.4 Some Other Early Neutral Monists

There are, of course, many other philosophers whom one might want to include in the list of neutral monists. In the German speaking world we find Richard Avenarius (1843–96), who was in contact with Mach, and Joseph Petzoldt (1862–1929), who built on the work of Avenarius. Avenarius’s main reflections on neutral monism are contained in Avenarius 1888/90, 1891, and 1894/95. Petzoldt’s relevant works are Petzoldt 1900, 1904 and 1906. In the English speaking world, neutral monism thrived within the movement of American new realism. Ralph Barton Perry (1876–1957)—a student and friend of James—is the most visible neutral monist of this group. His 1912 is the main source for his views about neutral monism. And Edwin B. Holt (1873–1946) developed an ambitious neutral monist program in his 1912 and 1914.

5. Contemporary Versions of Neutral Monism

5.1 Information as Ultimate Reality

Anticipating the current revival in interest in neutral monism by a few decades, Kenneth Sayre (1929–) published his main ideas on neutral monism in the 1970s. Unlike the big three, Sayre finds the neutral base of his system not in experience, but in the Platonic realm of pure information, where information is understood in the strict information theoretical sense. His proposal must not be mistaken for the uncontroversial claim that that mental and physical processes can be described in information theoretic terms. Sayre puts forward an ontological claim about the ultimate nature of reality—that ultimate reality consists of informational states:

If the project…is successful, it will have been shown not only that the concept of information provides a primitive for the analysis of both the physical and the mental, but also that states of information…existed previously to states of mind. Since information in this sense is prior to mentality, but also implicated in all mental states, it follows that information is prior also in the ontological sense…Success of the present project thus will show that an ontology of informational states is adequate for an explanation of the phenomena of mind, as distinct from an ontology of physical events. [And Sayre adds:] It is a reasonable conjecture that an ontology of information is similarly basic to the physical sciences…. (Sayre 1976: 16)

The greatest challenge faced by the traditional versions of neutral monism is to show how basic entities that are derived from experience can be neutral, rather than mental. By choosing an ontology of informational states as his “neutral stuff”, Sayre elegantly bypasses this problem. But while the neutrality of informational states may be taken for granted, the question of the relationship of this abstract “stuff” to concrete world of physical and mental entities becomes all the more pressing.

Sayre’s main work on neutral monism is his 1976. More recently David Chalmers has explored the idea of an informational ontology (see Chalmers 1996). And the related ideas that ultimate reality purely structural (Ladyman and Ross 2007; Floridi 2008, 2009), that it is a computational process (Fredkin 2003; Lloyd 2006), or a purely mathematical (Tegmark 2014) are the subject of a lively discussion.

5.2 Realistic Empiricism: Traditional Neutral Monism Updated

In his recent book The Realistic Empiricism of Mach, James, and Russell. Neutral Monism Reconceived (2014), Erik Banks presents a critical survey of the big three of neutral monism, as well as his own development of the doctrine.

The neutral monist core of Banks’s view amounts to this:

individual events are neutral, neither mental nor physical. Neutral events make up “physical” systems and extensions and “mental” sensations in minds through different functional relations. (Banks 2014: 203)

This is very much in keeping with the traditional version of neutral monism, especially the event-based flavor of the view that Russell advocated in the years after 1927. But Banks embeds this core idea into a larger metaphysical framework. The resulting theory is thoroughly original.

In a first step, Banks explains how this core idea fits into a larger a posteriori physicalist picture. Physicalism, according to Banks, is best thought of as the view that mental supervenes on the physical. Standard physicalism focuses on the question of how mental properties and relations depend physical properties and relations. But standard physicalism does not specify the nature of the entities that exemplify these properties and relations. Any set of entities will do, so long as the supervenience relationships between the physical and mental properties and relations are preserved. Enhanced physicalism goes beyond standard physicalism in specifying the nature of the entities that bear or instantiate the relevant properties and relations:

In enhanced physicalism…the instantiation of all physical properties are individualized event particulars in causal-functional relations to each other. (Banks 2014: 147)

This is how the neutral events slot into the enhanced physicalist picture that Banks favors.

In a second step, Banks provides us with an account of events. Events have, and are individuated by, intrinsic characters or concrete qualities. None of those qualities are mental; but experience familiarizes us with some of those qualities (see Banks 2014: 6). These qualities are the ways certain powers manifest themselves in events (see Banks 2014: 6). Examples of the sorts of powers (or energies) are electromagnetism, gravitation, and nuclear forces, and, most relevant in the present context, neural energy—the internal energies in neurons (see Banks 2014,149, 203). Manifesting itself qualitatively at the level of the single neuron, this energy may yield an electrical discharge event; but manifesting itself at the level of a complex brain event—an event that is “somehow ‘composed’ of neurons firing in some kind of cluster” (Banks 2014: 147)—this very same neural energy may yield the event that is a sensation of blue. This closes the apparent chasm between the experience of blue and the firing of a bunch of neurons, once it is understood that

the quality blue and the individual electrical discharges are just different and mutually exclusive manifestations of the same natural powers which we mistakenly see as belonging to totally different categories of event. (Banks 2014: 164)

This is an attractive picture, but it is difficult to see it as a monism of neutral events. Wherein does the neutrality of these events—an experience of blue and neural firing events—consist? It does appear, moreover, that events (whether neutral or not) no longer play a fundamental ontological role. In their place we find the powers/energies that give rise to events.

Banks addresses this second problem head on. Powers are identical with their token manifestations, identical with the events that consist in the individual qualities wherein these powers manifest themselves[8] (see Banks 2014: 149). That is, there is no separate, more fundamental level of reality underlying the events. The powers just are the events. The neural energy is identical with the event that is the electrical discharges of a group of neurons; this same neural energy is also identical with event that is a sensation of blue. But, and this is a crucial part of Banks’s view, the discharge events are not identical with the blue sensation. Banks sees the question that this poses clearly:

how can it be the case that the powers are identical with each of their token manifestations and even identical qua powers across different token manifestation events, but that different token manifestation events are not identical to each other? (Banks 2014: 149)

This is not an easy knot to unravel. Perhaps an appeal to relative identity might help.

Assuming that the fundamentality of events has been established, we still face the question in which sense they qualify as neutral. Consider

the event of seeing a blue patch and the event of having all the configured neurons fire in the region of the brain responsible for seeing the blue patch. (Banks 2014: 164)

To the naïve opinion that the first of these events is mental, while the second is physical, Banks replies as follows:

The phenomenon of sensation simply falls into place as a certain type of physical event among others in nature. The separate category of mental phenomena simply ceases to exist, except as a provisional way of talking. (Banks 2014: 164)

The monism expressed in this answer is beyond reasonable doubt; but the neutrality is somewhat elusive.

5.3 Mind & Matter: A Merely Conceptual Distinction

For want of a better label, John Heil has presents his view on the mind-body relation as a form of neutral monism. He resists being labeled a materialist

because it carries with it the implication that there is an asymmetryin the identification of mental qualities with material qualities: the mental is supplanted by the material. (Heil 2013: 242)

Nor does he see himself as an idealist. And he has systematic and deep reasons for rejecting the property dualism that characterizes the various versions of nonreductive materialism. The neutral monism that he accepts is characterized as follows:

Neutral monism includes the denial that there is a mental–material chasm to be bridged. The mental–material distinction is, as Spinoza and Donald Davidson contend, a distinction of conception only, not a realdistinction, not a distinction in reality. (Heil 2013: 242)

An example will help to illustrate the gist of this view. Take the well-worn claim that pain is c-fiber stimulation.[9] According to Heil, this says that the predicate “c-fiber stimulation” and the predicate “pain” apply to the same things: all things that are truly described as being c-fiber stimulations are also truly described as pains. But—and this is a crucial claim that cannot be developed here—this does not mean that there is a property of being a c-fiber stimulation and a property of being a pain, and that these two properties stand in some interesting relationship, such as identity, reduction, realization, etc. What this does mean is that there is a complex object that makes both of these claims true. The nature of the parts of this object, as well as their intricate relationships to one another, is the reality that is correctly described as a c-fiber stimulation and as a pain.

This part of Heil’s account appears to be consistent with the spirit of traditional neutral monism. One is reminded of Russell’s pithy description of his project: “What I wish to do in this essay is to restate the relations of mind and brain in terms not implying the existence of either” (Russell 1956a: 145). This can easily be read as a denial of the existence of a chasm between mental and physical properties. And Heil’s complex objects that serve as the truth-makers for mental and physical descriptions may be seen as analogous to Russell’s groups (logical constructions) of events that can properly be described in physical and mental terms. This makes for a significant parallel between the two views.

But there is an additional part to the neutral monist picture—one that all of the mainline neutral monists agree on—that Heil rejects. When he tells the “deep story” (Heil’s term) about the nature of the complex objects (the truth-makers for claims about c-fibers and pains etc.), he turns to fundamental physics:

I take it to be an empirical question—a question for science, for fundamental physics—what the substances are and what they are like, how they are. (Heil 2013: 201–2)

So the basic constituents of the world—the substances and the properties—that Heil describes are, in the best sense of the term, physical. Here the neutral monist (who is committed to the Neither View of neutrality parts company with Heil. The deep story of the neutral monist has it that the fundamental entities—be they events, bits of information, substances, properties, etc.—are not physical (and not mental, of course). That is to say, they are not the sort of thing that fundamental physics (or psychology) reveals.

5.4 Complex Basic Entities

In his recent book Mind and Cosmos (2012) Thomas Nagel asserts that “the weight of the evidence favors some form of neutral monism over the traditional alternatives of materialism, idealism, and dualism” (2012: 5). Neutral monism is understood as a view that “accounts for the relation between mind and brain in terms of something more basic about the natural order” (2012: 56). This yields a picture of a “general monism according to which the constituents of the universe have properties that explain not only its physical but its mental character” (2012: 56). Borrowing a concept from Tom Sorrell (whom Nagel cites approvingly), we can say that these basic constituents of the universe are “transphysical and transmental” (2012: 57). This nicely captures the relevant sense of neutrality. The claim that all of the basic constituents must be of the same kind—the conclusion that we are dealing with a monism—is supported by the consideration that any basic constituent could be part of a psychophysical creature, such as ourselves. Hence every basic constituent must be of the kind that can explain the physical and mental traits as we know them.

All that has been said up to this point supports the view that Nagel endorses neutral monism. But what Nagel says next seems to contradict this simple picture. He writes:

Everything, living or not, is constituted from elements having a nature that is both physical and nonphysical—that is, capable of combining into mental wholes. So this reductive account can also be described as a form of panpsychism: all the elements of the physical world are also mental. (Nagel 2012: 57)

Note that the description of the basic constituents has changed from “transphysical and transmental” to “physical and mental”—from the Neither View to the Both View. And Nagel is very much aware that these are not the same thing. In an earlier paper in which he considers neutral monism, he writes:

this view would imply that the fundamental constituents of the world, out of which everything is composed, are neither physical nor mental but something more basic. This position is not equivalent to panpsychism. Panpsychism is, in effect, dualism all the way down. This is monism all the way down. (Nagel 2002: 231)

Is there a way to overcome this apparent tension and to see these two views as parts of a coherent whole? In a personal communication Prof. Nagel offered the following explanation:

the fundamental elements would be neither merely physical nor merely mental, but something that was necessarily both physical and mental, (or protomental); but since this necessary connection can’t hold directly between the physical and the mental as we conceive them, it would require that the real character of these fundamental constituents be something more basic that accounts for their being both physical and (proto)mental.

The resulting picture is this. Described at the most fundamental level, the constituents of the world have properties that are neither mental nor physical. These neutral properties of every fundamental entity give rise to physical and mental (or protomental) properties. Thus each fundamental constituent is complex: it has mental (or protomental) properties, it has physical properties, and it has these two sets of properties as a necessary consequence of its having a third set of properties—the neutral properties.

The foundational role played by the neutral properties (in the Neither Sense) suggests that the view is a form of neutral monism. This interpretation can be further supported by arguing that the neutral properties ground the other properties of the basic entities, and that grounded properties make for “no addition to being”.

Others will object to the neutral monist interpretation of Nagel’s view, insisting that basic entities that have mental and physical properties cannot count as neutral, given the Neither Sense of neutrality.[10] The case for calling it a panpsychism rests on the fact that each fundamental entity has mental features. The case for calling it a dual-aspect theory rests on the fact that each fundamental entity has physical and mental features. And if neutrality is understood in the Both Sense, then this very same fact indicates that we are dealing with a version of neutral monism after all. But if one follows the traditional neutral monists in understanding neutrality in the Neither Sense, and if one follows them further in assuming that the properties of being mental and being physical are properties that can only be possessed by groups of basic entities, not by individual basic entities, then it is advisable to deny that Nagel’s view is a version of neutral monism. Perhaps it is best characterized as a form of the dual-aspect theory, or as a form of property dualism, if aspects are distinguished from properties (see section 8.3 below).

5.5 Russellian Monism

In the search for a solution to the mind-body problem one may be captivated by the thought that we know less about matter than we are commonly led to believe. All we do (or can) know are the dispositional properties of matter.[11] When combined with the insight that dispositions need categorical grounds, one discovers that one’s conception of matter is radically incomplete. In addition to all the dispositional properties that physics treats of, matter must have intrinsic categorical properties. Since the nature of these intrinsic properties is unknown, the following bold thought suggests itself. Perhaps these properties play a dual role: in addition to grounding to dispositional properties of matter, they also serve as the grounds of our conscious experience. These are the kinds of considerations that may lead one to Russellian monism, the view that

matter has intrinsic properties that both constitute consciousness and serve as categorical bases for the dispositional properties described in physics. (Alter and Nagasawa 2015: 1)

The basic constituents of the world of Russellian monism are the fundamental entities of physics (not the insubstantial events of Russell’s world). But the most fundamental properties of these fundamental entities are not their physical properties, but the intrinsic properties in virtue of which they have those physical properties. And these same intrinsic properties do, when arranged appropriately, give rise to conscious experience. Therein consists the monism of this view: at the bottom there are fundamental entities with certain intrinsic properties; all else is grounded in this fact.

There are many versions of Russellian Monism. Differences are due, in part, to varying views about the relations between the intrinsic properties, on the one side, and the mental and physical properties, on the other. But the central disagreement concerns the nature of the intrinsic properties. They have been held to be physical (Montero 2015; Pereboom 2015), mental (Bolender 2001), mental and physical (Strawson 2015, 2016), or neutral (Coleman 2014). Accordingly there are physicalist, idealist (mentalist), and neutral monist versions or Russellian monism. The precise nature of these disagreements are difficult to pin down, given the number of different notions of the mental and the physical that are in play in this discussion.

The best known version of Russellian neutral monism is panprotopsychism—a view that David Chalmers has explored over many years (Chalmers 1996, 2015). In the standard form of this theory the postulated intrinsic properties are characterized as being neither experiential (they are proto-psychic) nor physical (they lack the structural/dispositional nature of physical properties). That makes them neutral (in the Neither Sense). But this purely negative characterization of the intrinsic properties has occasioned considerable discomfort. A variant of this theory—panqualityism—addresses this problem in a most satisfactory manner, while creating new problems of its own.

It takes redness, greenness, sweetness, roundness, etc.—the primitive sensory qualities given to us in experience, and considered just as such—to be the intrinsic properties of the fundamental physical entities (cf. Chalmers 2015: 272). One’s being aware of redness—i.e., the property of phenomenal redness—is mental, but redness itself is not. Nor is (this kind of) redness a physical, structural property. So panqualityism has secured a neutral base with which we are intimately familiar.

Panqualityism has its contemporary defenders—Chalmers points to Sam Coleman’s neutral monist proposal (Coleman 2014). And he boldly conjectures that

versions of the view itself were popular among the neutral monists of the early twentieth century, including William James (1904b), Ernst Mach (1886), and Bertrand Russell (1921). (Chalmers 2015: 271)

One may wonder how an electron’s being red can ground its negative charge. And one may agree with Chalmers that qualities, no matter how intricately arranged, cannot ground the phenomenal properties of our experience. For “no instantiations of qualities ever necessitate awareness of qualities” (Chalmers 2015: 273). Finally, one may share Wilfrid Sellars’s (1963: 35) view that it makes no sense to think that fundamental physical entities might have primitive sensory qualities like redness.

What the consideration of Russellian Monism shows is that (i) new versions of neutral monism are currently being developed that borrow relatively little from the ideas of traditional neutral monism; (ii) but even the most developed versions of Russellian neutral monism face considerable problems.

6. The Case for Neutral Monism

The case for neutral monism is best made by enumerating its virtues.

6.1 Parsimony

We have already Russell’s reasons for valuing ontological parsimony (see section 4.3.1 above). Neutral monism has this theoretical virtue to a high degree. The “immense simplification” (Russell 1959: 252) it affords was what most attracted him to this view. The spirit of Mach’s neutral monism is similarly antimetaphysical:

nothing is important except what can be observed or is a datum for us, and everything hypothetical, metaphysical and superfluous, is to be eliminated. (Mach 1886: 27–28)

First on the list of “metaphysical entities” (Mach 1905: 13) that have to go are “the ‘unfathomable’ thing and the equally ‘unexplorable’ ego” (Mach 1905: 8). And James concurs: “Consciousness as it is ordinarily understood does not exist, any more than does Matter” (James 1905: 63).

6.2 The Mind-Body Problem

Mach, James, and Russell agree that neutral monism solves the mind-body problem. Russell’s account of experience (of perceptual consciousness) may serve as an illustration of the point. Russell frequently emphasized the miracle or mystery involved in traditional accounts of perception (1927b: 147, 154; 1927a: 275, 400). At the end of a purely physical chain of causes there mysteriously arises something of a completely different nature: an experience (a sensation of red, say). This is the hard problem of consciousness. The neutral monist solves this problem by maintaining that “we cannot say that ‘matter is the cause of our sensations” (1927b: 290). Mach agrees: “Bodies do not produce sensations” (Mach 1886: 29). To suggest otherwise is to rely on “the monstrous idea of employing atoms to explain psychical processes” (Mach 1886: 311). Matter/bodies are, after all, nothing but collections of neutral entities, i.e., of Russellian events or Machian elements. So mind-body causation reduces to causal relations among events or elements. And, for all we know, the event/element causing a sensation may be quite similar to the sensation it causes. This closes the apparent chasm between the “material process” and the ensuing experience, and the mystery of perception vanishes.

6.3 Perceptual Evidence for Physics

The Analysis of Matter (Russell 1927a) is widely regarded as the most important text of the neutral monist literature. Chapter one of this book, entitled “The Nature of the Problem”, states it as follows:

the world of physics is, prima facie, so different from the world of perception that it is difficult to see how the one can afford evidence for the other; moreover, physics and physiology themselves seem to give grounds for supposing that perception cannot give very accurate information as to the external world, and thus weaken the props upon which they are built…We must therefore find an interpretation of physics which gives a due place to perceptions; if not, we have no right to appeal to the empirical evidence. (Russell 1927a: 6–7; see also Russell 1948: Part III, Ch. IV)

The previous remarks addressed to the mind-body problem in general, and to the problem of perceptual experience in particular, contain the core of the solution Russell proposes. By “bridging the gulf between physics (as commonly interpreted) and perception” (Russell 1927a: 7), neutral monism promises to solve this problem—a problem that Russell took to be difficult and largely unnoticed (see Russell 1948: 175–176).

6.4 Knowledge of the External World

Mach and James understand neutral monism as an especially radical from of achieving perceptual contact with the world. It might be understood as a limiting case of naïve realism—a case in which the relation between the subject and its perceptual object becomes the identity relation. In perception “subject and object merge” (James 1905: 57). A single reality—a red patch, say, when we see a tomato—is a constituent of two groups of neutral entities: the group that is the perceiver, and the group that is the tomato. The mind and its object become one. In James’s words:

A given undivided portion of experience, taken in one context of associates, play[s] the part of the knower, or a state of mind, or “consciousness”; while in a different context the same undivided bit of experience plays the part of a thing known, of an objective “content”. In a word, in one group it figures as a thought, in another group as a thing. (James 1904b: 9–10)

Some have seen this epistemic achievement as the most important reward of neutral monism.

But Russell dissented. There are well known problems surrounding accounts of perception that conceive it as a form of direct contact with the world. Among them are the problems arising from the fact that an object can present different and incompatible appearances to different observers. Some neutral monists concluded that “nature is a seething chaos of contradiction” (Holt 1914: 276). But Russell chose to abandon the view that in perception “subject and object merge”. Instead he locates the red patch you see when looking at a tomato in your brain, and distinguishes it from the tomato (from the group of events that constitute the tomato). That is why he can assert that he “know[s] about what is happening in the brain exactly what naïve realism thinks it knows about what is happening in the outside world” (Russell 1927b: 138). This solves the problem of different and incompatible appearances: compatibility is restored by moving the conflicting features away from the single physical object and into the brains of the different percipients. But in making this move Russell abandons the naïve realism of Mach and James and puts a version of representative realism in its place. Thereby the problem of our knowledge of the external world is reintroduced in full force.[12]

6.5 Unity of Science

Mach operates on the assumption that all sciences form a whole (see Mach 1886: 30). The great virtue of neutral monism is that it affords a unified perspective from which scientific inquiry can be undertaken:

what I aimed at was merely to attain a safe and clear philosophical standpoint, whence practicable paths, shrouded in no metaphysical clouds, might be seen leading not only into the field of physics but also into that of psycho-physiology. (Mach 1886: 47)

The idea of neutral monism as a bridge between different sciences is also present in Russell. He presents neutral monism as

an attempt to harmonize two different tendencies, one in psychology, the other in physics…[viz.]…the materialistic tendency of psychology and the anti-materialistic tendency of physics. (Russell 1921: 5–6)

6.6 Let’s Try Looking Over Here

According to Jerry Fodor, “the form of a philosophical theory, often enough, is: Let’s try looking over here” (Fodor 1981: 31). The current revival of interest in neutral monism is, perhaps, best seen as part of the general movement to explore all possible options in the metaphysics of consciousness—a movement that is driven by the sense that the traditional positions face insurmountable obstacles. David Chalmers’s paper “Panpsychism and Panprotopsychism” (Chalmers 2015) provides an illuminating account of the dialectic that drives some contemporary philosophers to explore the little known neutral monistic territory.

7. Objections to Neutral Monism

7.1 Reduction and the Threat of Elimination

Every version of reductionism must deal with the question of the ontological status of the entities it reduces: are they retained or eliminated? Both of these components are present in traditional neutral monism. It eliminates mind and matter as these are traditionally conceived. There are neither “solid persistent objects moving through space”, nor are there states with an inbuilt and primitive “reference to objects” (Russell 1921: 124, 36). But, on the other hand, it provides constructions of neutral entities that are designed to play the roles of the entities they displace. On this picture there is no sharp boundary between retention and elimination. As the distance between the two roles—that played by the target entity, and that played by its neutral monist replacement—increases we move from the pole of retention toward that of elimination. The success of this strategy will have to be assessed on a case by case basis. There are relatively few objections to neutral monism that turn on the details of proposed reductions. (But see C.D. Broad’s critique of Russell, 1925: 577–584). This fact may, however, owe less to the excellence than to the rarity of such reductions in the literature. The most challenging criticisms of neutral monism do not engage with technical details, but aim squarely at the central idea of the doctrine—the idea of neutrality.

7.2 The Mentalism Suspicion

The most frequent type of objection to the traditional versions of neutral monism is that they are all forms of mentalistic monism: Berkleyan idealism, panpsychism, or phenomenalism. The argument is simple: sensations (Mach), pure experience (James) and sensations/percepts (Russell) are paradigms of non-neutral, mental entities. Hence there is nothing neutral about these versions of neutral monism. The prima facie plausibility of this objection is beyond doubt. But it is also clear that Mach, James, and Russell were acutely aware of the problem and took themselves to have responded in a satisfactory manner. They reject the view that a sensation or an experience consists of a subject directing a mental act—awareness, consciousness, acquaintance—onto on an object. Dispensing with the subject and the act, they are left with what used to be the object—a red patch, say. And they hold that there is nothing mental about red patches. All it takes for this red patch to turn into a red-sensation is for it to be appropriately related to other entities of the same kind. There is no quick way to adjudicate this dispute. A careful assessment of each case is required. This type of objection—the “mentalism suspicion”—has been articulated by a diverse group of philosophers, among them: (Lenin 1909: 34; Stace 1946; Ayer 1971; Feigl 1958: 426, 1975: 26–7; Maxwell 1976: 354; Popper & Eccles 1977: 199; Strawson 1994: 97; Chalmers 1996: 155; Tully 2003: 355, 369).

7.3 The Problem of Experience

The second type of objection to neutral monism argues that neutral monism cannot accommodate experience. The argument is driven by two deep metaphysical convictions. First, experience cannot be reduced to (or constructed from) the non-experiential; second, strong emergence (see section 8.4 below) is unintelligible. Assuming that the neutral must be non-experiential, it follows that the neutral monist world has no room for experience. Galen Strawson has wielded this argument against all forms of traditional materialism, and occasionally also against neutral monism (see Strawson 1994: 46–54, 96–99; Strawson 2016.).

Chalmers’s main objection to the panqualityist form of neutral monism (see section 4.3.2 above) though stated in different terms, leads up to the same result. There is no path that leads from the qualities we experience (but which are not experiential themselves) to the experience of those qualities. Having an experience is a matter of having phenomenal qualities. Phenomenal qualities involve awareness of qualities. But “no instantiations of qualities ever necessitate awareness of qualities” (Chalmers 2015: 273). This “quality/awareness gap” (Chalmers 2015: 273) shows that no structure of qualities can add up to experience.[13]

But is it really true that the resources of neutral monism are too limited to “manufacture” awareness? Here it is instructive to reflect briefly on Russell’s changing ideas about awareness. Before embracing neutral monism, Russell defended a simple and very influential account of awareness: to be aware of x (a red sense-datum, say) just is to bear a special (simple and unanalyzable) relation to x—the so-called acquaintance relation. We have seen that Russell abandoned this account of awareness (see section 4.3.2 above). But perhaps it is possible to rebuild a structurally similar account of awareness within the neutral monist framework. In place of a simple (Cartesian style) subject or self, there now is a complex bundle-self (composed of neutral events). In place of a simple two-place relation of acquaintance, there now is a complex n-place relation obtaining between x (a red patch, say) and the various other events composing the complex bundle self of which the red patch is a member. And for S (the bundle-self) to be aware of x (the red patch) just is for x to bear this special n-place relation to x to the other members of the bundle that make up S. The overall shape of the two accounts of awareness is the same: a self bearing a special relation to an object. This suggests the following thought: if it is granted that Russell’s old account of awareness did shed some light one the question how experience enters the world, then why not accept that the new (neutral monistically reconstructed) account of awareness is equally illuminating. So if the quality/awareness gap had no force against Russell’s old account of awareness, then we should not expect it to have force against the neutral monistically reconstructed account of awareness.

This does not establish that neutral monism can overcome the problem of experience. Both accounts can be rejected, either on the grounds that experience is fundamental and unanalyzable, or on the grounds that they misconstrue the nature of experience. And even if Russell’s original analysis is accepted, its neutral monistic reconstruction may be rejected, on the grounds that the assumed analogy does not hold. So what we have here is no more than a tentative proposal how the traditional neutral monist, and the contemporary panqualityist, might begin to think about the difficult problem of accommodating experience in the neutral monist framework. To the extent that his proposal succeeds, it does raise a question suggested by Strawson’s argument above: is experience, thus understood in a neutral monist setting, a feature that is emergent in an objectionable way (see section 8.4 below)?

7.4 Error

The neutral monism of Mach and James is committed to naively realistic account of perceptual experience (see section 6.4 above). Nonveridical experiences—illusions, hallucinations, dreams, etc.—are difficult to accommodate within naïve realism. For the entities needed to constitute nonveridical experiences—e.g., the pink rat that the drunkard “sees”—do not exist.

But traditional neutral monism provides an ontology rich enough to address this problem. The pink shape experienced by the drunkard exists: it is a portion of pure experience (James), or an element (Mach). This much naïve realism is true, even in the cases of nonveridical experience. But the pink rat that the drunkard takes himself to see does not exist—the pink patch he sees is not a member of a group of neutral elements that constitute a rat. There is nothing wrong with the drunkard’s visual experience; what is mistaken is his assumption that what he sees is a rat. Russell (though not a naïve realist himself) states this point most succinctly: “There are in fact no illusions of the senses, but only mistakes in interpreting sensational data as signs of things other than themselves” (Russell 1948: 149–50). Mach puts the point as follows:

When we consider elements like red, green, hot, cold and the rest, which are physical and mental in virtue of their dependence on both external and internal circumstances, and are in both respects immediately given and identical, the question as to illusion and reality loses its sense. Here we are simultaneously confronted by the elements of the real world and of the ego. The only possible further question of interest concerns their functional interdependence…. (Mach 1905: 7–8)

8. Neutral Monism and Other Doctrines

Traditional neutral monism has been characterized as a form of reductionism or constructionism. The reductionist version of neutral monism takes mental and physical phenomena to be identical with groups of neutral entities. Russell’s constructionist version of the doctrine contents itself with the claim that there are logical constructions of neutral entities that play the roles of physical and mental entities; whether there also are mental and physical entities, as originally conceived, is a question that the constructionist does not address. Neutral monism differs from other versions of reductionism/constructionism by insisting on the neutrality of the basis. And its reductive/constructionist spirit sets it apart from the certain versions of nonreductive theories (about the mental) with which it is occasionally confused or identified. Panpsychism, phenomenalism, emergentism, and the dual aspect theory (sometimes understood as property dualism) are the leading candidates. And recently a number of philosophers have argued that neutral monism—in its traditional form as well as in its new Russellian monist form—is best interpreted as a nonstandard version of physicalism.

8.1 Neutral Monism and Panpsychism

Panpsychism holds that every basic entity—usually understood as a physical entity—is also a mind. The physical nature (if present) and the mental nature of the basic entities are fundamental, i.e., irreducible (to each other or to anything else). On the face of it, panpsychism and neutral monism are strikingly different. Neutral monism reduces mental and physical phenomena, panpsychism does not; neutral monism holds that basic reality is neutral, panpsychism does not. And neutral monism is compatible with the view that most physical objects, and all their parts, are absolutely nonmental, whereas panpsychism is not. This is how things look on the Neither View of neutrality. On the Both View of neutrality, things are less clear. The most natural reading of the Both View will, however, not yield panpsychism—the view that every basic physical entity has a mind—but a dual aspect view—a view according to which every basic entity has a physical and and a mental aspect or side. This raises further questions about how to distinguish panpsychist and dual aspect theories—questions that are too specialized to be pursued here.

While the definition of neutral monism may distinguish it clearly from panpsychism, consideration of the extant versions of neutral monism has tended to suggest a different picture. The allegedly neutral basic entities of traditional neutral monism strike many as manifestly mental (see section 7.2 above). This is not the place to assess the accuracy of this impression. But there can be little doubt that it is the source of the wide-spread suspicion that neutral monism is best understood as a version of panpsychism or of phenomenalism.

8.2 Neutral Monism and Phenomenalism

Phenomenalism has been defended as a doctrine about language, about facts, and about things. Taken in this last sense, it attempts to “reduce material objects to sensa, that is, to explain them as consisting solely of sensa or as being primarily groups or patterns of them” (Hirst 2006: 271). We might substitute the terms “sense-data”, “sensations”, “percepts”, “experiences”, etc. for Hirst’s term “sensa”. The worry is always the same: the basic entities of neutral monism are not neutral but mental. Hence neutral monism is a form of purely mentalistic metaphysics. It is true that traditional neutral monism is stated in terms of sensations (Mach), pure experience (James), and sensations and percepts (Russell). But, as used by the neutral monists, these terms are supposedly purged of their usual mental dimension. In the neutral monist framework, the predicates “mental” and “physical” apply solely to groups of neutral entities. To call a particular element—a sensation, a percept, a bit of pure experience—mental or physical is to speak elliptically: it is to say that this neutral entity is a constituent of a group of elements that, taken as a whole, is mental or physical. Moreover, neutral monism is not limited to those entities that are sensations and perceptions—this is particularly clear in the case of Mach and Russell. The existence of vast majority of neutral entities is inferred from the minute set of elements that are sensations and perceptions. These inferred elements are outside of all minds (see especially section 4.3.3 above). These are the strong anti-phenomenalist claims that neutral monism makes. How successfully the various neutral monists defend these claims is, of course, a difficult further question.

As in the case of the panpsychism suspicion, the source of the worry that neutral monism may collapse into phenomenalism is grounded, not in the definition of neutral monism, but in the actual versions of neutral monism that have been put forth. The worry is that the allegedly neutral entities are really mental, thereby turning neutral monism into phenomenalism.

8.3 Neutral Monism and Dual-Aspect Theory

The theory of dual or double aspects is usually traced back to Spinoza (1677). The fundamental idea uniting the family of views that are gathered together under this label is that there is an underlying reality that we can grasp as mental or as physical, depending on the point of view from which we apprehend it. The mental and the physical are aspects of this underlying reality which, in itself, is neither mental nor physical. Each one of us can know their own brain under both of these aspects—via introspection and (scientific) observation. But the claim of the theory is quite general: everything there is is to be understood as consisting of an underlying reality that has these two aspects.

Neutral monism and the dual-aspect theory share a central claim: there is an underlying reality that is neither mental nor physical. But that is where the agreement stops. Neutral monism has no room for the central feature of the dual-aspect theory: the mental and physical aspects, or sides, or properties that characterize the underlying entities of dual-aspect theory. The neutral monist accepts the mental/physical distinction. But it resides at the level or groups of neutral entities. Grouped one way, the neutral entities that constitute your brain are thoughts and feelings; grouped another way, they are atoms and neurons and lobes. Whether a given group of interrelated neutral entities counts as mental or physical depends on the functional role this group occupies (see section 3). On this picture, the mentality and physicality are features of complex structures of neutral entities. But the entities themselves are free of mental or physical aspects/sides/properties. Therein consists their neutrality.

But if neutrality is understood according to the Both View, the case for identifying neutral monism with the dual-aspect theory is strengthened. Much will turn on how the details of the Both View are articulated. It must not, for example, be understood as proposing the identification of mental and physical properties. For the dual-aspect theory insists that the two aspects are fundamental and irreducible to each other. Another question concerns the relationship of the aspects and properties. If aspects are understood as properties, dual-aspect theory may simply collapse into property dualism (see, e.g., Van Gulick 2014). Dual-aspect theorists have pushed back by insisting that aspects are not properties (see Skrbina 2014: 228–29). But this may, in turn, block the project of reconciling the dual-aspect theory with neutral monism. For the neutrality, on the Both as well as on the Neither View, is understood in terms of mental and physical properties.

There is a lively debate concerning the relationship between neutral monism and dual-aspect theory (see, e.g., Velmans 2008; Skrbina 2014; see also section 5.4). The decision about these two types of theory—whether they are incompatible rivals, whether they are distinct but compatible, or whether they are identical—is still out.

8.4 Neutral Monism and Emergence

The basic idea of emergence has to do with the fact that complex systems may display interesting novel properties—properties not possessed by their parts. This idea has been regimented in various ways. Following Chalmers, we can distinguish between weak and strong emergence. Weakly emergent phenomena are merely unexpected, given our knowledge of the domain from which they arise. Strongly emergent phenomena are not just unexpected; they cannot (not even in principle) be deduced from the domain from which they arise (see Chalmers 2006: 244).

Weak emergence will, no doubt, be a wide-spread phenomenon in the neutral monist world. It poses no problem. But neutral monism, understood as a form of reductionism/constructionism appears to rule out strong emergence. Phenomena that cannot be deduced from the domain from which they arise cannot be reduced to it or constructed from it. The existence of strongly emergent features would therefore falsify the neutral monist thesis that everything is reducible to/constructible from the underlying neutral level of the neutral monist ontology.

The contrary view is defended by Landini, who argues that (strong) emergence plays a crucial role in Russell’s neutral monism. If the fundamental transient physical particulars (or events) have no phenomenal characters (or qualia), such qualities must be understood as strongly emergent features within the framework of Russell’s neutral monism.

Qualia never occur in transient particulars. In Russell’s view, qualia emerge from the series of brain states…colors, pitches, smells, tastes and textures are emergent properties of series of brain states…. (Landini 2011: 302–305)

But Russell’s remarks about emergence (Russell 1927b: 293–96) allow different reading. When called upon to present examples of events, Russell gives the following list:

seeing a flash of lightning…hearing a tyre burst, or smelling a rotten egg, or feeling the coldness of a frog…particular colors and sounds and so on are events. (Russell 1927b: 287–88)

All of these events are percepts—the only kinds of events we can know without inference. And, pace Landini, all of these events do have qualitative characters. When Russell speaks of emergence, he has in mind the relationship between the abstract mathematical properties of events and their intrinsic qualitative characters. And he maintains that latter are emergent with respect to the former because there is no inferential path leading from the abstract mathematical features of an event to its intrinsic qualitative features. What this means is that if one were to carry out the neutral monist program by focusing exclusively on the abstract mathematical characteristics of events, then the existence qualitative characters of certain events would constitute a (strongly) emergent fact. For such abstract and mathematical considerations

cannot conceivably…prove that there are visual events, or auditory events, or events of any of the kind that we know by perception. (Russell 1927b: 295)

But this is not how the neutral monist (who follows Russell’s lead) starts out. Our percepts are our initial data, and they are qualitative through and through. The existence of quality is not something that we have to deduce from other known facts. On the contrary, it is the initial datum. Such other events as we may believe in, whose intrinsic qualities we do not know, are all inferred from this bedrock of qualitatively loaded percepts. It is therefore a mistake to try to explain the existence of qualitative characteristics (or qualia) as emerging from complex brain states. These characteristics are there, in the form of our percepts, at the very foundation of Russell’s neutral monism.

8.5 Neutral Monism and Nonstandard Physicalism

In the past neutral monism has often been interpreted as a form of mentalism. A number of contemporary philosophers argue that it is best understood as a form of physicalism.

Daniel Stoljar (2001), Derk Pereboom (2011, 2015), and Barbara Montero (2015) have interpreted Russellian monism (see section 5.5) as a form of physicalism. They argue that the categorical properties that ground the dispositional properties that feature in physical theory are themselves physical properties, albeit physical properties of a different kind. Once the realm of the physical is thus expanded, the attempt to classify the categorical bases of the dispositional properties of physics as neutral properties appears misguided. The proposal to construe the categorical bases as neutral results from an unduly narrow conception of the physical.

The recent literature also contains a number of attempts to interpret traditional neutral monism as a form of physicalism. Banks (see section 5.2) presents his neutral monism (realistic empiricism) as a direct descendant of traditional neutral monism (Banks 2014, viii). But he also holds that his neutral monism is “a kind of physicalism” (Banks 2014: 7, 142). Like Russell, he embraces an ontology of events. And he takes himself to follow Russell in construing these events as manifestations of underlying powers or energies—such as electromagnetism, gravitation, and nuclear forces (Banks 149), as well as neural energies (Banks 2014: 142). These considerations lead him to the following observation about the nature of Russell’s (and his own) event particulars:

Russellian neutral event particulars are so physicalistic in nature that there does not seem to be any reason to assume that these natural qualities in physics have anything at all in common with our sensations, which are qualities of a very different order. A typical event particular in Russell’s universe would be something perhaps like the emission of a quantum of radiation from an atom, having little or nothing to do with events in the human nervous system at a very different scale of complexity and size. (Banks 2014: 156)

There is much more to Banks’s complex view. But this suffices to convey something of the physicalistic flavor of his interpretation of traditional neutral monism.

After a careful survey of the development of Russell’s neutral monism, Donovan Wishon concludes that Russell’s final version of neutral monism (developed in the 1940s and after) “is very plausibly interpreted as a version of ‘Russellian Physicalism’” (Wishon 2015: 92). Among other things, he draws our attention to Russell’s own claim that “I find myself in ontology increasingly materialistic” (Russell 1946: 700). And he points out that Russell argues that all events, including all our mental events, are subject to the laws of physics. Hence “mental events will turn out to be a subclass of the physical events that make up reality” (Wishon 2015: 112). According to Wishon, this shows that mental events are not ontologically distinct from physical events. Only their special epistemic accessibility distinguishes them from the other physical events (Wishon 2015: 112). In this way, Wishon suggests, Russell final version of neutral monism effectively turns into a version of Russellian Physicalism.

We have noted (see section 1) how Landini’s interpretation of the notion of neutrality (according to (3)—the Possible Constituent View) allows him to argue that neutral monism is compatible with physicalism. As he sees it, Russell is committed to such a version of physicalist neutral monism. Accordingly, Russell is engaged in the project of “constructing both [minds and matter] out of orderings of physical events that are their stages” (Landini 2011: 280). After a detailed discussion (Landini 2011: 291–297), Landini reaches the conclusion that the transient particulars (or events) from which Russell constructs mind and matter “are without intrinsic phenomenal character” (Landini 2011: 297). This makes it possible to regard them as physical entities in good standing. Their neutrality consists in the fact that they are the building blocks of both mental and physical continuants (see Landini 2011: 292).

These attempts to combine neutral monism with physicalism, or to reinterpret neutral monism along physicalist lines pose a serious challenge to neutral monism as usually understood. They deny the central claim that the fundamental building blocks of the world are neutral, i.e., nonphysical and nonmental. But no less noteworthy is the degree to which these versions of physicalism depart from more standard versions of physicalism. These nonstandard versions of physicalism agree with neutral monism in holding that physics provides an incomplete picture of the world. The disagreement is limited to a dispute about the nature of the materials that are needed to fill out the picture that physics provides. The neutral monist searches for something that is neither mental nor physical, in the traditional senses of these terms. The physicalists whom we are currently considering hope to find the missing materials in something that is physical, but not physical in the traditional sense of the term. This does suggest that the difference between neutral monism and this sort of physicalism may not be so deep after all (see Chalmers 2015 for more on this question).

9. Concluding Remarks

The traditional versions of neutral monism of Mach, James, and Russell reflect the empiricist outlook of their authors. This leads them to turn to experience, when searching for their neutral entities. And this leads us to see their doctrines as tainted by mentalism. Perhaps the traditional neutral monists were wrong to forge this tight link between the neutral entities and experience. Perhaps we are too quick in dismissing their efforts to discover a neutral base in this area. The rising interest in the history of analytic philosophy, the gradual rediscovery of Russell as a metaphysician and epistemologist, and the existence of new work such as Erik Banks’s new study of traditional neutral monism (Banks 2014) hold out some hope for better understanding of traditional neutral monism.

But the fortunes of neutral monism are no longer exclusively tied to the fate of traditional neutral monism. The neutral monist strand within the broader movement of Russellian monism (see section 5.5 above) is a promising new development. Despite invoking Russell’s name, these versions of neutral monism explore fresh ideas that hold out hope for a new life for neutral monism. And some contemporary attempts to revive neutral monism are free of any ties to the traditional versions of the doctrine. Thomas Nagel’s recent defense of neutral monism comes to mind (see section 5.4). And the idea to make abstract entities—information, structure, computation, mathematical reality—into the neutral basis of a metaphysical system is being actively developed by philosophers and scientists alike (see section 5.1).

Until quite recently it seemed that neutral monism (in its traditional form) was a brief and unimportant sideshow on the grand stage of metaphysics. Notwithstanding the fact that the three main protagonists—Mach, James, and Russell—were important figures, whose ideas profoundly influenced many areas of contemporary thought, their speculations about neutral monism seemed to have vanished from the philosophical scene. But the current wave of interest in the traditional versions of neutral monism, as well as the lively development of alternative versions of neutral monism, indicate that neutral monism may, once more, become a live option in the ongoing efforts to explore the metaphysics of mind.

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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Acknowledgments

I would like to thank Donovan Wishon, who taught me much about Russell; Galen Strawson, who has done much to shake my confidence in neutral monism; and an anonymous referee for a set of very useful comments.

Copyright © 2016 by
Leopold Stubenberg <Leopold.Stubenberg.1@nd.edu>

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