Nicolai Hartmann

First published Sun Jul 1, 2012; substantive revision Fri Jan 7, 2022

Nicolai Hartmann (1882–1950) was one of the leading German philosophers of the first half of the twentieth century. Originally a student of Marburg Neo-Kantianism, Hartmann departed from this tradition and spearheaded the resurgence of ontology in the early twentieth century. Hartmann was in many respects a classical philosopher and wrote book-length works scrutinizing and developing all the major fields of philosophy, including the philosophy of history, epistemology, ethics, and aesthetics, although his chief interest was ontology. He held teaching posts in Marburg, Köln, Berlin, and Göttingen, was president of the German Philosophical Association after the second World War, and had a major influence on a generation of German philosophers through his ongoing discussion groups. Hartmann discouraged discipleship by inviting students to think through problems for themselves. Over the last twenty years, after a long period of neglect, his work has been attracting more attention by an international group of scholars. Perhaps unique in the early twentieth century, Hartmann developed a pluralistic, humanistic realism that attempted to do justice to both the sciences and the humanities. Hartmann may be regarded as the first genuine ontological pluralist of the twentieth century.

1. Biographical Sketch

Nicolai Hartmann (b. Riga, 1882, d. Göttingen, 1950) was recognized in the first half of the twentieth century as one of the leading German philosophers, on a par with Husserl, Jaspers, or Heidegger. Born in Riga, in what was then called the Livonia Governorate, a German-speaking part of the Russian Empire (now Latvia), Hartmann was Baltic German, spoke German at home and Russian at school, and at age fifteen went to a German boarding school in St. Petersburg. His engineer father died suddenly when Hartmann was eight years old, but left him with a predilection for both music and astronomy, hobbies that would remain with him throughout his life. After gymnasium in St. Petersburg, he studied medicine for two years in Dorpat (Tartu, Estonia), decided that a more comprehensive course of study would be more satisfying, and switched to studying philosophy and classical philology, again in St. Petersburg. Revolutionary uprisings there led to the closing of the university in 1905. As a Baltic German, he did not see himself directly involved in Russian affairs, and, unwilling to interrupt his studies, he transferred from cosmopolitan St. Petersburg to the landlocked town of Marburg, Germany, to study philosophy with Hermann Cohen (1842–1919) and Paul Natorp (1854–1924), the leaders of what was later to be called the “Marburg School” of Neo-Kantianism.

He completed his degree in summer 1907 with his work “On the Problem of Being in Greek Philosophy before Plato” (Über das Seinsproblem in der griechischen Philosophie vor Plato, Hartmann 1908). His massive “Plato’s Logic of Being” (Platos Logik des Seins) and the shorter “Proclus Diadochus’ Philosophical Foundations of Mathematics” (Des Proklus Diadochus philosophische Anfangsgründe der Mathematik, Habilitation) appeared in 1909. All of these show the imprint of his Neo-Kantian teachers. Probably influenced by reading the phenomenologists, including Edmund Husserl (1859–1938) and Max Scheler (1874–1928); by the rediscovery of Christian Wolff (1679–1754) through the work of Hans Pichler (1882–1958); and finally, by rereading Aristotle, Kant, and Hegel during the period of a general Hegel renaissance, he began to break free of Neo-Kantianism (Harich 2000). While he was teaching in Marburg and publishing a number of shorter works that prefigure his later ideas, he was called to serve in WWI. Starting in 1914, he served as an interpreter and letter-censor. He spent time on the Eastern Front, and then returned to Marburg in 1918. By the time he returned to Marburg, Cohen had left for Berlin and Natorp’s influence was in decline, and he was greeted as their successor. By this time, however, he was also the furthest of any of their former students from the Neo-Kantian position (Harich 2000). Reflecting on his career, he declared 1919 the year he worked out his final approach to a “new ontology.”

He became professor at Marburg in 1920, and then came to occupy Natorp’s Chair in 1922. Hartmann was called to Köln, where Scheler was teaching, in 1924, where he taught until 1931. There he met his second wife, Frida Hartmann (née Rosenfeld), in the “discussion circle” of philosophy students and professors that he hosted at his own home throughout his entire career (Fischer and Hartung 2020). He was appointed professor in Berlin in 1931, as the “safer” choice in contrast to both Heidegger and Cassirer, who were also candidates for the post (Gerhardt et al. 2015). After the Second World War, Hartmann was elected President of the German Philosophical Association for both the acknowledged value of his philosophical ideas and his apparent lack of any improper compromise with Nazism. (For more complete biographical information, see Harich 2000, Heiss 1961, and F. Hartmann 1978.) While Hartmann’s presence and influence were strong during his lifetime, after his death in 1950 his ideas attracted no further attention. It is difficult to determine why things have gone this way. Even researchers of Neo-Kantianism have completely ignored Hartmann’s work, despite his intellectual biography and the fact that his work shares numerous features with both Marburg and Southwestern Neo-Kantianism (see, e.g., Luft 2015; De Warren and Staiti 2015). Although lack of translations into English and the working of “selective memory” (Beiser 2014) have certainly played their part, other reasons are needed to explain this situation. Hartmann has likely been ignored by scholars of Continental philosophy not least because, historically and politically, Heidegger came to dominate German philosophy and was antagonistic to him, seeing the older Hartmann as one of his chief rivals. Concerted historical research is needed to understand this state of neglect.

Like many other philosophers of the time, Hartmann rejected system building as the goal of philosophy, but he embraced a systematic and careful mode of philosophizing. He had a perennial suspicion of ultimate solutions. His open-ended dialogical attitude was not dogmatic, and he did not encourage students to adopt his positions on issues but to think for themselves about topics systematically. This attitude is especially evident in the recently published transcripts of his beloved “disputation circles” (Fischer and Hartung 2020). In his writing, he adopted a non-speculative, sober style of analysis. His language was clear, and his method was rigorous, almost pedantic, proceeding punctiliously step by step, without anticipating solutions or taking anything for granted. His writings are organized in such a way that the reader is held in check and feels unable to foresee the next step in the argumentation. Virtuosic expertise in the history of philosophy is displayed throughout his works.

On the whole, he comes off as a “classical” philosopher in a time when philosophical fashion seemed to demand anything but that. The explosion of philosophical schools and movements in the early twentieth century, eager for novelty and controversy, seemed to have had little tolerance or interest in patient investigations into major traditional problems of philosophy. He was strongly shaped by late nineteenth century Neo-Kantianism and its issues, including the controversies over materialism, the limits of science, historicism (relativism), and pessimism, and was at least inspired by empirically oriented metaphysicians such as Hermann Lotze (1817–1881), August Trendelenburg (1802–1872), and Eduard von Hartmann (1842–1906) (see Beiser 2014). Recent work has also examined the influence of Russian philosophers on him (Tremblay 2017; Tremblay 2019). He thought of himself as a more faithful Kantian than the German Idealists as well as his Neo-Kantian teachers and peers, honored Kant’s memory by taking seriously the claim that that there are some problems that reason cannot solve, but criticized Kant himself for his dogmatic idealist assumptions. Aristotle and Hegel were also major sources of inspiration.

Recent work on Hartmann has shown that he dealt with central twentieth century problems, such as the realism-antirealism debate, the reductionism-pluralism alternative, and with ways to resolve the “two cultures” divide that continues to torment contemporary philosophy (Peterson 2017; Peterson and Poli 2016; Hartung, Wunsch, and Strube 2012). His systematic and novel responses to these problems should be of interest to a contemporary audience, whatever their philosophical pedigree. The establishment of the Nicolai Hartmann Society has shown that scholars interested in Nicolai Hartmann and his ideas are present everywhere, not only in North America and Europe but also in South America and Asia. The proceedings of international conferences on Nicolai Hartmann (Poli, Scognamiglio, Tremblay 2011; Hartung, Wunsch, and Strube 2012; Peterson and Poli 2016; Peterson 2017b; Kalckreuth, Schmieg, and Hausen 2019) and this entry provide information on Hartmann’s thought that may facilitate a renewed evaluation of his contributions to philosophy.

2. Works

Three English translations of major book-length works have appeared within the last ten years, adding to the two existing translations and reissues of New Ways of Ontology (Hartmann 2012b [1953]) and the Ethics (Hartmann 2003, 2004 [1932]), originally published earlier in the twentieth century. Volumes one and two of his ontology, Ontology: Laying the Foundations (2019a [1935]) and Possibility and Actuality (2013 [1938]), as well as the posthumous Aesthetics (2014 [1953]), have been completed. New translations of shorter works include “How is Critical Ontology Possible?” (Hartmann 2012a [1924]), “The Megarian and the Aristotelian Concept of Possibility” (Hartmann 2017 [1937]), an obituary for Max Scheler (Hartmann 2019b [1928]), and Hartmann’s 1914 review of the first volume of Husserl’s Jahrbuch (Hartmann 2018). Other translations will no doubt be produced in the coming years.

English readers have only a handful of book-length treatments of Hartmann’s thought to consult (Peterson and Poli 2016; Poli, Scognamiglio, and Tremblay 2011; Kelly 2011; Werkmeister 1990; Cadwallader 1984; and Mohanty 1957). For German readers, Martin Morgenstern’s Nicolai Hartmann: Zur Einführung (1997) provides a comprehensive, if very brief, introduction, and Wolfgang Harich’s two works Nicolai Hartmann: Leben, Werk, Wirkung (2000), as well as Nicolai Hartmann: Grösse und Grenzen (2002), provide unparalleled insights into the life and work of Hartmann.

While he wrote at length and with significant originality on epistemology, ethics, aesthetics, philosophy of history, natural and social science, and many other topics, Hartmann’s central preoccupation was with developing a new ontology adequate to the changed scientific and humanistic intellectual landscape of the early twentieth century. Since Hartmann himself indicated 1919 as the year he finally broke through to what he called his “new ontology” (Harich 2000, 9), we could divide his voluminous work into two periods: an earlier Neo-Kantian inflected period, and a later period defined by the new ontology. But even this line is difficult to draw cleanly. The published works for his degree referred to above fall clearly into the earlier period, while some early essays, such as “Systematische Methode” (1912) and “Über die Erkennbarkeit des Apriorischen” (1914), already show signs of moving beyond the confines of the Marburg approach. The book Fundamental Philosophical Questions of Biology (Philosophische Grundfragen der Biologie, 1912) also stands out in this period as his earliest attempt to tackle the ontological issues contained in philosophy of biology. Here we will set aside the works of the earlier period.

The inter-war period was the time of his most extensive output. In his 1921 Grundzüge einer Metaphysik der Erkenntnis (Fundamentals of a Metaphysics of Cognition), Hartmann declares his independence from the Marburg school (while occupying the Chair of one of its founders) by challenging one of its central tenets: cognition does not create its objects, as Neo-Kantianism holds, but grasps something that exists independently of it. Put briefly, the Metaphysics of Cognition discusses the interaction between epistemology and ontology and the unavoidable dependence of any epistemology on ontological assumptions. He published his truly magisterial, innovative and comprehensive work on Ethics in 1926, which includes some extensive remarks on the ontology of values in some core chapters (Hartmann 2002–2004). The first volume of the commissioned Die Philosophie des deutschen Idealismus (The Philosophy of German Idealism, on Kant, Fichte, and the Romantics) appeared in 1923. Two very important essays on ontology also appeared in the mid-twenties, “How is Critical Ontology Possible?” (2012 [1924]), and “Kategoriale Gesetze” (“Categorial Laws,” 1926), which are the major precursors of his fully developed ontological views. If we set aside his continued strong output of essay-length work, then between 1926 and 1935 his major publications include Volume 2 of his Die Philosophie des deutschen Idealismus (Philosophy of German Idealism) in 1929, Zum Problem der Realitätsgegebenheit (On the Problem of the Givenness of Reality) in 1931 (reprinted in Hartung and Wunsch 2014, 177–264), as well as Das Problem des geistigen Seins: Untersuchungen zur Grundlegung der Geschichtsphilosophie und der Geisteswissenschaften (The Problem of Spiritual Being: Investigations into the Foundations of the Philosophy of History and the Human Sciences) in 1933. On the Problem of the Givenness of Reality is significant not only because it is revised and incorporated into Part III of Ontology: Laying the Foundations, but because it was originally presented to a meeting of the Kant-Gesellschaft in Halle dedicated to the “turn to ontology and realism in contemporary philosophy” (Hartung and Wunsch 2014, 181). Subsequent to Ontology: Laying the Foundations in 1935, he steadily churned out the remaining volumes of his ontological work, publishing Possibility and Actuality in 1938 (Hartmann 2013), Aufbau in 1940, and he completed the fourth volume Philosophy of Nature in 1943, although it was not published until 1950, after all of the other volumes could be republished after WWII. The Aesthetics, under revision at the time of his death, was posthumously published in 1953 (Hartmann 2014).

Given the vast scope and meticulous reasoning of Hartmann’s work, this entry cannot aspire to adequately present its rich content. But since Hartmann was a problem-oriented thinker, the task will be made easier by discussing the theses of his major works under the headings of the problems with which he was attempting to deal. In the remaining four sections, we will look at Hartmann’s responses to these questions: What is the relationship between thinking and being? What is valuable, and relatedly, what is the place of humankind in the world? What is the structure of the real world? Finally, in the Conclusion, What is Philosophy?, we will also very briefly consider Hartmann’s conception of philosophy in relation to that of his contemporaries.

Since Hartmann organized his bulky books into short chapters, subdivided into sections usually no longer than two or three pages, we follow his method of internal referencing by indicating the relevant chapters and sections. The following abbreviations will be used: ME = Grundzüge einer Metaphysik der Erkenntnis; S = “Systematische Philosophie in eigener Darstellung”; ET1 = Ethics (Volume 1: Moral Phenomena); ET2 = Ethics (Volume 2: Moral Values); ET3 = Ethics (Volume 3: Moral Freedom); P = Problem des geistigen Seins; OLF = Ontology: Laying the Foundations; PA = Possibility and Actuality; A = Der Aufbau der realen Welt; N = Philosophie der Natur; ELO = “Erkenntnis im Lichte der Ontologie”; NW = New Ways of Ontology; and AE = Aesthetics. The chapters of various Introductions will be referred to as “Intro”. For example, “NIntro5” and “N3c” will respectively refer to Section 5 of the Introduction and Chapter 3, Section c of the Philosophy of Nature. (These abbreviations are also included before the bibliography below.)

3. What is the Relationship between Thinking and Being?

Hartmann was committed to approaching the problem of cognition from the perspective of its embeddedness in a broader cognitive and ontological context. Human cognition is in a perpetual state of unrest, dynamically allowing us to get our bearings in an overstimulating environment, to orient ourselves in the world, and to pursue practical projects. It is an active and open process of coming to terms with an environing world in historical time, not an isolated and static epistemological exercise. In our unrest we come up against problems in need of solution. Hartmann was strongly influenced by Kant’s famous claim that experience presents problems that reason is unable to solve, such as the “antinomies” bearing on the origin of the cosmos and of freedom. This is a claim about the limitations of human reason, and more generally, a statement about the relation between thinking and being. Contrary to dogmatic metaphysics, Kant claimed that thinking does not have complete access to being. Our very consciousness that there are problems in reality—not just temporary, episodic problems but perennial, enduring ones—in fact demonstrates this limitation quite clearly. If we begin with the whole “phenomenon of cognition,” as Hartmann did in his groundbreaking epistemological work, and not merely with the narrower relation between subject and object, we see that it includes features such as “problem consciousness” and “cognitive progress.” These complex “facts,” he showed, presuppose that there is an ontological basis for what is cognized. The main point of Metaphysics of Cognition was that epistemological discussions always entail ontological assumptions about the nature of what exists. Determining the minimum set of these assumptions for an adequate account of cognitive phenomena was its task.

In distinguishing himself from his predecessors and peers, Hartmann carefully situated himself between various forms of idealism and exaggerated scientific realism. In contrast to his “logical idealist” teachers, German Idealists like Hegel, and phenomenological idealism, Hartmann thought that human thinking did not have easy access to its own workings, let alone those of the real world, and they certainly did not play the primary role in “constituting” the world. In contrast to naïve realists and positivists, he did not think that human perception and experience provided an unmediated adequate cognition of the world either. Deliberately positioning himself between these forms of idealism and naïve realism, Hartmann produced a “critical” epistemology that based itself on Kantian principles.

As one of the phenomena of cognition, Hartmann took human consciousness of problems very seriously. He believed that in the history of philosophy and science, thinkers arrived at many so-called solutions to problems by means of hasty theoretical assumptions rather than patient investigation. Any philosophy deserving of the epithet “critical” must be able to set aside the assumptions that arise from theoretical “standpoints” that can prejudice an investigation from the start. Critical philosophy, for Hartmann, designates a stance “this side” of idealism and realism, engaging an epoché (suspension) with respect to questionable standpoints. Such standpoints can blind us to seeing what is “transhistorical” in the history of philosophy, as well as to what is “given” in phenomena. The contrast between the historical and the transhistorical is a significant one for Hartmann and shapes much of his thinking. It does not coincide with the traditional contrast between timeless essences and historical particulars, for instance, but cuts across it, as we explain below.

It is already evident in the definition of problems themselves. Three aspects of problems must be distinguished. There is the “statement of the problem” (Problemstellung), its particular and perhaps idiosyncratic characterization; there is the “current state of the problem” (Problemlage), more stable but still historically malleable; and there are the “contents of the problem” (Problemgehalt), including its sometimes nonrational and impenetrable aspects, which are properly “metaphysical.” It is worth quoting at length:

Human beings are the ones who first “state” problems (Problemstellung); they are brought up to see the current state of the problems (Problemlage) in a tradition, but also labor to transform this situation themselves. By no means, however, do human beings have dominion over the contents of problems (Problemgehalt). There is nothing in the problem contents that is a product of human artifice. The problem content is already given along with the overall structure of the world and the place of humankind in it, and something of this content can change only to the degree that the world and humankind also change in their fundamental features. The history of problems does not have to do with the problem contents (Problemgehalt), but only with the stepwise shifting of the current state of the problem (Problemlage) tied to them and the multifariously varying statements of the problems (Problemstellung) within these contours. Problem contents persist identically, while the latter emerge or are submerged historically in unforeseeable variety (ME1b).

Transhistorical “problem contents” could include both real and ideal factors, and only meticulous investigation can determine what these are. Unfortunately, there is no a priori way to determine which is which. While this conception of “problems” is likely influenced by the southwestern Neo-Kantian Wilhelm Windelband (1958 [1893]), this distinction is actually widely applicable throughout Hartmann’s work. The same transhistorical-historical division applies to ethical values as well as to ontological and cognitive categories, though in different ways. In general, it allows Hartmann to take a middle path between the extremes of absolutism and relativism, whether in regard to epistemology, ethics, or to ontology. Investigation of phenomena in all of these areas leads us to see that some core factors are relatively stable, while other elements are culturally and historically variable. This conception of problems sits midway between the Anglo-analytic view that problems like “the mind-body problem” are simply “there” and have nothing historical about them, and a historicist view in which everything about the problem is historical, with no stable problematic factors at all.

Kant’s work inspired this stance on the relation between thinking and being, as we see in Hartmann’s sophisticated interpretation of Kant’s “supreme principle.” Readers will recall Kant’s principle: “the conditions of the possibility of experience in general must at the same time be the conditions of the possibility of the objects of experience” (Kant 1998 [1787], A158/B197). This was Kant’s attempt to formulate a universal basic principle for the relation between thinking and the world. For Kant, this meant that the intersubjectively and objectively valid “forms of intuition” and the “concepts of the understanding,” which science relies on to explain the objects of experience, must be dictated by the mind to the world in its very experience of things. Hartmann argued that this expresses a “restricted identity thesis,” meaning that the principles or conditions of both subject and object are neither completely identical nor completely different. As Hartmann reads it, Kant’s principle is itself entirely “this side” of the distinction between idealism and realism. In other words, it can be interpreted in the direction of placing the conditions of experience inside the subject (Kant’s idealist solution), or both within and beyond the subject in the world (a realist solution). Hartmann claims that Kant’s idealistic interpretation, which makes these conditions internal to the cognizing (transcendental) subject, results from a “dogmatic prejudice.” He believes that a solution that remains faithful to the phenomena of cognition can be proposed that places the principles or conditions of experience not within the subject but within the wider reality of which both subject and object are parts. The at least “partial identity” between subject and object which conditions the possibility of knowledge results from the fact that both subject and object are determined by some shared ontological principles structurally superior to both. In other words, according to Hartmann, in his explanation of valid a priori cognition, Kant relied on a false dichotomy. Either representations are determined by the object, or the object is determined by representations. Hartmann points out that this is not a complete disjunction, and so is false. The third possibility is that both representation and object are determined by a third factor, namely, principles that are valid for both subjects and objects. These principles are what Hartmann calls categories. The partial identity of cognitive and ontological categories, however, must be very carefully delimited. This is the work of categorial analysis, the central task of ontology. Incidentally, many of Hartmann’s responses to Kantian idealism anticipate those of recent “new realists” and “speculative realists” by almost a century (Peterson 2017a).

The methodology that Hartmann recommends reflects the critical stance. In order to avoid precipitous standpoints, an unbiased philosophical inquiry moves through the three main stages of phenomenological, aporetic and theoretical development. The first stage is descriptive and requires the systematic collection of all the available evidence relevant to whatever is under scrutiny. Frequently, descriptions end up in conflicting theses, often in the form of aporias. More than anyone else, Hartmann rehabilitates the value of aporias (see Schlittmaier 2011 and Rescher 2011). Aporias themselves are informative and should not be forced to disappear by fiat, such as an a priori assumption on the overall uniformity of reality or the assumption that we have a direct, transparent access to reality. The last phase of the philosophical method consists in using as few metaphysical assumptions as possible for the systematic theoretical coordination of the results from the first two phases (ME, S). Metaphysical assumptions are necessary for the task of incorporating phenomena and aporias into a framework able to make sense of them. Since metaphysical assumptions are not directly supported by descriptive data, it is advisable to keep them to a minimum, or to assume the weakest possible metaphysical assumptions.

An original way of distinguishing between ontology and metaphysics underlies the third stage of theoretical development. Ontology, for Hartmann, deals with what can be subsumed under at least partially cognizable categories, while metaphysics deals with the nonrational or noncognizable. Two main consequences follow from this view of ontology: firstly, ontology is primarily a theory of categories, in the sense that all ontological distinctions have the form of categories (AIntro1), and secondly, “science” in all its branches (including the human/social sciences) is ontological in all its ramifications (OLF37a), and is the most powerful ally of ontology. This is rather at odds with the mainstream view of science as an eminently epistemological affair (present in positivism, Neo-Kantianism, phenomenology, existentialism, postmodernism, etc.). This is one of the issues on which Hartmann firmly departs from the Neo-Kantian legacy, as well as from the generalized critique of the natural scientific approach in mainstream twentieth century Continental philosophy.

This methodology is already employed in the Metaphysics of Cognition. A phenomenological description that extracts the “essential features” from the phenomenon of cognition would note that: cognizers face off against something to-be-cognized; they attempt to “grasp” that something; they form an “image” (broadly speaking) of that something; the image is somehow “determined” by the something; that something is entirely untouched by the cognizer’s attempt to grasp it; they may or may not be in error about it (truth criterion); cognizers may become conscious of problems surrounding the something; and they may succeed or fail in making cognitive progress regarding them (ME5a-i). From among these factors, take the central feature of “grasping.” The phenomenon of grasping generates an aporia: how does the mind go “out of itself” to grasp a transcendent object? The sense of being faced with something that one did not anticipate or create and that one must now “grasp” is often simply backgrounded by antirealists who claim that the mind unconsciously creates its objects, or is imprisoned in a circle of its own “positings” (ME6a). This is a “skeptical-subjectivistic” resolution to the aporia of grasping that simply ignores rather than does justice to the phenomenon. It fails to distinguish between image and thing; what is currently “objectified” in it; the object and the “transobjective” (currently unknown but knowable); and what may even be “transintelligible” (nonrational) in the thing. Only by retaining the Kantian distinction between object (appearance) and “thing-in-itself” can we account for this central phenomenon of grasping. Far from being irrelevant, Hartmann believes that the thing-in-itself is the “fundamental and eminently critical concept” (ME30a). It is needed to explain the phenomenon of transcendence in the total phenomenon of cognition. Problem consciousness, which entails “knowing that you don’t know,” implicitly recognizes what is transobjective, and possibly transintelligible, in the thing. It implies a relation between the subject as existing knower and something existing independently of it. The phenomenon of cognition overflows the domain of epistemology into ontology.

The mere fact (Faktum) that in problem consciousness and cognitive progress cognition ineluctably extends beyond its limits, and that problem consciousness does not stop at the limits of cognizability, forces us to realize that in general the ontological character of the object overpowers the object-character of being, i.e., that ontological being in itself is concealed behind gnoseological being in itself (ME9f).

In other words, what problem consciousness entails is that objects are always more than “an object for a subject,” and even the natural attitude toward the world takes this for granted. The burden of proof is thus on idealism to show that there is no such thing. This is in fact impossible, since even idealism assumes at the very least that the cognizing subject is something “in itself,” otherwise there is nothing but an infinite regress of representations (ME30b-c). The regress has to stop with something that “is,” and we need ontology to determine what this means.

The question of the section, “What is the relation between thinking and being?”, is thus answered by way of an extensive phenomenology, aporetics, and theory of cognition that clings to the basic aspect of transcendence and grasping, debunking rationalist pretensions to transparently cognize everything. It is not the case that “being is immanent to thinking,” but that “thinking is immanent to being.” “This ontological immanence has the simple meaning of total embeddedness of the rational in a larger sphere of the nonrational, in whose thoroughgoing relations it is completely interwoven and in whose existing determinations it remains interwoven even where a consciousness of these relations does not extend. It is the total embeddedness of thinking and of cognition as a whole in being” (ME35d). It should be noted that Heidegger also demoted cognition to secondary ontological status in Being and Time (§13, 1962 [1927]), and refers there to Hartmann’s book.

In later work, the embeddedness of cognition in a wider network of social, affective, and practical activity is highlighted to an even greater extent, and is further considered in the context of debates over universalism and relativism (or the contrast between “science” and “worldviews”) (e.g., AIntro9–11). Put simply, Hartmann embraces a nonreductive naturalistic interpretation of humankind, recognizing cognition as an adaptive embodied transcendent act embedded in the context of other acts and ontological relationships in the natural and social worlds (ELO). This perspective, including his interpretation of Kant explained above, means that our concepts of categories are human products, and are attempts to grasp stable ontological principles. As such our attempts can be inadequate. Principles themselves may have nonrational elements, since they are transcendent objects too. The partial identity between cognitive and ontological categories is rooted in being, rather than the mind alone, and persistent problems arise from human interaction with the world and each other.

4. What is Valuable? What is the Place of Humankind in the World?

4.1 Ethics

Before we can resolve fundamental problems regarding ethical norms, duties, rights, or happiness, Hartmann argues, we have to ask “what is valuable?” in the first place. The traditional moral question “what ought we to do?”, posed by the Kantian ethics of duty, presupposes the more fundamental axiological question, “what is valuable in life and the world generally?” (ET1Intro5) What is “practical” about ethics is not that it helps us find the means to reach ends, but that it helps us identify the ends of action themselves (ET1Intro3). These ends are values. In the Ethics, the only book to be translated into English in his lifetime, Hartmann rejects the putative subjectivism, formalism, and intellectualism of Kantian ethics, and draws on Aristotelian virtue ethics for inspiration. Although he was mainly influenced by Max Scheler’s Formalism in Ethics (1973 [1916]), which argues for a moral realism of values, Hartmann departs significantly from his approach in many ways (Kelly 2011a; Römer 2012). Hartmann also responded to Nietzsche’s call for a “transvaluation” of values, developed a typology of distinctively Modern values out of Nietzsche’s work, and defined a moderate position between the extremes of value absolutism and value relativism. Like his conception of problems, his conception of values carefully distinguishes between the transhistorical and the historical.

The same kind of argument used in the previous work, which begins with complex “facts” and reasons to their necessary conditions, is used in the Ethics. Hartmann held that the phenomena of moral exemplarity, the idealization of moral types, the phenomena of self-criticism and accountability, conscience, and even the historical dominance of content-oriented virtue theory, all testify to an a priori, intuitive sense for values. But Hartmann does not erect an intuitionism of values out of this. A persistent theme throughout his ethics is that morality is a creative enterprise, that it demands a discerning sense for values and creative efforts at synthesis that engage the whole person. “Ethics applies itself to the creative power in man,” he claims, and it awakens “man’s creative, spontaneous, living sense of what ought to be, of what in itself is valuable” (ET1Intro2). He repeatedly asserts that moral life is life in the midst of conflicts of value, and that these conflicts are almost never cleanly resolved. “Real moral life is not such that one can stand guiltless in it. And that each person must step by step in life settle conflicts, insoluble theoretically, by his own free sense of values and his own creative energy, should be regarded as a feature of the highest spiritual significance in complete humanity and genuine freedom” (ET2 25b).

While a novel axiology constitutes the core of Hartmann’s innovative approach, his treatment of the “problem of freedom” in the last part of the book is also as groundbreaking as it is unique. He dissects the problem of freedom and reveals “personal autonomy” to be a novel form of determination in the world. Rejecting Scheler’s “metaphysical personalism” as resting on a teleological prejudice, Hartmann conceives of human beings as meaning-makers who realize values in action. Their “place in the world” is to bring values into reality which without them would otherwise remain unrealized (ET2 11h). Elsewhere he states that “humankind is the trustee (Sachwalter) of values and of the ought in the real world. Human beings are the intermediary that implements them in actuality” (S 40; P14f). Because aesthetic values and objects are some of the most meaningful and significant for human beings, he also develops an extensive analysis of them in one of his final works.

On reading the Ethics, the overall impression is of a kind of cautious optimism in face of an apathetic and pessimistic Modern culture. Hartmann was familiar with both Nietzsche’s and Scheler’s critiques of ressentiment and Modern culture (Nietzsche 1989 [1887]; Scheler 1994 [1914]), but Hartmann believes that the human sense for values can be cultivated, that we can learn to see the value abundance in the world and our relations to others again, and that we can be creative actualizers of higher values in the world. But to make this possible, what is first needed, counter to the long ethical tradition, is to make the “central task” of ethics “an analysis of the contents of values” (ET1Foreword). Against the formalism and intellectualism of Kantian ethics, it highlights the importance of our affective sense of values; against the relativism and subjectivism of Nietzsche, it shows that there are universal features of value experience and a structure to the domain of values which can give some guidance in prioritizing and synthesizing values in conflict.

Values, for Hartmann, are ideal entities. Mathematical entities and values “exist” in an atemporal way, and have their own determinations. In short, temporality is what radically distinguishes real categories from ideal categories, and apart from temporality, individuality is the second feature distinguishing real being from ideal being. Everything ideal is general, and everything real is individual. Everything real is unique and it exists only once. The general in reality is real only “in” individuals (A37e). Given the thesis that there are at least these two main types of ideal entities, what else is shared by the entities included in the sphere of ideal being? Hartmann considers the following three general features. 1) The overall geography of both mathematical entities and values is unknown. The constant efforts of the best minds and the accumulated experience of humankind have been able to explore some of their territories, and partially to map their landmarks. The overall shape of mathematics and the overall shape of the territory of values, however, are far from being charted. 2) Both the region of mathematical entities and the region of values extend beyond the boundaries of real being. Many mathematical structures are far from being exemplified in reality and some will never be. The same patently applies to values. 3) Both mathematics and ethics claim universality. This is part of their nature as ideal beings. On the other hand, neither mathematics nor ethics are able to capture—from their own point of view—the whole of reality. There is no single mathematical model of the world, and there are no good reasons to believe that there will ever be one. Similarly, there is no single ethical understanding of the whole of human experience, and there are no good reasons to believe that there will ever be one. This last issue is especially important from an ontological point of view, because it shows that the universality of both mathematics and ethics is different from the universality of ontology (Poli 2009a,b).

Nevertheless, an analogous relation between the transhistorical and historical prevails here as in Hartmann’s understanding of problems, and, as we will see, in his understanding of categories. There is a transhistorical content to values that is exemplified in varied cultural and historical contexts and individual actions, in the same way that there is a transhistorical problem content that is addressed by various thinkers in different places and times. In the context of the ethics, Hartmann employs the “spotlight” metaphor to account for the shifting structure of value preferences and value consciousness in different times and places, while value-contents themselves are unchanging. From the whole realm of values, value consciousness “cuts out a little circle of something seen” and this circle “wanders about” the ideal realm of values (ET1 6a; AE27e; Cadwallader 1984). Human beings have affective access to the full range of values, but their cultural ethos only presents them with a limited selection of this range. The individual capacity to “see” values also changes with age and axiological maturity. Groups and communities change by following different guiding values. This latter case shows how historical and social conditions are at work in shaping the territory of accessible values. The interplay between individuals and the groups to which they belong finds moments of stability in the mutually adjusted selection of shared values. Repeated acts of valuation tend to produce stable or fixed orders of individual and social preferences, or ethos, whose guiding values press to be realized. The current “maintenance-loss” model of language acquisition (Black et al. 1998)—which basically means “use it or lose it”—would also seem to apply in the case of cultural value preferences and patterns of valuation. New visions and corresponding behaviors can be rejected, or they may occasionally be accepted and contribute to behaviors shaped by different values.

The second part of Hartmann’s massive tome is comprised of an extensive survey of western values, including ancient Greek, Christian, and Modern values. Valuational conditions in the subject, our sense of agency, and environmental values form the prerequisites for the lasting fulfillment of genuinely moral values. The elementary conditions in the subject are life, consciousness, and personality. The last of these contains a number of values within itself: activity, suffering, strength, freedom, foresight, and purposefulness (ET2 11a-h). The elementary conditions in the object are the goods and situational values, such as environmental conditions, the causal nexus, material possessions, community and family, and social goods (law, language, knowledge, education, and “free-association”). Goods and situations are not moral values, but they are morally relevant, and are the conditions of having moral values at all (ET2 12a-g).

Purposefulness in a way sums up the other conditions in the subject, and also designates a structure of ontological determination unique to humankind, which Hartmann calls the “finalistic nexus.” Our purposefulness is what allows us “to actualize values which without our help would remain unreal” (ET2 11h), and it structures all forms of practical intention, from striving and willing to hoping and taking on attitudes. He defines the finalistic nexus as a three-part structure: 1) affirming or setting up the end in anticipation (which presupposes values and value perception); 2) working backwards from the end to the nearest means leading up to it, and so on, back to the first step; 3) actualizing the end through the series of means in the real temporal and causal order (ET1 20c). In this analysis, finalism is not something opposed to causality, but obviously requires causality, and this “plus” of determination inserts itself into the many-layered causal series. Naturalism misunderstands this because it fails to see purposefulness properly as noncausal (ET1 20e). The significance of this analysis of finalism is decisive for his ethics and philosophical anthropology in general, especially in the discussion of freedom of the will, and is also important because it forms the basis for the critique of teleological metaphysics that Hartmann embraces from the beginning to the end of his career.

The core of his axiological analysis focuses on moral values in the western ethical tradition. He considers a handful of general or fundamental values, including the good, the noble, richness of experience, and purity, before launching into more detailed analyses of three historically dominant clusters of values stemming from ancient Greek, Christian, and Modern morality, all of which continue to carry normative force today. In the Greek group, Hartmann covers justice, wisdom, courage, and self-control, and discusses Aristotle’s theory of the mean with reference to values such as generosity, ambition, and magnanimity. The core value of the Christian group of values is brotherly love. This kind of love is directed at whomever is nearest, to the other person as person (ET2 24a). Truthfulness, reliability, faith, modesty, and humility are other values that fall in this group. In contrast to these historical clusters, there are also values associated with the impulse to transform them, turning against comfort, tradition, and inertia, exhibiting a striving for progress, chasing ideals that go beyond the life of the individual. It is hard to name some values in this third group because they are so new, but Hartmann calls the first value “love of the remotest,” following Nietzsche. It is love for the ideal of humankind as it should be, and knows that ignoring this ideal is wrong. Radiant virtue (Nietzsche’s “schenkende Tugend”; see Nietzsche 2006) is connected to the present. It is the sense of spiritual fullness, imparting to others spiritual goods, an overflowing ability to share, to broadcast values, and the delight in so doing. “Personality” is the sense that each person has a unique character and complex ideal personality that they “ought” to approximate as best they can. It is a new norm for the person. The singularity of personal behavior is as much an “ought” as is the universal ought. His descriptions and discussions of many of the values considered central to western morality, especially of the Modern ethos (ET2 30e-33f), are fascinating and worth sustained attention.

Hartmann also discusses the structure of the value realm that we can discern, even if we cannot map it in its entirety. Two organizing principles of the value domain are especially important: that of strength and that of height. The strength of a value is indicated by the gravity of its violation, while the height of a value is expressed in the merit deriving from its fulfillment. These two principles operate in opposite directions: the strongest values are also the lowest values, while the highest values are the least strong ones. Usually, lower values are simpler (that is, they possess less intuitable content) while higher values are more complex. The laws of strength and height have significant consequences, the two most important of which are the following: 1) violating a lower value is a more serious offense than violating a higher value; 2) fulfilling a higher value is a greater good than fulfilling a lower value. In Hartmann’s words, “sinning against lower values is ignominious, shameful, revolting, but their fulfillment only reaches the level of decency, without rising above it. Offending against higher values, by contrast, does indeed have the character of moral failure, but nothing of the directly degrading, while fulfillment of these values may have something uplifting, liberating, indeed thrilling about it” (ET2 28e). Offending against life is a grave offense, while respecting it has very little merit. But the fulfillment of spiritual goods is a merit much greater than the merit corresponding to respect for more elementary goods, such as environmental goods. If the architecture of values is based on levels of dependence, then the ethos of a person whose behavior is oriented to a higher value, but who does not simultaneously respect the values that support it, is structurally discordant. The higher values to which she refers are not sustainable. Loving with distrust or giving with cowardice are not authentically virtuous behaviors (ET2 63f). A pattern of valuation is constructed step by step from the most elementary levels upwards.

Value antinomies and conflicts also structure the domain of values. Some typical conflicts include that between justice, which demands the same treatment for all, and personal love, which demands special treatment for one individual. The value of personality stands in antinomic relation to universal values like justice and brotherly love, both of which demand a certain kind of equality. There are various forms of contrast, not just antinomy proper. The clash between universal and personal, and between present and future are others, and in a way all values conflict with each other in concrete situations (ET2 36g). In light of these clashes, a frequent source of error is fetishizing one value at the expense of others, leading to the tyranny of a single value. Fanaticism of justice which attacks love, fanaticism of love which leads to self-sacrifice, fanaticism of love of the remote which becomes a hatred of the present (Nietzsche) are some typical cases. In a way, every value taken to an extreme is a danger, so avoiding extremes through synthesis is crucial. “Only a sense of justice which is at the same time loving, only a brotherly love which also considers the far distant, only a pride which would likewise be humble, could be valid as an ideal of moral conduct” (ET2 36g). He goes so far as to say that values reach fulfillment only in synthesis with others.

The ever-present conflicts of values are also a condition of personal freedom, because no decision would be needed if there were no conflict (ET3 16e). Hartmann’s analysis of freedom covers the various senses of autonomy exposed by Kant’s ethical theory, but adds another layer that responds directly to the problem of value conflict. Because the actual ethical existence of the person is “higher” than values, freedom is incompatible with complete determination of the person by a higher principle—whether god, duty, or even values (ET3 16f). Freedom cannot bear the form of an ought at all. Interestingly, Hartmann was clear about this long before Sartre. Freedom has to be regarded as a plus of determination in face both of natural law and of moral law, ontological and axiological determination (ET3 16g). By our actual initiative we decide actual conflicts, and “personal autonomy” is the person’s capacity to endorse values, to transform a value into one’s own determinant, to commit or not to commit oneself to a value, and values are impotent without our commitment to them. We are the mediators of the ought in reality, and only personal commitment to them can bring them to actualization (ET3 17c). This explicitly opposes any simple intuitionism about values.

As readers may have noted, this position on freedom resonates with later existentialist thinking, and like it, levelled devastating arguments against any form of metaphysics that imposed any form of determination on humankind. Hartmann’s critique of teleological metaphysics is one example of this (ET1 21b-d). The anthropomorphic roots of cosmic teleology stem from our own purposefulness. Its anthropomorphism is philosophically expressed in the assertion of the primacy of axiological determination in the universe over ontological determination. While the finalistic nexus is a phenomenon of our structure, it cannot be generalized to the structure of the universe, or we would overturn the basic ontological structure of the real world, and this “metaphysical humanization of the Absolute is the moral annulment of man” (ET3 21d). Hartmann claims that if the cosmos were teleologically oriented toward the good, then there would be no place for what makes humankind unique in it. Hartmann considers “deliverance from the nightmare of teleology” to be one of the chief accomplishments of Modern philosophy, because with such a metaphysics genuine morality becomes impossible (ET3 5e). By restricting finalism to its proper place, ethics rehabilitates humankind, recognizing its limited but also weighty cosmic significance.

4.2 Aesthetics

If the “place” of humankind is to give meaning to the world, then meaning-giving through the arts has to be examined. In the arts, humankind achieves some of its most significant instances of endowing the world with meaning. Hartmann says that “the bestowal of meaning that comes into human life via aesthetic values consists fundamentally in nothing other than in the convincing feeling of standing face-to-face before something of absolutely intrinsic value—before something for whose sake alone it would be worth living, regardless of how the conditions of one’s life stand otherwise” (AE35b).

As in the ethics and epistemology, one of the main features of Hartmann’s aesthetics is its close interplay with ontology. Hartmann intentionally focuses his aesthetics on the problem of the aesthetic object, and sets aside investigation of the correlated acts. Hartmann distinguishes two “strata” in the aesthetic object, which he calls the foreground and the background. In his words, “the aesthetics of today still concentrates mainly on analysis of the act, and this is why the stratification relationship [in the object], although it has often been noted, is not yet familiar to it” (P47a). The foreground is comprised of the real, concrete and sensible dimensions of the object, everything that is independent of the presence of a subject who beholds the object and seeks to understand it. The background strata vary with the kinds of content the foreground lets appear, and the background exists only for the subject who grasps it. This level is typically organized into many distinct sub-levels. A theory of this kind obviously raises two questions: first, how do we articulate the relationship between the two levels? Second, how do we articulate the relationship among the sublevels of the background stratum? In response to the first question, Hartmann describes a “relationship of appearance” on the basis of which—as has been pointed out on innumerable occasions—the foreground (i.e., the matter of the object) imposes constraints on the background. Most important for the definition of aesthetic values is to realize that these values attach to the “relation of appearance” itself. In other words, the aesthetic values that fall under the general heading of “beauty” are defined as values that are carried by the “appearance relation” that emerges between some materially existing “foreground” of the object and some unreal “background” that exists only for the beholder. The skill of the artist consists in manipulating this relation of appearance. Aesthetic values are different from moral or vital values in that they do not attach to an existing thing, but exist only for a subject who appreciates aesthetically; they are values of the object as (intentional) object, independently of reality or unreality; they are tied to the relation of appearance itself; and they are values specific to each object and unique to it (AE4c). In all cases, values like beauty, the sublime, the graceful, charming, idyllic, or sweet, as well as all species of the comical, such as farce, the ridiculous, funny, and humorous, are tied to the relation of appearance and specific to each object. Notably, Hartmann completely revises Kant’s definition of the sublime, detaching it from the transcendental, the realm of the quantitative, and the oppressive, and implants it into the natural and human, terrestrial and nearby, fixing it in the object and a “psychic need of the human heart” (AE31b). It is rooted in the “attraction of the human heart to what is magnificent” (AE31c), and our human desire to bring meaning into life. The sublime is a form of beauty that responds to the human need for greatness. “It is that specific appearing of an unsensed background in a real sensed foreground of the object, which accommodates the needs of man for greatness, and, with the greatest ease, overcomes any resistance opposed to it” (AE31c). It is also noteworthy that Hartmann treats both comedy and music at far greater length in the Aesthetics than most other authors of comparable works in the history of philosophy.

That part of the theory which concerns the typical stratification of the background is completely original. In response to the second question above, the answer is that different aesthetic objects display different articulations of the background stratum. In the case of literary works, for example, Hartmann distinguishes at least six different levels for more sophisticated genres like epic narratives or novels, while other genres have fewer levels. This applies to lyrical poems, for example, whose expressiveness is articulated into fewer levels because of the constraints imposed on the admissible expressive forms. Hartmann cites the portrait as an example of a visual aesthetic object. He distinguishes the following levels in its background stratum: the three-dimensional space in which the subject of the portrait and some elements of the setting appear; the movement of the subject’s apparent corporeality; the subject’s character; their individual idea, or the idea that the person portrayed has of themselves; the symbolic, or the universal content manifested by the portrait. His discriminating and extensive analyses of works by Beethoven, Shakespeare, Ibsen, and Rembrandt, among many others, are worthy of close consideration by theorists, as is the entire theory.

As in the ethics, Hartmann again reminds readers of what the analysis teaches us about the place of humankind in the world. “If man with his powers, his sense of values, and his occasional capacity for realizing values, is capable of bestowing meaning and value, then precisely the senselessness of the world as a whole obtains a meaning for him. […] A world that, without man, was already filled with meaning would render him superfluous even despite his gifts for bestowing meaning” (AE35a). Both the ethics and aesthetics entail a unique philosophical anthropology that inserts humankind into the complex stratified structure of the world.

4.3 Anthropology

Fischer has argued that Hartmann should be counted among the members of a “Cologne Constellation” of thinkers whose main project was the development of a philosophical anthropology that combined serious reflection on human being as a biological creature with the findings of the human sciences and humanities (Fischer 2012). Max Scheler, Helmuth Plessner (1892–1985), Hartmann, and later, Arnold Gehlen (1904–1976), are included in this group. They all shared the desire to bridge the dualism between natural scientific and humanistic accounts (Scheler 1928, Plessner 1928, Gehlen 1940). They knew each other’s work, and their mutual influences remain to be disentangled. While Hartmann did not write a book devoted to philosophical anthropology, his ideas on the topic are scattered throughout a number of works, including The Problem of Spiritual Being (1933), OLF (1935), a long review of Gehlen’s book (1941), and “Naturphilosophie und Anthropologie” (1944). Characteristically, Hartmann’s view rejects both reductive naturalistic accounts as well as the anthropocentric exceptionalism that characterizes many idealist humanistic views. In The Problem of Spiritual Being, Hartmann explains that the category of the “spirit” is divided into personal, objective and objectivated spirit. Personal spirit is the spirit of the individual; objective spirit is the living spirit of communities; and objectivated spirit characterizes the products of spirit. As he also explained in the Ethics, the categorial features of personal spirit are consciousness, will, foresight and teleological activity. None of these features pass to objective spirit. There is no consciousness apart from individual consciousness, and the same applies to the other capacities. He thus rejects the idealist conception of a unifying absolute spirit. In order to ward off materialist reductionism, he embraces a nonreductive naturalism that acknowledges the ontological dependence of higher functions on lower processes without detriment to the autonomy and novelty of the higher. He carefully works to reconcile the disparate facets of the human phenomenon, such as the fact that human beings are vanishing specks of dust in a vast cosmos as well as the only beings capable of creating masterpieces of art that give meaning to the world. Human beings are ontologically stratified creatures, including physical, biological, mental, and spiritual features that reflect the stratified structure of reality. Hartmann’s anthropological ideas have gotten a good deal of attention in recent research (Kalckreuth et al. 2019; Hartung and Wunsch 2014), and could also form an intriguing starting point for comparison between Hartmann and other writers, such as McDowell (Wunsch 2020). The nature of the stratified ontology of the real world on which it is based remains to be explained.

5. What is the Structure of the Real World?

Hartmann claims in Ontology: Laying the Foundations (1935) that the book “form[s] the prelude to an ontology that I have been working on for two decades,” and that “[a] new critical ontology has become possible. The task is to make it a reality” (v). The book paved the way for a systematic treatment of ontology by introducing (1) the difference between modes of being (the modalities of possibility, necessity and actuality), spheres of being (real and ideal), and ways of being (Dasein and Sosein), as well as (2) a treatment of emotional transcendent acts as constituting the requisite pre-conceptual acquaintance with the harshness of reality. The main thesis put forward by Hartmann in Laying the Foundations is that all ontological differences are categorial articulations of being, not differences between being and non-being. Parts and wholes are both authentic aspects of being; independent and dependent entities are similarly aspects of being; physical, biological, psychological and spiritual types of being are all manifestations of being, and none of them is “more being” than any other. From the point of view of ontology, no part, aspect, or moment of reality is “more being” than any other part, aspect or moment of it. The fact that, say, the existence of biological entities depends on that of physical entities does not imply that physics is “more ontologically real” than biology. Existentially dependent entities are as ontologically genuine as existentially independent ones. This basic premise is one of the points of departure for his ontological pluralism. All entities, whatever their type, demand the same careful ontological scrutiny. Hartmann’s analytic development of ontology begins with the theory of ontological modalities elaborated in Possibility and Actuality. The main purpose of this book is to demonstrate that modalities ground the differences between the two principal spheres of being (real and ideal) and the two secondary spheres of being (knowledge and logic). Finally, The Structure of the Real World and Philosophy of Nature present in detail the many fundamental and special categories within the real sphere of being.

Given his unique reading of Kant, “categories” become the central theme of Hartmann’s ontology. Hartmann’s theory of categories entirely breaks with Kant’s or Hegel’s theories of categories by explicitly denying that categories are concepts. While we need concepts in order to refer to categories, concepts never capture categories entirely, just as our “images” of objects never capture “what exists” entirely.

Categories deal with what is universal and necessary (AIntro12). Categories articulate in particular the Sosein (“being-such-and-such-a-way”) of entities; they specify configurations, structures and contents, not forms of existence (AIntro7). Categories specify the fundamental determinations of being, and are “principles” of being. As fundamental determinations of being, categories form the interior of entities, so to speak. In this sense, categories are immanent to the world, and do not form a second world (A16b). The categorial interior of entities can be viewed in terms of a core-periphery organization: the most fundamental categories structure the innermost core of entities, while other categories, such as scientific ones, add progressively more superficial layers. Ontological categories are the most fundamental, and form the network of internal, dynamic determinants and dependencies which articulate the furniture and structure of the world. Categories do not form a homogeneous continuum, but appear to be organized in groups (AIntro15). Some categories belong to all the spheres of being (ideal and real), some to the entire real world, others to a specific stratum of reality. The first group of categories, “modal categories,” is analyzed in detail in Possibility and Actuality; the second group, “fundamental categories,” is covered in The Structure of the Real World, while the third group, “special categories,” is explored in the Philosophy of Nature and other works. Fundamental categories include (1) categories organized in pairs of opposites, such as principle-concretum, element-complex, and form-matter; (2) strata categories, such as those that distinguish inanimate, living, psychological, and spiritual beings; and (3) the categories of intercategorial connections, or the group of categorial laws, such as the laws of coherence, stratification, and dependence among categories.

We come to know ontological categories through the objects that we come to know. However, our knowledge of ontological categories is even more provisional than our knowledge of objects. The difference between knowing objects and knowing categories explains why ontological categories are often confused with concepts. The problem is that categories do not allow direct acquaintance as objects do. Concepts are names of ontological categories, which implies that concepts are partial, static, separate representations of items that in themselves are both essentially dynamic and inseparable from other ontological categories. Like the knowledge of objects, the knowledge of ontological categories also changes—when ontology develops, our understanding of ontological categories develops as well, so that we gain a deeper and better grasp of their articulation and subtleties. Some categories have countless variations, others only a few minor ones. The most general and schematic categories are those with the most meager content, and they are therefore those that change least (A27b).

The two main aspects of categories are their generality and their character of determination. This second feature is what makes them principles. Principles exhaust themselves in this determining role. They only exist for something else; they are something only with respect to the concretum that they determine and are in. Principles are nothing without their concretum, and the concretum cannot exist without its principles (A1a; 6b; 16b; and elsewhere). The ontological aspect of the categories consists in some kind of determination of their concreta. Categories as principles are independent from their concreta, but not from other categories (A11c). Principles imply one another, and all the categories characterizing a stratum of reality work together (A15c). Categories are far from being the only principles of entities. There are also highly particular principles structuring specific domains of being—such as natural laws or psychological laws—which are concreta with respect to general categories (A25f). There is a gradation of principles from the most general categories to specific real cases. Empirical laws are concreta with respect to general principles, and they are principles with respect to individual instances.

5.1 Fundamental Categories

Among fundamental categories, paired categories are the most general structural elements of being. As structural elements they have content, and there are composite relations among them (A23b). Hartmann organizes the various pairs into two groups of six pairs, without claiming that the list of paired oppositions is exhaustive. The first group includes principle-concretum, structure-modus, form-matter, inner-outer, determination-dependence, quality-quantity; the second group includes unity-manifoldness, harmony-conflict, opposition-dimension, discreteness-continuity, substratum-relation, element-complex. There is no intrinsic order among the pairs (A24a). It is apparent that some of these are easier to grasp than others. To provide a sample of Hartmann’s analysis, we now briefly describe two of the pairs, principle-concretum and element-complex (for more details see Werkmeister 1990, Poli 2011a, and A sections).

Principle-Concretum: Concretum for Hartmann is what is determinate, that in which categories are embedded as their determinations. The concretum is not limited to real entities, but includes ideal ones as well. Furthermore, the concretum for Hartmann is not to be understood as limited to the individual instances of a principle because there can be different levels of concreta. For instance, strata categories are concreta with respect to general categories. In this case, both the concretum and its principles are categories. Real categories contain all the universal determinations of their concreta; they contain what is needed for the structure of the concreta. A complete system of categories—not the incomplete one we are able to grasp—completely determines its concreta (A4a). As natural laws exist only in the real processes of nature and are nothing outside of them, so real categories exist only as structural relations within the real world and are nothing in themselves (A16c). The principle-concretum form of determination is only one among a variety of types of determination, and in no way is it the most relevant in the real world. In fact, each real level has its own specific types of determination, such as the specific linear nexus (causal, final, etc.) that unifies the phases of the processes that unfold within and between concreta. In sum, principles are that through which the concretum is (partially) grasped. They are the archai of the concretum, the condition of its possibility or that on which the concretum rests. They have unconstrained validity for all the concreta that fall within their range (A27c).

Element-complex: Complexes are relational entities. In Philosophy of Nature, Hartmann explains that he prefers the term “complex” (Gefüge) to the “worn out” (verbrauchten) term “system” (N38c). The elements of a complex are its members, not substrata, and elements are determined by the complex of which they are members (A25c). Complexes have their own type of determination, and in each case the determination extends across the complex’s elements and transforms them. A complex of elements is always a complex of relations and determinations. Elements are essentially determined by the positions they occupy within the complex’s total series of relations (A33a). This explains why elements have functions within the complex. Within a complex, what matters are not the elements, but the relations that they maintain among themselves and with the complex. An irregularly shaped stone, a grain of sand, a puddle, a mountain are not independent complexes, but fragments and parts of larger formations that come into existence before them and within which they exist as subordinate moments (A33c). All natural complexes are complexes of forces and processes, but physical complexes and organisms are different. The inside of the complex of processes that constitutes an organism is the capacity of the complex to maintain its working conditions—what Hartmann calls the self-determination of the organism (A34c), while a physical complex maintains its dynamic stability through equilibrium with its exterior.

Readers might have noted that while the principle-concretum pair seems to cover some of the terrain of the old distinction between essence and existence, it does not entirely coincide with it. Hartmann rejected those terms in favor of a more accurate distinction between Sosein (“being-such-and-such-a-way”) and Dasein as “ways of being.” Dasein and Sosein can be approximately understood as existence and determination. Both real and ideal entities have both Sosein and Dasein. Mathematical entities and values “exist” in an atemporal way, for example, and have their own determinations. While the general is a dominant category in the ideal sphere and a subordinate category in the sphere of the real, individuality is a category of the sphere of real being only. In the realm of ideal being there is no individual. Ultimately, what rigorously distinguishes the real from the ideal spheres themselves are the different “intermodal relations” of necessity, possibility, and actuality in each. In Possibility and Actuality, a book which still awaits close scrutiny by researchers, Hartmann argues for some of his most startling claims.

Rejecting the Aristotelian notion of “partial possibility” on which most conceptions of possibility are based, Hartmann embraces a “Megarian” conception of “real possibility.” Hartmann examines the differences between “real possibility” and “essential [or ideal] possibility,” “real necessity” and “essential [or ideal] necessity,” among others, and argues that paradoxically the possible, the actual, and the necessary coincide in the real world (Hartmann 2017 [1937]; PA16b-c). In other words, the real world is fully determinate, and whatever is possible is possible within the bounds of the actual world. (Peruzzi 2001 considers the relation between Hartmann’s view of modality and “possible worlds” semantics.)

The ways of being Sosein and Dasein are also in a sense relative, or positional. Hartmann presents their positional alternation this way: the Dasein of a tree is the Sosein of a forest (OLF19a); i.e., without the existing tree the content of the forest would be different. Similarly, the Dasein of the branch is the Sosein of the tree, the Dasein of the leaf is the Sosein of the branch, and the Dasein of the vein is the Sosein of the leaf. Things can be inverted, too: the Sosein of the leaf is the Dasein of the vein; the Sosein of the branch is the Dasein of the leaf, etc. The Dasein-Sosein series has two limits: towards the first, original Dasein and towards the last Sosein, the Sosein of the whole of reality. The mainstream interpretation of Dasein and Sosein, or existence and essence, as entirely separate aspects of being, depends on epistemological acts of isolation. Only when aspects are separated do independent substances and dependent qualities appear, and it is for this reason that it seems that qualities do not have any Dasein and, complementarily, that their bearers have no Sosein (OLF20c). This is just one of the novel and transformative findings in Hartmann’s ontological analysis that overcomes difficulties with the traditional contrast between essence and existence.

5.2 Strata

These are only some of the fundamental categories and articulations that structure the real world. It is not just the theory of categories, but the theory of strata (“levels of reality”) that distinguishes Hartmann’s ontology. Like everything else, strata of reality are characterized by their categories. By definition, the categories characterizing strata of reality are not general, in the sense that they do not pertain to reality in its entirety, but only to specific domains of real being. On the other hand, fundamental categories are the most general and simple categories, and for this reason they are contained in the special categories of all of the strata (A21b). Strata are the true structuring framework of the real world. While the latter has unity, its unity is the unity of neither a principle nor a center. The unity of the real world is instead provided by the structure and order of the strata (A52a).

Four main strata of reality are distinguished by Hartmann: the inanimate, the biological, the psychological or mental, and the spiritual. This last includes all historical realities (history, language, customs, law, art, etc.). The underlying observation is that the structure and the laws of history and other spiritual processes are different from the structure and laws of, say, inanimate beings, but the former are not in any way less real than the latter (A20a). The same applies to the other strata as well: biological and psychological processes are as real as any other process, and they have their own specific groups of categories. Ontology must be pluralistic.

One of the most intriguing aspects of Hartmann’s theory of strata is the question of what kinds of relation connect the strata to each other. Two general relations seem to govern strata relations, and these are further specified by the “categorial laws.” The two basic relations between strata are termed relations of superformation (Überformung) and superposition (Überbauung) (A51f). Consider the superformation between molecules and cells, i.e., between the physical and the biological levels of reality. It accounts for the fact that even if organisms are unquestionably more complex than mechanisms, the behavior of organisms is in conformity with laws of mechanics (A51b). At the same time, mechanical regularities are superformed by being incorporated into organic ones. The relation between the psychological and spiritual levels is different, because they are characterized by an interruption in the categorial series and by the onset of a new categorial coherence. The relations between the biological and the psychological stratum, on the one hand, and the relation between the psychological and the spiritual stratum, on the other, are both relations of superposition. The group of categories embedded in psychological entities is different from the group of categories embedded in biological entities. Similarly, the group of categories embedded in spiritual entities is different from the group of categories embedded in psychological entities.

Hartmann specifies analytically the laws that govern the various levels of reality and their connection (for a short introduction see NW; for a summary of the laws, see Poli 2011a and Peterson 2012). The laws of validity concern the scope of the validity of categorial principles (A43a), and the laws of coherence concern the holistic character of each stratum (A45b). If we take a simple organism as object of inquiry, for example, biological categories rather than physical or mental ones are primarily valid, and these saturate the organism with specifically organological forms of determination, no more (such as teleology) and no less (such as physical causality). Moreover, if we claim that metabolism belongs to a proper understanding of the organism, then aspects of every other category of organic life are entailed in it as well, codetermining and ingredient in it. With these two sets of principles, he has covered the internal coherence and determination within a stratum. These laws together imply a degree of incommensurability of categorial domains to one another, but given the all-pervasiveness of the fundamental categories, this substantive incommensurability is never total. Relations between different strata are captured in the last two sets of structural laws.

The laws of stratification can be summed up in four key terms: recurrence, modification, novelty, and distance. Some lower categories recur in higher strata as partial aspects of higher categories, and every recurring category is modified in its recurrence. Whenever a lower element is taken into the higher it is affected by its new place in relation to others in the new stratum. These two principles constitute a vertical interconnectedness of the strata. While the categories of causality and substance, for example, appear to us initially in discussion of physical things, they recur modified in the domain of the organic. Because categories are not simples but complexes of factors, some of those factors may remain stable while others are modified, constituting the recurrence of the same but non-identical category. These recurrences have to be shown in each case, and one of the tasks of categorial analysis is tracing the modifications of a single category throughout the strata. Next, every stratum contains is own unique and novel categories that are not present in the lower stratum, nor are they a sum of them. Finally, recurrence, modification, and novelty imply that there is not a continuous series of levels, but gaps or incisions between them. The last two laws of novelty and distance are what give the impression of the ontological irreducibility of the strata (A50b). For instance, while the category of metabolism in the organic may necessarily incorporate some aspects of linear causal process, it is itself a distinctive kind of process that is irreducible to them. Thus, recurrence and novelty respectively reflect the aspects of continuity and discontinuity among the strata. Categorial novelty inserts an incision or cut into the apparent continuum of categories, creating a distance or gap between strata. The laws of dependence can also be summed up in four terms: strength, indifference, matter, and freedom. The “fundamental categorial law” of strength says that the lower categories on which higher strata depend are conditions or fundaments, while the higher are weaker. The lower are indifferent to whether anything higher builds on them or not, since their vocation is not to serve the higher. As “matter,” the lower categories, if incorporated into higher levels, constrain what the higher may do with them but do not determine it. Lastly, the higher always has leeway despite its weakness and dependence on the lower (A55d). Laws of dependence help to characterize superposition relations. They organize the order of the strata, so that the spiritual level is founded on the psychological level, which in its turn is founded on the biological one. Conversely, the biological level is the bearer of the psychological level and the latter is the bearer of the spiritual level.

5.3 Special Categories

After covering the modal categories that allow us to distinguish between ideal and real spheres in PA, and exhaustively covering fundamental categories and categorial laws in A, Hartmann covers the special categories of the two lower strata in N. Hartmann had already worked out a number of special categories belonging to the higher strata in earlier work, including the Ethics and the Problem of Spiritual Being. Philosophy of Nature examines the ontological dimensions and categories of the cosmological, physical, and biological sciences of his day. Paul Feyerabend, while otherwise critical of Hartmann, praises Hartmann for developing a coherent “philosophy of process” in this book (Feyerabend 1963, 101). In it, Hartmann declares that “mathematical physics deals with reality qua measurable, not with reality as such” (N24), and further develops his complex systems conception of living things. Hartmann’s work in these areas was influential for scientists like Konrad Lorenz (1903–1989) and Ludwig Bertalanffy (1901–1972), who explicitly refer to him. I’ll summarize the special categories of the strata here before closing with a few open questions about specific aspects of Hartmann’s ontology.

The lowest stratum of material or physical reality includes, for example, the categories of corporeality, space, time, process, substance, causality, reciprocity, and dynamic structure and equilibrium (N1–44). Next, organic beings embody a peculiar organic structure defined in terms of adaptability, purposiveness, metabolism or self-regulation, self-restoration, reproductive fitness, and hereditary constancy and variation (N45–64). In agreement with Scheler and the work of many ethologists (Scheler 2009 [1928]), it is widely recognized that many types of animals possess a mental life. This psychological or mental stratum includes awareness, unconscious processes, pleasure and pain, conditioned learning, habit, associative memory, communication, emotional response, problem-solving intelligence, and the categories of rigid social relations (NW). The stratum of spiritual capacities includes the power of conceptual thought, knowledge acquisition, ideal relations, moral evaluation and values, symbolic communication, teleological reasoning, personality, and all of the categories of the complex and variable social relationships evinced by humanity. Historical reality and culture, or objective and objectivated spirit, form the immediate context for a characteristically human existence (NW; P). Human beings are the most vulnerable entities, the most conditioned and dependent; but they have knowledge, they can consciously adapt, and they can use other entities for their own purposes (A56b, d, 60a; ELO). The strata laws described above specify why none of these strata is explanatorily reducible to another.

In recent literature, a number of questions have arisen about Hartmann’s theory of stratification. One concerns the borderline between psychological and spiritual strata. Hartmann himself acknowledges that the distinction between the psychological and the spiritual levels is problematic. Hartmann vacillates as to the delimitations of what is properly psychological. He assigns language, consciousness, and foresight alternatively to the psychological level or to the personal level of the spirit. He even claims that the same acts of consciousness pertain to both psychic and spiritual being and that only an exact clarification of the phenomenon of mental acts may solve the aporia. Some authors have attempted to clarify these relations (Scognamiglio 2011), while others have pointed out that the overall architecture of the theory of strata of reality, or the relations among the biological, the psychological and spiritual levels, may need to be revised. Put briefly, if the psychological level ends up including what psychology and cognitive sciences acknowledge as psychological phenomena, the dividing line between the psychological and the spiritual levels should be located elsewhere, and what Hartmann calls personal spirit will become the higher layer of the psychological level. The reorganization suggested enables construction of an entirely different architecture of the three levels, one that passes from a strictly linear organization (one level after the other) to a non-linear, “triangular” architecture, which would be a major departure from Hartmann’s original framework (Poli 2001; for other proposals, see Kleineberg 2016, Dziadkowiec 2011).

Another question regarding stratification that even Hartmann faced during his lifetime was how this stratified scheme bears on the question of emergence (or “supervenience”). Hartmann himself explicitly refused to present an emergentist theory, and characteristically, he left the question whether an “evolutionary” account of the emergence of strata could be provided entirely open (NW10). Consequently, it has been argued that attempts to treat Hartmann’s ontology as emergentist are flawed by their conflation of the granular or hierarchical series of entities, as in a mereological hierarchy, with the series of strata themselves (Dahlstrom 2012; Peterson 2016).

6. Conclusion: What is Philosophy?

As mentioned above, Hartmann’s philosophical style presented a strong contrast with that of his peers. Philosophy for Hartmann was a critical, systematic, analytical investigation into the fundamental problems of existence. It meant rejecting ready-made standpoints, ungrounded speculation, system-building, and extreme, improbable conclusions. He claimed that “the prerequisite of systematic thinking is the purity of the philosophical ethos,” which is “perseverance in investigation, patient waiting, capacity to remain suspended in uncertainty,” the “genuine dianoetic virtue of the philosopher” (S 5–6). Utilizing the methods of phenomenology and aporetics before passing to theory, critical ontology is the desideratum for systematic philosophy (S 51). Philosophy is not about committing to a single monolithic standpoint or theory and looking at every human problem through its narrow lens. It is not system-building speculative idealism (German Idealism), an epistemology of the sciences (positivism), logical idealism (Marburg Neo-Kantianism), transcendental phenomenology (Husserl), universal hermeneutic phenomenological ontology (early Heidegger), theory of worldviews (Dilthey), philosophy of life (Bergson), or metaphysical personalism (Scheler). All of these theoretical standpoints invariably commit the chief fallacy, identified by Hartmann, of attempting to use one set of categories to explain the entirety of the real world (Peterson 2012). Hartmann’s articulated and robust categorial ontology leaves room for the fantastic diversity and abundance of the world, provides a satisfying nonanthropocentric humanist account of the place of humankind in the cosmos, and has even inspired a recent comprehensive approach to environmental philosophy (Peterson 2020). There is much to be learned from Hartmann’s work, and this article only scratches the surface.


The following abbreviations were used:

Abbreviations for works in German

A = Der Aufbau der realen Welt
ELO = “Erkenntnis im Lichte der Ontologie”
ME = Grundzüge einer Metaphysik der Erkenntnis
N = Philosophie der Natur
P = Problem des geistigen Seins
S = “Systematische Philosophie in eigener Darstellung”

Abbreviations for works cited in English translation:

AE = Aesthetics
ET1 = Ethics (Volume 1: Moral Phenomena)
ET2 = Ethics (Volume 2: Moral Values)
ET3 = Ethics (Volume 3: Moral Freedom)
NW = New Ways of Ontology
OLF = Ontology: Laying the Foundations
PA = Possibility and Actuality

The chapters of various Introductions were referred to as “Intro”. For example, “NIntro5” and “N3c” refer to Section 5 of the Introduction and Chapter 3, Section c of the Philosophy of Nature.

Primary Sources

Original Works in German

  • 1908, Über das Seinsproblem in der griechischen Philosophie vor Plato, Dissertation, Marburg.
  • 1909, Platos Logik des Seins, Gießen: Töpelmann.
  • 1909, Des Proklus Diadochus philosophische Anfangsgründe der Mathematik, Gießen: Töpelmann.
  • 1912, Philosophische Grundfragen der Biologie, Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht, Göttingen.
  • 1912, “Systematische Methode,” Logos, 3 (2): 121–163.
  • 1914, “Über die Erkennbarkeit des Apriorischen,” Logos, 5 (3): 290–329.
  • 1921, Grundzüge einer Metaphysik der Erkenntnis, Berlin-Leipzig: De Gruyter.
  • 1924, “Wie ist kritische Ontologie überhaupt möglich?”, Kleinere Schriften, 3, Berlin: De Gruyter, 1958, 268–313.
  • 1923–1929, Die Philosophie des deutschen Idealismus. I: Fichte, Schelling und die Romantik, II: Hegel, Berlin-Leipzig: De Gruyter.
  • 1926, “Kategoriale Gesetze,” Philosophischer Anzeiger, 1: 201–266.
  • 1926, Ethik, Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • 1931, “Systematische Philosophie in eigener Darstellung,” H. Schwarz (ed.), Deutsche systematische Philosophie nach ihren Gestaltern—Band I, Berlin: Junker und Dünnhaupt, 283–340.
  • 1931, Zum Problem der Realitätsgegebenheit, Pan-Verlagsgesellshcaft, Berlin.
  • 1933, Das Problem des geistigen Seins. Untersuchungen zur Grundlegung der Geschichtsphilosophie und der Geisteswissenschaften, Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • 1935, Zur Grundlegung der Ontologie, Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • 1938, Möglichkeit und Wircklichkeit, Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • 1940, Der Aufbau der realen Welt. Grundriss der allgemeinen Kategorienlehre, Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • 1941, “Neue Anthropologie in Deutschland. Betrachtung zu Arnold Gehlens Werk: ‘Der Mensch. Seine Natur und seine Stellung in der Welt’,” Blätter für deutsche Philosophie, 15: 159–177.
  • 1943, Neue Wege der Ontologie, in N. Hartmann, Systematische Philosophie, Stuttgart: Kohlhammer, 199–311.
  • 1944, “Naturphilosophie und Anthropologie,” Blätter für deutsche Philosophie, 18: 1–39.
  • 1950, Philosophie der Natur. Abriss der speziellen Kategorienlehre, Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • 1953, Ästhetik, Berlin: De Gruyter.

For a complete list, see the Bibliography of Hartmann’s Publications at the Nicolai Hartmann Society.

English Translations

  • 1932, Ethics, 3 vols., London: George Allen & Unwin; reprinted with new Introductions, by A. A. Kinneging, Transaction Press, 2002–2004.
  • 1949, “German Philosophy in the Last Ten Years”, Mind, 58: 413–433 (originally published in English).
  • 1953, New Ways of Ontology, Chicago: Henry Regnery Co; reprinted Westport: Greenwood Press, 1975; New Brunswick: Transaction Publishers, 2012.
  • 2012, “How is Critical Ontology Possible?”, Axiomathes, 22 (3): 315–354.
  • 2013, Possibility and Actuality, Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • 2014, Aesthetics, Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • 2017, “The Megarian and the Aristotelian Concept of Possibility: A Contribution to the History of the Ontological Problem of Modality,” Axiomathes, 27: 209–223.
  • 2018, “Husserl’s Jahrbuch,” unpublished ms., available online.
  • 2019a, Ontology: Laying the Foundations, Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • 2019b, “Max Scheler,” in Kalckreuth et al. (eds.), 2019, Nicolai Hartmanns neue Ontologie und die philosophische Anthropologie, Berlin: De Gruyter, 263–271.

Secondary Sources (Selected)

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  • –––, 2006 [1883–1892], Nietzsche: Thus Spoke Zarathustra, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
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  • –––, 2016, “Flat, Hierarchical, and Stratified: Determination and Dependence in Social-Natural Ontology,” in K. Peterson and R. Poli (eds.), 2016, 109–131.
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  • –––, 2017b, (ed.), Axiomathes (Special Issue: Nicolai Hartmann: Reality, Modality, and Value), Volume 27 (2).
  • –––, 2020, A World not Made for Us: Topics in Critical Environmental Philosophy, Albany, NY: SUNY Press.
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For a more complete list of secondary source publications since 2000, see the links in the Other Internet Resources.

Other Internet Resources


We thank Joachim Fischer, Eugene Kelly, and anonymous reviewers for their comments on a previous version of this article.

Copyright © 2022 by
Keith Peterson <>
Roberto Poli

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