Notes to Other Minds

1. Wright points out that “it is of the essence of asserting that one seeks to transfer information which can be acted on” (1984 [1993: 389]), the implication being that indefeasibility is not required for action.

2. While knowledge of my own mind is direct, it is only perceptual in a metaphorical or extended or sense.

3. Some think this because they hold that mind is not the sort of thing to be known about in this way (cf. Berkeley 1710), others because they see an obstacle in the way of acquiring knowledge of another’s mind by this means (cf. Cassam 2007).

4. Duddington, the daughter of the Russian writer Alexander Ertel, was a pupil of Dawes Hickes at University College London. After receiving a first in philosophy, she pursued the life of a translator of Russian literature. Other than this paper on other minds (and a short reply to a criticism of it), Duddington’s work in philosophy appears to have been limited to the translation of Vladimir Solovyov’s The Justification of the Good.

5. An important feature of McDowell’s disjunctive approach here is that there is nothing that may be taken to be in common (no highest common factor) between the veridical and the deceptive cases. According to McDowell, it is this thought that leads to thinking about behavior as “psychologically neutral information” (see McDowell 1982: 467).

6. Dretske (1971) associates satisfaction of a strong reliability condition with having what he calls “conclusive reasons”. For the full analysis of epistemic seeing see Dretske 1966, ch. III.

7. Some insist that knowledge here entails that solipsism is false by appeal to the Principle of Epistemic Closure (see Luper 2016). Dretske, however, rejects this Principle (Dretske 2005; for a response to Dretske here, see Hawthorne 2005).

8. The terms “sympathy” and “empathy” are understood differently in different writers. For a good discussion of the use of these terms see Zahavi (2014).

9. Zahavi (2014: 131–2 & ch. 12) defends Scheler against Stein’s accusation here.

10. This may also be true of McDowell’s work. What largely interests McDowell is that the account we give of our knowledge of other minds be direct, as it is only if the account is direct that we can avoid the scepticism that allows for the possibility of solipsism; that it be perceptual may be less crucial (see McDowell 1982).

11. It is interesting to note that Dretske does not address this issue in his work.

12. Malcolm links 302 with 350, where Wittgenstein considers the possibility of saying that others feel the same as I do and offers the comparison with saying that “it is 5 o’clock’ means the same here and on the sun (Malcolm 1954 [1966: 75ff.])

13. Strawson admits in a footnote that his point is a “purely logical one” (1959: 99).

14. Call and Tomasello (2008) suggest the evidence does not support the conclusion that chimpanzees are able to “go beneath the surface” to an understanding of what guides actions, but should be taken to show that chimpanzees are capable of appreciating the goals and intentions of others.

15. The findings were replicated with children with Down’s Syndrome, but the work by Baron-Cohen, Alan M. Leslie, and Uta Frith (1985) showed that children with autism only passed the test at a later age.

16. For a discussion of the history of this issue see Avramides (2001).

17. In Tsouna (1998b) she discusses the science of physiognomy as a response to the ‘thin’ sceptical problem of other minds. In holding that the ancients were concerned with a ‘thin’ sceptical problem here Tsouna and Avramides are influenced by the work of Myles Burnyeat.

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Anita Avramides <>

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