Notes to Panpsychism

1. Another Presocratic philosopher who has been said to espouse panpsychism for reasons similar in form to those of Thales (that is, via analogy and indeed an analogy with motion production) is Anaximenes (whose dates within the sixth century BCE are uncertain), who identified “air” (or “breath”) with soul or mind, thus making mind ubiquitous.

2. Empedocles is sometimes regarded as a panpsychist because of the universal role of love and strife (see Edwards 1967 for example) but there seems little of the mental in Empedocles’s conceptions, which are rather more like forces of aggregation and dis-aggregation respectively (see Barnes 1982: 308 ff.).

3. The distinction was further developed later by John Locke, who came up with the names “primary” and “secondary” qualities.

4. In contrast to Descartes, Galileo conceived of the soul in Aristotelian terms, as the principle of animation in the body (corpo sensitivo). See Ben-Yami 2015: ch. 3 for more discussion of this.

5. Although philosophically marginal, an intellectually significant figure worth mentioning as an example of a twentieth century panpsychist of some influence is Teilhard de Chardin (1881–1955). This mystic Roman Catholic polymath endorsed a kind of world-soul (thus embracing what Hartshorne called a “synecological” form of panpsychism), which he called the ’noosphere’, and urged that the old conception of matter and mind be replaced with a new notion of “matter-spirit”. The noosphere is the culmination of the evolution of consciousness (which is a continuation of biological evolution). But to avoid the discontinuity of emergentism, de Chardin embraced panpsychism.

6. For a clear introduction to, and defense of, Whitehead’s panpsychism see Griffen (1998); another interpretation, and pantheistic reworking, can be found in the writings of Charles Hartshorne (1897–2000), for example, in Hartshorne 1972.

7. Most people trace this way of defining consciousness back to Nagel (1974), although it appears earlier in Sprigge and Montefiore (1971).

8. Carlos Montemayor (2019) has argued for a form of panpsychism where attention and rationality are fundamental and ubiquitous rather than consciousness.

9. Chalmers defines constitutive panpsychism as the view that macro-level consciousness is constituted of micro-level consciousness, but this rules out cosmopsychism (discussed below) as a form of constitutive panpsychism.

10. See McLaughlin (1992) for a good discussion of non-panpsychist forms of emergentism.

11. The term “protophenomenal” comes from Chalmers 1996.

12. This is implicitly assuming a fairly standard understanding of physicalism according to which it is necessary condition for its truth that fundamental reality lacks mental or proto-mental features, see, for example, Goff 2017: ch. 2. The definition of physicalism is contested; see Ney 2008 for a good survey of options. Galen Strawson (2006a) adopts a much broader definition of physicalism, and hence refers to his panpsychism as a form of “physicalism”.

13. Shani (2015) defends a view according to which human and animal minds are partially grounded in facts about the cosmos.

14. See Nagasawa 2020 for an examination of interconnections between panpsychism and pantheism.

15. Russellian monism has historical precedence in Schopenhauer and Leibniz, as discussed above.

16. This is a fairly standard defence of Russsellian monism, e.g., Chalmers 2015, Goff 2017: ch. 6. Howell 2014 attempts to respond to it.

17. Russellian monism is standardly taken to be a form of constitutive panpsychism/panprotopsychism. However, there are emergentist forms. In contrast to what I said in the last sentence of the main body of text, emergentist Russellian monists would be trying to account for the causal emergence rather than the grounding of human consciousness. Because of this difference, it is not clear that emergentist Russellian monists are able to reconcile mental causation with the causal closure of the physical world. For more discussion see Chalmers 2015 and Goff 2017: ch. 6.

18. For detailed philosophical explications of the problem of consciousness, see Chalmers 2009 and Goff 2017.

19. If, as many emergentist panpsychists believe, the production of macro-level consciousness from micro-level consciousness is an intelligible process (in the sense that understanding the nature of the micro-level properties would allow one to predict the emergence of macro-level consciousness), then the resulting macro-level consciousness would not be “emergent” in Nagel’s sense.

20. Constitutive cosmopsychists should not be thought of as committed to radical emergence, so long as facts about the parts of the cosmos are intelligibly grounded in facts about the cosmos as a whole.

21. One might think there are also primitive notions of space and/or time in physics. But it’s not clear that anything other than mathematical and nomic notions is needed to understand the conception of spacetime we find in contemporary physics, and indeed many theoretical physicists believe that space and time are emergent phenomena.

22. Paul Edwards (1967) divided arguments for panpsychism into the two broad categories of genetic and analogical.

23. Historical precedent for the combination problem can be found in Lucretius ([c50 BCE] 2007) and Clarke ([1707–18] 2011).

24. Basile (2010) presents a similar concern regarding the possibility of mental combination. Montero (2016) and Goff (2017: ch. 7) respond to Coleman’s argument.

25. This shouldn’t be read as implying that facts about fundamental consciousness are more fundamental than the physical world. Albahari’s concern, for example, is whether we can make sense of fundamental experiential properties being fundamental physical properties).

Notes to the Supplement

26. Strawson is not happy to accept the existence of contingent laws, which partly motivates his argument discussed in the section The Anti-Emergence Argument.

27. This problem is arguably also faced by the emergentist panpsychism who postulates brute laws of nature. If brute laws are to explain the production of macro-level consciousness, why not just postulate brute laws connecting non-phenomenal properties to macro-level phenomenal properties?

Copyright © 2022 by
Philip Goff <>
William Seager
Sean Allen-Hermanson

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