Supplement to Panpsychism

Possible Solutions to the Subject-Summing Problem

Non-Constitutive Forms of Panpsychism

What seems difficult to make sense of in the subject-summing problem is certain conscious subjects coming together to constitute a new subject. Constitutive panpsychists need to make sense of this, as they hold that facts about human and animal subjects are constituted of facts about more fundamental kinds of subject. However, according to non-constitutive panpsychism, human and animal subjects are fundamental, and hence there is no obvious need to make sense of a constitution relation holding between distinct subjects. Thus, it is much less obvious that non-constitutive panpsychists are threatened by the subject-summing problem.

There may nonetheless be some troubles (for the non-constitutive panpsychist) pertaining to subject combination, depending on the details of the view. The emergentist panpsychist who is happy to explain the emergence of biological subjects from micro-level subjects in terms of brute contingent laws of nature will thereby avoid the pressure to make sense of an intelligible connection between the emergent biological mind and that from which it emerges.[26] However, an emergentist panpsychist who thinks that causation is an intelligible process will need to make sense of the intelligible emergence of biological subjects, something that is threatened by Goff’s conceivability argument against mental combination (considered in the discussion of the subject-summing problem). Patrick Lewtas (2017) has developed an elaborate form of layered emergentism in which there are allegedly no intelligibility gaps. Hedda Hassel Mørch (2014, 2018) has developed a form of fusionism according to which the emergence of biological subjects from micro-subjects is partially intelligible.

Even if resistant to the subject-summing problem, non-constitutive forms of panpsychism may suffer from other forms of the combination problem, some of which are discussed in the main body of this entry.

The Ignorance Response

Galen Strawson (2006b: section 16) responds to the subject-summing problem by suggesting that there could be some aspect of the nature of consciousness we don’t have a grip on, but which is essential for understanding subject combination. This response might be spelt out in two ways. It could be that there is something about the property of consciousness itself we don’t understand. Alternately (Goff 2017), it could be that consciousness is part of a more expansive property, “consciousness+”, of which consciousness is one aspect. (It is pleasant to reflect on how beautiful such a property would be, enfolding experiential and non-experiential aspects into a single unified nature).

It could be held that this ignorance is temporary; theorising our way to this hidden factor could be seen as a crucial goal for future enquiry. Or it could be that humans are just constitutively incapable of ever coming to an understanding of the missing facts, just as dogs do not have the kind of brains that would allow them to do mathematics. This latter form of the ignorance response can be seen as a kind of hybrid of panpsychism and mysterianism (discussed in the Panpsychism Versus Panprotopsychism section).

One difficulty with this response (Goff 2009, 2017: ch. 7) is it threatens to undermine at least one motivation for panpsychism. If we need to invest in hidden properties in order to explain macro-level consciousness, why not suppose that those hidden properties do all the work? After all, ex hypothesi we don’t really understand how the hidden properties contribute to grounding consciousness, and this ignorance would seem to remove any grounds for thinking that the hidden properties are only able to ground macro-level consciousness by combining with micro-level consciousness. Thus, we arguably lose our motivation for postulating micro-consciousness. If we need to postulate hidden properties anyway, and they could do all the work, why bother?[27] It is important to note that this does not remove other motivations for panpsychism, such as the intrinsic nature argument (discussed in the main body of this entry).

Phenomenal Bonding

In virtue of what do certain entities compose another entity? It is natural to think that relations have at least something to do with it. Bricks can’t compose a house unless they are stuck together; organs can’t compose a body unless they work together in sustaining the organism. Thus, one might suppose that there is some special relationship that obtains between certain micro-level conscious subjects, in virtue of which they constitute a macro-level conscious subject. Goff (2009, 2016) dubbed such a relationship “phenomenal bonding.”

Turning this into an adequate response to the subject-summing problem would seem to require cashing out the exact nature of this relationship. Conceiving of micro-level conscious subjects standing in physical relationships to each other, e.g., spatial or functional relationships, does not seem to close the conceivability gap between subjects at the micro-level and subjects at the macro-level; this is evidenced by the apparent conceivability of micro-experiential zombies (see Goff’s conceivability argument against mental combination, considered in the discussion of the subject-summing problem). What other relations are there that micro-subjects bear to each other?

One option is to hold that we have no positive conception of the phenomenal bonding relation, and that this accounts for our inability to understand phenomenal bonding. This would make the phenomenal bonding solution a form of the ignorance response outlined above; it’s just that what we are ignorant of is not some aspect of consciousness itself, but a relationship which conscious subjects bear to each other. This may lead to a worry similar to that outlined in the last section: if we have no positive grip on the nature of the relationship that bonds things together to produce macro-level subjects, why not suppose that that relationship bonds together non-conscious things (to make a conscious thing) rather than conscious things (to make a conscious thing)? This would dispense with the need to postulate micro-level consciousness. On the other hand (Goff 2016, 2017: ch. 7), if our aim is to characterise the intrinsic nature of matter (see the discussion of the intrinsic nature argument), then this view is arguably superior to out and out mysterianism, in that it does at least provide us with a positive conception of the non-relational properties of material entities.

Barry Dainton (2011) and Gregory Miller (2017) propose co-consciousness as the phenomenal bonding relation: the relation that holds between two experiences when they are experienced together. An advantage of this view, according to Dainton and Miller, is that this is a relation we are aware of in introspection: when we introspect, it is apparent that each of our experiences is co-conscious with all of the others. It is perhaps more natural to suppose that this fact is grounded in the fact that each of my experiences belongs to the same subject. But it is not obviously incoherent to suppose that the priority goes the other way round: my experiences belong to a single unified subject because they are co-conscious with each other. Perhaps then micro-level experiences compose a macro-level subject when they come to bear the co-consciousness relation to each other.

Sharing Experiences

Suppose I have an office chair that weighs 40 pounds. Let’s imagine the base weighs 20 pounds and the seat weighs 20 pounds. Now, if the chair weights 40 pounds, the base 20 pounds, and the seat 20 pounds, then does that mean the whole composite entity weighs 80 pounds (weight of chair + weights of base + weight of seat)? Of course not! The 20 pound mass belonging to the base also belongs to the chair as a whole, as does the mass belonging to the seat; the mass of the chair as a whole just is the mass of the base and the mass of the seat. At least, this is how we ordinarily conceive of things. If this all makes sense regarding mass, maybe the same is true of experiences. Suppose my brain has experiences and the parts of my brain have experiences. Maybe we don’t need to suppose that my experiences are distinct from the experience of my brain’s parts. Perhaps instead my experiences just are the experiences of my brain’s parts, in the same way that the mass of my office chair just is the mass of its parts.

It is normally assumed that anything that has experiences is a subject (NB this will be questioned below). Granting this, if my brain shares the experiences of its parts, it follows that my brain must be a subject. Luke Roelofs (2015, 2016, 2019, 2020) and Philip Goff (Roelofs and Goff forthcoming) have explored this as a strategy for solving the subject-summing problem.

Some might think this merely pushes the lump to another part of the carpet, as we now have to explain how my brain gets to share the experiences of its parts. Roelofs has suggested it might true about composition in general that properties of parts are ‘inherited’ by wholes, at least for certain key properties of physical objects. Totally independently of panpsychism, some philosophers have pressed that the composition relation is similar to the identity relation, which may go some way to explaining why properties are shared between wholes and parts. Adopting this strategy could potentially make it an a priori truth that my brain shares experiences with its parts (if its parts have experiences), thus rendering micro-experiential zombies incoherent. Having said that, one person’s modus ponens is another’s modus tollens, and many will start from the conceivability of micro-experience zombies and infer the falsity of the above general claim about composition.

Another option is to combine experience sharing with emergentism. This might involve conceding the possibility of a micro-experiential zombie world, while holding that in the actual world a basic law of nature ensures that properties of parts are inherited by wholes. We noted in the main discussion of emergentism that one common objection is that neuroscience and cellular biology (allegedly) show no sign of the existence of distinctive causal powers associated with biological consciousness. But on the form of emergentism currently under consideration, this may not be a problem, as on this view biological forms of consciousness are nothing over and above consciousness at the level of basic physics.


Constitutive cosmopsychists (discussed in the main body of this entry) hold that facts about human and animal subjects are grounded in facts about the conscious universe rather than in facts about micro-level subjects; thus they avoid the need to make sense of subject-summing. However, they arguably face an analogous problem, which Miri Albahari (2020) calls “the decombination problem”: in virtue of what do “big” conscious subjects (such as the universe) ground “little” conscious subjects (such as us)? Just as we can conceive of micro-level subjects existing in the absence of macro-level subjects, so it seems that we can conceive of a conscious universe existing without having conscious parts (i.e., without anything within the universe being conscious). Thus, if we think of the subject-summing problem as arising from the conceivability gap between more fundamental and less-fundamental conscious subjects (see Goff’s conceivability argument against mental combination considered in the discussion of the subject-summing problem), then constitutive cosmopsychism faces essentially the same problem.

Nonetheless, cosmopsychists have argued that there are various respects in which cosmopsychism eases the problem. As discussed in the main body of this entry, Nagasawa & Wager (2016) suggest that cosmopsychism can help to address the grain problem (Miller 2021 is a response). And Goff (2017: ch. 9, forthcoming) argues that in the framework of constitutive cosmopsychism there is no need to suppose that less fundamental properties admit of reductive analysis, and that this removes the necessity of providing a reductive analysis of human and animal consciousness. Itay Shani presents his defence of cosmopsychism against the backdrop of Coleman’s version of the subject-summing problem (discussed in the main document of this entry). Shani concedes that Coleman demonstrates that the existence of one subject cannot be wholly grounded in facts about another. Nonetheless, he sketches in broad brushstrokes an intelligible explanation of each organic subject’s capacity for experience, and its having of a perspective, in terms of the experiential capacities and the perspectivality of the universe. Shani hopes that such partial grounding of non-cosmic subjects allows us to avoid the kind of radical emergence Strawson worries about in his anti-emergentist argument (the latter is discussed in the main body of this entry).

Gregory Miller (2017) has explored whether it is coherent for cosmopsychists to hold that some subjects are proper parts of other subjects, proposing that a distinction between absolute and relative phenomenal unity may help.

Getting Rid of Subjects

Annaka Harris (2021) has argued that we can avoid the subject-summing problem by dropping a commitment to subjects. According to Harris, all that really exists is consciousness and its contents. Philip Goff (2021) responds that the basic problem may still arise if the contents of consciousness at the macro-level cannot be reduced to contents of consciousness at the micro-level. Relatedly, Luke Roelofs (2017) has defended the possibility of this kind of ‘selfless agent’, i.e. a rational agent constituted of a group of agents none of whom can know the group as ‘I’.

Copyright © 2022 by
Philip Goff <>
William Seager
Sean Allen-Hermanson

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