Notes to Perfectionism in Moral and Political Philosophy

1. No substantive issues are prejudged by this choice of terminology. The content of an excellent human life remains open.

2. The distinction between human nature and objective goods perfectionism drawn here tracks the distinction between narrow and broad perfectionism suggested by Hurka. (Hurka 1993, 4) Note that objective goods perfectionism includes nonhumanistic versions of perfectionism.

3. Sidgwick claims that no moralist would recommend that a person sacrifice his own perfection for the sake of perfecting of others. But Sidgwick here views moral virtue as the key component of perfection. He is, accordingly, rejecting the thought that morality requires us to sacrifice our own virtue for the sake of promoting it in others.

4. The idea of an agent-centered prerogative was introduced by Scheffler (1982); and its implications for consequentialism are explored in the debate between Kagan (1989) and Scheffler (1991).

5. I assume here that human perfection is not measured in terms of how far people go in perfecting themselves (roughly, the distance between where they start and where they end up), but rather in terms of the level or degree of perfection they attain, irrespective of how far they had to go in attaining it.

6. Defenders of state neutrality differ as to which political decisions the constraint applies to: to all political decisions, to constitutional issues only, to coercive laws and policies, etc. This complication is ignored here.

7. It is common to mention the view that the consequences of state action should be neutral between conceptions of the good. Here the constraint is formulated in terms of neutrality of effect. Proponents of state neutrality generally mention this view to put it to one side. For an argument that they are too quick to do so see Wall (2001).

8. It is possible to distinguish the doctrine that the state should not take sides between different conceptions of the good from the doctrine that enjoins the exclusion of ideals from political justification (Raz 1986, 108–109). In this entry, the principle of state neutrality is construed to include both of these more specific doctrines.

9. Proponents of state neutrality do not object to state efforts to promote just over unjust conceptions of the good. They hold that the state should not favor some permissible conceptions of the good over others. A permissible conception of the good, for the purposes of the principle, is a conception of a good that is consistent with the requirements of justice for a modern democratic society, where the requirements of justice are not themselves founded on or tied to any disputed conception of the good.

10. One caveat to this claim is that public justification is commonly taken to exclude appeal not only to controversial conceptions of the good, but also to wider controversial philosophical or metaphysical claims—i.e. to what Rawls terms comprehensive doctrines.

11. For further discussion see (Kramer 2017, pp. 18-19).

12. This is true so long as his conception of the good is consistent with neutral principles of justice. This qualification is often included as part of the content of a reasonable conception of the good.

13. In these discussions, the term reasonable is taken to have two senses, one moral and one epistemic. A person is reasonable in the moral sense if he is disposed to treat others fairly and to respect their rights. A conception of the good is reasonable in the moral sense if it does not direct or require its adherent to treat others unfairly or to violate their rights. The different specifications of “appropriately reasonable” listed here put the focus on the epistemic sense of reasonableness, but they all should be read to include the moral sense as well.

14. To make the example cleaner, we can stipulate that the money for the subsidy is raised by a voluntary state-run lottery.

15. For discussion see Wall (2013a).

16. It is sometimes claimed that all state action is coercive. If so, then we would need to distinguish direct from indirect state coercion. “Noncoercive state perfectionism” would then be equivalent to indirectly coercive state perfectionism.

17. Some contemporary Kantians hold that state coercion as well as non-coercive state action is justified only if it is necessary to establish the mutual independence of those subject to it. This generates a more robust constraint against state perfectionism than that provided by political liberalism (Pallikkathayil 2016).

18. For a fuller development of this point see the distinction between state-centered and multi-centered perfectionism in Chan (2000).

Copyright © 2017 by
Steven Wall <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free