Philippa Foot

First published Fri Aug 17, 2018; substantive revision Thu Dec 9, 2021

Philippa Foot wrote many articles treating issues in metaethics, moral psychology, and applied ethics, as well as one monograph on moral philosophy. Throughout her career, she defended the objectivity of morality against various forms of noncognitivism and tangled with issues of moral motivation, notoriously changing her mind about whether moral judgments necessarily provide rational agents with reasons for action. To the wider world, and perhaps especially to undergraduate philosophy students, she is best known for inventing the Trolley Problem, which raises the question of why it seems permissible to steer a trolley aimed at five people toward one person while it seems impermissible to do something such as killing one healthy man to use his organs to save five people who will otherwise die. Foot is also known for contributing to the revival of Aristotelian virtue ethics in contemporary philosophy, though it is less well known that she emphatically disavowed being an adherent of this view as it is currently understood.

1. Life

Philippa Foot was born Philippa Ruth Bosanquet on October 3, 1920, in Owston Ferry, Lincolnshire, and grew up in Kirkleatham, in North Yorkshire, England. Her mother, Esther, was a daughter of U.S. President Grover Cleveland. Her father, William was an industrialist, running a large Yorkshire steel works. Foot studied philosophy, politics, and economics at Somerville College, a women’s college within the University of Oxford. Foot had no formal education as a child; as she puts it, she “lived in the sort of milieu where there was a lot of hunting, shooting, and fishing, and where girls simply did not go to college” (Voorhoeve 2009: 91). In her youth, she was educated by governesses, from whom she claimed she did not even learn “which came first, the Romans or the Greeks” (Conradi & Lawrence 2010). Despite this poor childhood education Foot was able to secure a position at Oxford by way of a correspondence course on Latin and working with an Oxford entrance coach.

Her earliest philosophy tutor at Somerville was Donald MacKinnon, a philosopher and theologian with an interest in Plotinus, Kant, and Hegel. Elizabeth Anscombe, Mary Midgley, Iris Murdoch, all of whom would go on to have celebrated careers in philosophy, were also at Somerville at the time. All four engaged philosophically with each other during their Somerville years and later (Hursthouse 2012: 182). Foot earned a BLitt from Somerville for her research on Kant in 1942, and then worked in London for the remainder of the war. At the end of the war, she married the military historian M.R.D. Foot (though the marriage came to an end in 1960) and returned to Somerville College to take a teaching position and then, in 1949, began a fellowship there. G.E.M. Anscombe had started a research fellowship at Somerville in 1946. Foot credits her introduction to analytic philosophy to Anscombe, who introduced Foot to a style of philosophy Anscombe picked up from Wittgenstein.

Foot resigned her fellowship at Somerville in 1969 and began a period of freelancing in the United States, where she held Visiting Professorships at the Universities of California, at Los Angeles and Berkeley, Washington, Princeton, Stanford, and the City University of New York. In 1976, she took up a permanent position at the University of California, Los Angeles, where she remained until retiring in 1991, then returning to Oxford, where she completed her monograph Natural Goodness. Foot’s last philosophical article appeared in 2004, and she died on her ninetieth birthday, October 3, 2010. It is sometimes thought that Foot was a founding member of Oxfam, but, in fact, the first records of her involvement date from 1948, some six years after the founding of the Oxford Committee for Famine Relief. She remained involved with Oxfam throughout her life (Hursthouse 2012: 180–181).

2. Ethical Naturalism in Foot’s Early Writings

In a trio of early articles, Foot argues against then prevailing views on the nature of moral judgments and sketches an alternative positive view. The views she argued against were known as emotivism and prescriptivism, both versions of noncognitivism. On these views, moral judgments feature a special attitudinal component, a pro or con attitude that is absent from straightforward descriptive claims. What the judgments are about is irrelevant to whether they count as moral judgments. In “Moral Arguments” (1958), Foot memorably presents these views as offering a “private enterprise theory of moral criteria”, which highlights the way in which these views take the individual’s attitude as settling the question of the scope of morality (1958 [VV 108]). In this line of argument, she demonstrates a commitment to a Wittgensteinian approach and takes up some of Wittgenstein’s views. The idea that terms must have public criteria and cannot be given arbitrary meaning by the individual speaker is among these commitments, along with the approach to investigating terms by way of a ‘grammatical investigation’. That is an attempt to ground our understanding of words in an examination of how we in fact use them when we are practically engaged, which often gets lost when doing philosophy.

The noncognitivist views Foot attacks depend on a pair of assumptions that Foot dismantles in her article “Moral Beliefs” (1959). The first assumption is that what counts as evidence for an evaluative conclusion in no way depends on what anyone else counts as evidence. Foot thinks this would only be possible if the meaning of a term such as ‘good’ possesses a separate evaluative component, independent of any consideration of the proper object of things deemed good. The second assumption is that anyone can refuse to draw an evaluative conclusion in the face of what others regard as definitive evidence. For example, one guided by this assumption might admit that there are grounds for calling Jones courageous, in that he defended his family against a fearsome attacker, but refuse to praise Jones for his courage. In that case, one might say he is ‘courageous’ only in a descriptive, inverted commas sense, avoiding the evaluative commitment that this description usually entails. Together, these assumptions erect a wall between factual judgments and evaluative judgments, a wall which Foot proceeds to demolish.

Against the first assumption, Foot argues that the term ‘good’ is analogous to ‘pride’ in having limits on its intelligible use. The analogy draws on the fact that the emotion of pride is evaluative, and yet tied to definite descriptive content: logically, one cannot feel pride about just anything. Rather, to feel pride in something is to see it as one’s achievement; hence the object of pride is taken to a good that one had some hand in bringing about. For example, if I thought I had been awarded the prize for best pumpkin and felt proud of this triumph, but it turned out that it was in fact someone else’s pumpkin which actually won, I could not intelligibly continue to feel pride. Further, what one takes pride in must be some sort of achievement or advantage. It would not make sense to feel pride in laying one hand over another three times in an hour, unless there is a special background condition, such as a stroke, which made this a difficult task and an important step in recovery. Foot argues thereby that to be said to be feeling certain emotions, it is not sufficient that one be in a certain mental state.[1] Rather, the person must stand in an appropriate relationship to a proper object of those feelings. In this way, Foot attempts to show that “even feelings are logically vulnerable to facts” (1959 [VV 115]).

Analogously, she thinks someone must stand in an appropriate relation to a proper object of ‘good’ to be said to think something is good. Foot asks us to consider someone who deems it good to always clasp one’s hands three times in an hour. This person might claim it is a duty to so clasp one’s hands, praise others for doing it and so on. Are these moral judgments? She maintains that to call these moral judgments would require a special background; in this case, the clasper’s belief that such action has special significance or effect that pertains to the human good (1959 [VV 120]). Foot contends that there is a logical impossibility in taking the clasping to be morally good in the absence of any such background.

Against the second assumption, that we might fail to draw an evaluative conclusion from what others regard as definitive evidence, Foot argues in “Moral Beliefs” that we all have reason to act in view of what is demonstrated to be in our interests. If an action can be shown to be in our interests, we have reason to do it. So, one can say, at least pro tanto, that we ought to do it, and would be irrational and bad not to do it, all else being equal. Foot then aims to show that cultivating the virtues is always in one’s interest, and failing to do so is necessarily against one’s interest. She thereby claims to show that we each have reason to cultivate the virtues, regardless of our present desires. In the course of her argument, she attempts to refute the position advocated by Thrasymachus in Plato’s Republic, namely, the view that it is more profitable to be unjust, a view which she calls “Thrasymachus’ thesis” (1959 [VV 125]). So, she aims to persuade us that justice, along with the other so-called ‘cardinal virtues’ of courage, prudence, and temperance, are in some sense profitable, even though these virtues may at times ask us to make drastic sacrifices, even to the point of laying down our lives.

Foot compares injustice with physical injury, focusing primarily on an injury to our limbs. She believes that an injury, which impairs the functioning of some part of our bodies or creates lasting pain, is something we each have reason to avoid. That is, we want to avoid it for itself, even though some circumstance may arise where there is a reason to want to sustain an injury because of some advantage which can be realized through it (or, more commonly, we want to do something that risks sustaining injury for the sake of some advantage). In such circumstances, we can say that there are overriding or all things considered reasons to sustain or risk an injury, but clearly, we would avoid the injury if the gain could be realized without sustaining it. No rational person seeks an injury for itself, and every rational person avoids injury for itself. An injury is something that we should always want to avoid because it is a physical change which impairs the function of a particular body part, and we all have reason to want our bodies to function properly (1959 [VV 116–117; 122]). General facts concerning human beings support the idea that it is necessary for rational people to want their limbs intact.

Similarly, she thinks that there are features of human life which explain why it is rationally necessary for us to want the virtues. She argues that the virtues can be taken to be as essential to the fulfillment of our desires as are our limbs. Though we may choose to live a life in isolation, or indeed though we may be stranded in involuntary isolation for any of various reasons, we are creatures who can at present anticipate that our attempts at attaining things will happen in a social environment. This means that we are creatures for whom it is a constant fact that our attempts at fulfilling a desire may be interfered with or enhanced by others. We can all expect to profit if our actions instance a practice which is defined by mutual respect and fidelity to promises, and this profit is one we all have reason to want given that our desiring things predictably occurs within a social matrix.

Foot recognized one of the most obvious objections to this position, which is the ‘tight corner’. That is, while it may be generally beneficial to be just or courageous, in individual circumstances it is difficult to claim that someone has reason to be virtuous when, in doing so, they would incur a very great loss. On this objection, it would seem rational to avoid developing the disposition to be just in order to avoid incurring these losses. In “ Moral Beliefs” Foot argued that by concentrating on the costs of particular just acts in isolation, this object fails to recognize the value of the general disposition to be just (1959 [VV 129–30]). But later she cites the objection as a reason for her change of view in “Morality as a System of Hypothetical Imperatives” (VV x). Ultimately, the successful defense of her early position on the rationality of morality depends on defending the view that we should not be focusing on the rationality of individual actions, but rather the rationality of adopting the disposition to be just.[2]

In arguing against her emotivist and prescriptivist opponents, Foot develops the outlines of a positive position that should be labeled a version of ethical naturalism in view of the role that it accords facts about human life in defining the content of morality. In “When is a Principle a Moral Principle?” (1954), “Moral Arguments”, and “Moral Beliefs”, Foot makes a case for a distinctive non-utilitarian naturalistic ethics in which the virtues play a central role and in which a trait is justified as a virtue by making a contribution to leading a good human life. Her case for such an ethics is motivated by metaethical concerns, specifically with her dissatisfaction regarding the ability of noncognitivist theories to offer an adequate account of morality.

3. Against Moral Rationalism

Among Foot’s most anthologized, celebrated, controversial, and widely cited articles is undoubtedly “Morality as a System of Hypothetical Imperatives” (1972, MSHI). In this article, Foot takes an about-face on the issue of the rationality of morality. In MSHI she retains the view from “Moral Beliefs” that self-interest is rationally required: we must have desires for what is evidently in our self-interest or else we are irrational. Yet, she drops the view that morality coincides with self-interest, and ends up with the position that morality only provides reasons if we have desires that we might rationally lack. Unfortunately, although Foot notes her change of view, she does not revisit her previous position to argue at any length against her earlier view.[3]

The term ‘hypothetical imperative’ comes from Immanuel Kant’s moral philosophy, in which it is contrasted with the ‘categorical imperative’. A hypothetical imperative is a command, or ought-statement, that depends for its reason-giving force on the agent having a certain purpose. For example, someone’s ability to say that I ought to purchase an airplane ticket to New York today typically depends on whether I have the purpose of going there. If I lack that purpose, or give up on it, then there is no sense in which one could continue to maintain that I ought to buy the ticket. By contrast, categorical imperatives do not depend on our possession of any special purpose for their reason-giving force; they have normative authority for us regardless of our purposes. In MSHI Foot sets out to challenge the then widely held assumption that morality must consist of categorical imperatives because whether something is your moral obligation seems obviously not to depend on whether one has a certain purpose or desire. She undertakes to show that the surface grammar of moral judgments, stating what we ought morally to do, is misleading; when we make claims about what someone ought morally to do, we certainly appear to be making categorical claims. We tell children that they should not fib even when a successful fib would serve their overriding purpose of escaping blame or punishment. Yet Foot argues that this appearance is deceptive, making her case for this point by drawing an analogy between morality and etiquette.

Etiquette and morality are different in many ways, but they both tell us what we ought to do. In fact, as Foot points out, rules of etiquette are usually presented in the same categorical form as moral considerations; etiquette tells us what must and must not be done, period. Imperatives such as, “You should not discuss money”, or “Don’t make personal remarks” use a categorical form. Foot calls these “non-hypothetical uses” of ought (1972 [VV 160]). Yet Foot takes it to be obvious that one can rationally ignore the rules of etiquette. Hence, the rules of etiquette do not give me any reason to act on them unless I have the purpose of doing what I ought to do from the point of view of etiquette. Of course, there is still a sense in which the rules of etiquette are unconditional. I am ‘gauche’ if I flout the requirements of etiquette, regardless of my purposes. Still, Foot thinks it cannot be said that I necessarily have reason to conform to those rules, drawing the conclusion that

if a hypothetical use of ‘should’ gave a hypothetical imperative, and a non-hypothetical use of ‘should’ gave a categorical imperative, then ‘should’ statements based on rules of etiquette, or rules of a club would be categorical imperatives. (1972 [VV 160–161])

Yet these ‘should’ statements do not really give us categorical imperatives. We therefore cannot trust the surface grammar of our ‘should’ or ‘ought’ statements to tell us whether we have a categorical or a hypothetical imperative.

Foot sees the commands of morality as like those of etiquette. Though they are stated in categorical form, there is no reason to think that someone who acts against them is necessarily irrational. It is perfectly plausible to think that they give reasons only if we have the purpose of doing what we should do from the moral point of view. As with etiquette, the claims of morality are, in some sense, unconditional: one does not escape being wicked simply by lacking the purpose of being moral. As Foot states,

the man who rejects morality because he sees no reason to obey its rules can be convicted of villainy but not of inconsistency. (1972 [VV 161])

That is because such an amoral agent does not act against any purpose that he has, and is therefore not irrational, though he is still immoral.

The next question that Foot sets out to address is: what would be the implications for morality if it turns out that rules of morality are hypothetical imperatives? Many think that this would be a catastrophic situation. Kant, for example, thought that if morality were merely hypothetically imperative, we would only be moral when it served selfish and pleasure-seeking purposes. Yet Foot argues that Kant had an inadequate view of human psychology, stating,

Quite apart from thoughts of duty a man may care about the suffering of others, having a sense of identification with them and wanting to help if he can. (1972 [VV 165])

Of course, helping others with the purpose of promoting one’s reputation for charity is not compatible with the virtue of charity, but one can simply desire to help others, and in that case, there is no need for a categorical imperative to prompt the charitable acts.

Justice, as Foot realizes, cannot be motivated by the same concern for the good of others. Justice notoriously comes into conflict with the good of others, as there may be cases where people would be well-served by a false accusation or the redistribution of money owed to a rich man to the poor. This leads Foot to posit that just persons are concerned with truth, liberty and that they “want every man to be treated with a certain respect” ([1972 [VV 165]). On Foot’s view, then, a morally good agent has a variety of independent commitments which make considerations of the well-being and the rights of others yield reasons. She evidently thinks this is a plausible psychological picture that has not been given sufficient consideration, due to the assumption that morality consists of categorical imperatives.

At the conclusion of MSHI, Foot makes an even bolder claim. She imagines that those resistant to her claim will think that we have a duty to adopt moral ends, yet she thinks that the idea that we have a duty to have certain ends is complete nonsense. It is of course trivially true that we ought morally to have moral ends; so that from the perspective of morally good people, these ends appear to be obligatory. However, the objection suggests a use of ‘ought’ that is not tied to any particular institution, practice, or person’s perspective, and she thinks it is merely an illusion that there is any such sense of ‘ought’ ([1972 [VV 167]). In this respect, Foot claims she is offering a ‘defictionalized’ vision of morality (1975 [VV 174]).

Foot’s middle period views on the rationality of morality have spurred much debate. Her views of this period leave morality alarmingly unsupported: there is no reason to develop the desires that allow moral considerations in turn to provide us with reasons for action if we lack them. Prominent defenders of moral rationalism criticize Foot’s analogy with etiquette. Unfortunately, Foot’s actual position is sometimes misrepresented in the debate. It is sometimes thought that Foot adopts at this point a wholly conventional view of morality, by analogy with etiquette. Yet, Foot did not renounce her earlier view that morality has some determinate content, tied to facts about human life. Another feature of Foot’s middle period views that often gets overlooked is her continuous commitment to rationalism about self-interest: considerations of self-interest always provides reasons, regardless of one’s desires.[4] This means that she is not a consistent externalist, since not all reasons need to be accompanied by a desire that we might lack. Rather, she defends an externalism about the reasons generated by moral considerations only. So she does not, after all, think that all normative statements generate only hypothetical imperatives. Still, moral oughts are not supported by categorical imperatives of self-interest, according to Foot’s views at this point in her career.

4. Applied Ethics

Foot was among the pioneers of writing on issues in applied ethics, treating abortion and euthanasia. For reasons only made explicit in later writings, Foot rejects consequentialist views of value, including utilitarianism. Charity, on her account, demands that we aid others, but we cannot do so at the expense of violating rights to non-interference, or negative rights. As Foot puts it, “in so far as a man’s charity is limited only by his justice… he is not less than perfect in charity” (1983 [MD 57]). But what does justice demand? For Foot, answering this question depends on figuring out the scope of our moral rights, and this is a project that she pursued by reflecting on various thought experiments, some of which have entered popular culture.

Consider a pair of scenarios called Rescue I and Rescue II (1984 [MD 80]). In both cases, we are driving a jeep along a sea shore and have the chance to save various configurations of stranded people from an incoming tide. In the first case, we are about to save one person from the tide, and spot five others whom we can save, but we cannot save both. In Rescue II, we can save five, but to reach them we would for some reason would have to run over one person, killing him. Foot believes that there is a morally significant difference between these cases. She thinks it is impermissible to save the five in Rescue II; whereas it is permissible (at least) to save the five in Rescue I. On Foot’s view, the significant difference lies in the fact that in Rescue II, saving the five would require initiating a causal sequence that kills one. In Rescue I, by contrast, saving the five is permissible because in this scenario we allow a deadly causal sequence that we did not initiate to run its course. This is not to say that all instances of allowing deadly causal sequences to run their courses are permissible, or that the distinction between doing and allowing always makes a difference to the moral status of an action. The claim is only that the distinction sometimes makes a significant moral difference, as it does in this pair of cases. According to Foot, “it takes more to justify an interference than to justify the withholding of goods and service” (1984 [MD 83]). At the very least, this means that it is impermissible to kill one person to save another.[5] This distinction relates to the distinction between negative rights, rights to non-interference, versus positive rights, which obligate others to provide some service. Negative rights would enjoin others not to initiate a fatal causal sequence, and positive rights may give rise to an obligation to prevent a fatal causal sequence from running its course. Foot’s contention is that negative rights carry greater weight than positive rights.

In “The Problem of Abortion and the Doctrine of Double Effect”, (1967) Foot raises a related case that has been the subject of much subsequent discussion: a runaway trolley is headed toward five people who will be killed by the collision, but it could be steered onto a track on which there is only one person (1967 [VV 23]). Intuitively, it seems permissible to turn the trolley to hit and kill one person, but the problem is that it does not seem permissible to kill one to save five in cases like Rescue II. Why, Foot asks, can we not argue for the permissibility of killing one to save five in those cases by appealing to the Trolley case? As we have seen, Foot argues that negative rights are generally stronger than positive rights. In Rescue II, we must violate someone’s negative rights to meet the positive rights of others, and this is impermissible because the negative rights have priority over the positive rights that is not outweighed by five people’s need for assistance. In Trolley, by contrast, we are not violating negative rights to meet positive rights; the situation pits the negative rights of the five against the negative rights of one, and both choices involve violating someone’s negative rights. In such a case, it seems clearly preferable to minimize the violation of negative rights by turning the trolley (1967 [VV 27]).

On Foot’s view, we are generally not permitted to do something to someone that would interfere with someone’s negative rights, for example, we may not steal someone’s property; yet we may not be required to actively secure their possession of it, that is, we may allow them to lose their property. Foot thereby defends a principle that draws a moral distinction between doing and allowing; she also defends a version of the doctrine of double effect, which states that it is sometimes permissible to bring about a result that one foresees as a consequence of one’s action but does not intend that it would be impermissible to aim at either as a means or an end (1985 [MD 91]). Foot believes that this principle is necessary because the principle of doing and allowing does not cover some morally significant distinctions. For example, consider a case in which we possess a certain drug, but only enough to either cure one person suffering from a fatal condition, or to save five others who are suffering from a milder, though still fatal case of the same illness. In such a circumstance, we can permissibly give the drug to the five who are suffering from the milder form of the disease. If we could save all six, we would surely do so. Clearly, we do not intend the death of the one, though we foresee it as a consequence of our actions. On the other hand, it is not permissible to withhold a live-saving drug from one to use his organs to save the lives of the five others after he dies. In this case, the death of the one is an essential means to the achievement of the end and so his death is strictly intended. Although in such a case I would be allowing someone to die rather than perpetrating a killing by my own agency, what I do is impermissible. Only the doctrine of double effect captures the distinction between these cases, on Foot’s view. Yet the doctrine of double effect cannot stand on its own, according to Foot; we need both the principle of double effect and the principle of doing and allowing. After all, we can sometimes impermissibly initiate harm with indirect intention. She gives the example of wicked merchants who knowingly sell poisoned oil: their intention is not to harm their customers, but only to turn a profit, yet they are clearly initiating a harmful causal sequence.

These principles systematize non-consequentialist ‘common morality’, and Foot puts these principles to use in her treatment of abortion and euthanasia. Foot is skeptical of any attempt to resolve the abortion debate without settling the issue of whether and when the fetus has moral rights, and she regards this as an intractable issue (1984 [MD 87]). In this view, she takes sides against Judith Jarvis Thomson, who argued that some abortions are permissible even if we allow for the sake of argument that the fetus has full moral status. Thomson argues by analogy: imagine that while we sleep a group of music lovers stealthily attach to us a famous violinist who is suffering from an ailment, and we uniquely can keep him alive for roughly nine months, as he convalesces (Thomson 1971: 48). The question is: may we detach the violinist, causing his death? Thomson argues that we may, since our negative rights have been violated and no one has the right to use another’s body, even to save his own life. Of course, the analogy here is limited to cases of non-consensual impregnation, such as those resulting from rape.

Foot argues that the analogy has a devastating fault. There is a morally significant difference between unhooking someone from one’s own body, which does not involve initiating a fatal causal sequence, since the person was already in the grips of a fatal condition before being hooked up to us, and abortion, which does initiate a fatal sequence. Foot believes that this makes abortion seem like Rescue II, whereas the unhooking of the violinist is like Rescue I. As Foot puts it,

the fetus is not in jeopardy because it is in its mother’s womb; it is merely dependent on her in the way children are dependent on their parents for food. (1984 [MD 87])

Rejecting Thomson’s view, which attempts to show that some instances of abortion are permissible even if the fetus is fully a moral person, Foot’s considered position on abortion is that it turns on precisely the issue Thomson wishes to set aside. On this issue, she rather surprisingly abandons her commitment to objectivity, claiming that it is a matter for a community to decide whether to count the fetus as a human being (1970 [MD 7]).

Perhaps Foot’s most penetrating article on applied ethics is her “Euthanasia” (1977). Foot defines euthanasia as a killing that is for the good of the individual in question, and she asks whether such an act can ever be permissible. One central question here is whether it can ever be good for an individual to be deprived of his life, and hence one of Foot’s central purposes is to determine what sort of a good life is for a person. She rejects the narrowly hedonistic view that the value of life is determined by the balance of pleasure versus pain it promises. On her view, life is often still a good to someone who is suffering and who is likely to continue in such a state. Yet she also argues that merely being alive without suffering is not a good (1977 [VV 42]). What is of value, on her view, is the ordinary human life that contains at least a minimum of “basic human goods”, which include:

that a man is not driven to work far beyond his capacity; that he has the support of a family or community; that he can more or less satisfy his hunger; that he has hopes for the future; that he can lie down to rest at night. (Ibid.)

In the absence of such minimal goods, she argues that life is not a good to a person.

The issue of the permissibility of euthanasia for Foot, then, turns to issues about justice and charity (1977 [VV 44]). On her view, even when it seems better for someone not to survive, we must respect that person’s rights. Hence, on her view, involuntary active euthanasia can never be permissible. On the other hand, the right to assistance in staying alive calls upon the charity of others and not justice, except in the case of a doctor who has a contractual duty to help keep us alive. Yet even in the case of a doctor, where assistance is a matter of justice, our claim on that assistance is limited by the claims of others as well as a regard for our well-being. That is, there may come a point at which such ‘assistance’ as a doctor can offer to prolong a patient’s life does not actually confer any benefit, and in such a case, it is not contrary to justice or charity for the doctor to withhold treatment; as Foot points out, such instances of passive euthanasia are already widely practiced (1977 [VV 56]). However, she argues that it may be justifiable not to prolong the life of someone who wants to live, giving the example of a dying soldier whose life could be prolonged with a certain drug, but who would thereby face death by starvation. According to Foot, nonvoluntary passive euthanasia is permissible in such an instance.

Of course, the central controversy here is whether voluntary active euthanasia is permissible. She dismisses James Rachels’ claim that if we permit passive euthanasia then the only consistent position is to permit active euthanasia in similar circumstances because it is ‘more humane’ than passive euthanasia (Rachels 1975). Foot argues by analogy that it may be ‘more humane’ to deprive someone of property that is bringing evil to him, but nevertheless taking it away would be contrary to justice (1977 [VV 50]). On the other hand, someone may give permission for the destruction of his property, and as Foot concludes,

If someone gives you permission to destroy his property it can no longer be said that you have no right to do so, and I do not see why it should not be the same with taking a man’s life. (1977 [VV 53])

Nevertheless, Foot admits that the moral issue is not entirely resolved by the matter of rights, so it does not follow that there is no moral objection to doing something because it would involve no violation of rights. It is then a matter of whether it would be good for the person to die and, hence, whether it would be contrary to charity. This rules out cases in which death is wished for by someone who is facing a life of dependency because they are worried about being a burden on others. In such circumstances, other things being equal, the death would not be for the good of the person. Foot also has concerns about the practice of euthanasia that make her hesitate to suggest that the practice ought to be more widely legalized.

5. Virtue and Morality

In her treatment of abortion and euthanasia, Foot appeals to virtues of charity and justice. It is obvious, then, that the virtues play an important role in her conception of morality. On Foot’s account, there are three essential features of a virtue: first, a virtue is a disposition of the will; second, it is beneficial either to others, or to its possessor as well as to others; third, it is corrective of some bad general human tendency.

Foot starts her investigation of the connection between the virtues and the will by examining the role of intentions in determining someone’s character. We evaluate someone’s moral quality, she thinks, primarily by examining his intentions (1978 [VV 4]). Yet, good intentions are not sufficient to demonstrate that someone is virtuous; in the case of charity or benevolence, one can show lack of charity despite our good intentions, in failing to bring about the intended good. For example, one can be ignorant of something one should have known, as famously illustrated by Foot with her example of failing to learn basic first aid. Someone who is genuinely benevolent will take the trouble to find out about basic first aid, and because such knowledge is so easily attained and so generally useful to others, it shows a lack of charity to fail to attain such knowledge. Also, Foot points out that failures of performance can count against someone’s claim to possess virtue despite good intentions when one’s heart is not in the action. Virtues are therefore also ‘dispositions of the heart’ according to Foot, meaning that we must take the trouble to cultivate the desire to act well. Conversely, virtue par excellence occurs in one who is “prompt and resourceful” in doing good (Ibid.). A virtuous agent will take pleasure in doing good things for others, and so for Foot, the will includes our intentions as well as our ‘innermost desires’.

There are plenty of qualifications to add here. Surely it is not always in our power to effect changes in our emotions and desires; at least, whether it is possible is an open question and subject to psychological inquiry (Hursthouse 1999: 113–119). Still, Foot has made a conceptual claim that is important here: we are charitable when our intentions and desires, to the extent that these are under the control of our will, are such that we can act for the good of others with ease and pleasure. If, due to a psychological condition that is unresponsive to treatment, we cannot take joy in helping others, then this does not count against our possession of virtue. In fact, Foot thinks that such cases increase “the virtue that is needed if a man is to act well” (1978 [VV 14]). But we must tread carefully here, for she does not mean that one in such a circumstance is necessarily more virtuous than one who is not. Yet, facing a condition such as depression may test our virtue; its onset may lead one to fail to act in accordance with virtue, where an equally virtuous non-depressed agent would succeed. To speak more generally, some people will find themselves in circumstances, psychological or social, that will make greater demands on their commitment to goodness.[6] This means that those who have a relatively easy time acting courageously or benevolently simply have not had their commitment to goodness tested in the same way as someone who faces psychological obstacles. Those who face such obstacles must show more virtue, though they are not necessarily more virtuous than those in more ideal circumstances.

The virtue of wisdom presents another set of problems for the connection of virtue with the will, which is essential to Foot’s account. Unlike other virtues, wisdom seems primarily to be an excellence of the intellect rather than the will. Yet Foot argues that just because a putative virtue concerns the intellect does not mean that the will is not also essential to it. For her, wisdom has two components. First, it includes knowledge of the all-purpose means to very general good ends. She includes here ends such as “friendship, marriage, the bringing up of children, or the choice of ways of life” (1978 [VV 5]). Such knowledge is within the reach of anyone who wants it, since one need not be especially clever in order to acquire it and, in this way, it is unlike specialized scientific knowledge, which is something within the grasp of a lucky few who possess the necessary talent and opportunity to pursue it. This means that the knowledge involved in wisdom is within the scope of the will: we can get it if we want it, and therefore we can in fairness be evaluated for our success or failure in its realization.

The second part of wisdom, according to Foot, consists of knowing the worth of particular ends, something which she claims is difficult to describe. Here she has in mind the knowledge involved in realizing that a life spent in the pursuit of wealth or fame at the expense of good relationships is, in fact, a wasted life. This aspect of virtue is a matter of forming judgments about what is worthwhile in life, and she thinks one can make false judgments about these matters. One wonders here how having a false view of what is worthwhile in life can be a matter that is under the control of one’s will. Yet Foot believes that there is a connection with the will here as well, stating,

Wisdom in this second part is … to be described in terms of apprehension, and even judgement, but since it has to do with a man’s attachments it also characterises his will. (1978 [VV 7])

Thus, there is a case that the moral virtues, including wisdom, are virtues of the will construed broadly.[7] The second feature is that the virtues are beneficial to their possessor or to others. As mentioned above, Foot in her early work embraces the view that the virtues necessarily benefit their possessors. She abandons that view in her middle period in favor of one in which the virtues are beneficial “in some general way” (1978 [VV 2]). The benefit of the virtues may go to both their possessors and to others, or else exclusively to others. Courage, temperance, and wisdom fall in the first category, benefiting both their possessors and others. She believes that charity and justice sometimes fall in the second category because they sometimes require their possessors to sacrifice everything (1978 [VV 3]). Justice, as she notes, poses the biggest problem for the idea that virtues necessarily benefit their possessors (1978 [VV xv, 3]). Yet, it is also unclear that justice necessarily benefits others, at least on any given occasion; surely there are cases in which we could benefit someone by means that infringe her rights, just as there are clearly occasions in which we can do great benefit for many others, but only by violating another’s rights. So, there are no doubt occasions on which the demands of justice require that we renounce certain benefits that we could otherwise provide to others. But Foot seems to think that overall, it is beneficial for a society to consist of just individuals. As she states,

communities where justice and charity are lacking are apt to be wretched places to live, as Russia was under the Stalinists, or Sicily under the Mafia. (1978 [VV 3])

In this qualified sense, then, the virtues are good in that they are beneficial.

Foot raises the question of whether virtue always results in good action and, in “Virtues and Vices” (1978), she affirms that it does. One difficulty is to account for the appearance that someone who is engaging in a bad action may still exhibit a virtue. She gives the example of a fearless murderer: does the fearless murderer exhibit courage? Foot thinks that the appearance that he does is misleading. She allows that we may be inclined to say that an act ‘took courage’ or to speak of the ‘courage of the murderer’, but we still resist calling it a ‘courageous act’ or an ‘act of courage’. In “Von Wright on Virtue” (1989), Foot adds that we may be willing to describe an action as an ‘act of courage’ in cases where

the evil end is distant from the action concerned, as when, for instance, a man does something to save his own life or that of his companions in the course of some wicked enterprise, such as an unjust war. (1989 [MD 114])

She believes this implies that courage is more than a simple mastery of fear; instead, it is mastery of fear in the context of the pursuit of good ends. Therefore, courage overlaps with daring and boldness, but since the latter conditions may exist in the absence of any commitment to goodness, they are not identical with the virtue of courage. We may say, instead, that the mastery of fear is a necessary, but not a sufficient, condition for the possession of courage.

Foot’s arguments attempt to show that the virtues are beneficial qualities that produce good actions. One might think that this should be enough to establish that the virtues make one a good human being, but one more step is needed as it is not yet clear whether the virtues are necessary for one to be a good human being. Foot argues that the virtues are needed for humans as a corrective to general human characteristics that make it difficult for us to act well. In the case of virtues such as courage and temperance, it is rather obvious that we are susceptible to feeling fear in ways that make it difficult for us to achieve worthwhile goals, and that similar difficulties are posed by the temptations of pleasure. In the cases of charity and justice, there are deficiencies of motivation due to the fact that we are generally not as attached to the well-being and rights of others as we are to our own (1978 [VV 9]). These tendencies are general, and need not be exhibited in individual cases (1978 [VV 10]). As I noted above, some individuals might find it relatively easy to exhibit certain virtues, yet this is just an aspect of the circumstances of their lives, and it counts neither for nor against their possession of virtue, and it does not matter for the purpose of determining whether the virtues make one good qua human.

Since no disposition of the will can count as a virtue unless it is a corrective, according to Foot’s view in her middle period, “everything is seen to depend on what human nature is like” (1978 [VV 10]). She clearly believes that the traditional cardinal virtues (courage, temperance, justice, charity, and wisdom) deserve a place among the virtues as she construes them. Still she admits:

It is possible… that the traditional list of the virtues and vices puts too much emphasis on hedonistic and sensual impulses and does not sufficiently take account of less straightforward inclinations such as the desire to be put upon and dissatisfied, or the unwillingness to accept good things as they come along. (Ibid.)

On Foot’s view, then, our theory of human nature must be taken into account in our moral theorizing, and we must acknowledge as well that our theory of human nature is open to revision.

On Foot’s view, the goodness that is realized in possessing the virtues extends beyond moral goodness; for example, she argues that one may show courage in confronting something fearsome for the sake of one’s own life (1989 [MD 115]). The idea here, which she develops in her later work, is that one does not act well in neglecting one’s own interests, just as one who neglects the rights or well-being of others is defective. Human goodness encompasses more than moral goodness, and the virtues are connected with human goodness thus broadly understood.

It should be noted that, although Foot obviously made significant contributions to the development of neo-Aristotelian virtue theory, she explicitly disavowed allegiance to virtue ethics (RG 2). Her reasons for distancing herself from virtue ethics are somewhat obscure, and possibly misconstrue philosophers who advocate views under that heading, but it seems from her writings on the nature of morality that she considers morality something apart from virtue, something that is determined by an idealized, contractual moral code. Hence, she endorses the attempts of John Rawls and T.M. Scanlon to develop social contract approaches to morality (1985 [MD 103]).

6. Natural Goodness

Foot’s monograph Natural Goodness (2001, NG) and her late essays take up a new approach to the problems she confronted throughout her career. In her final published essay, “Rationality and Goodness” (2004, RG), Foot discusses the case of a farm boy from the Sudetenland who chose to die rather than to serve the Nazis.[8] In a letter to his family he writes,

We did not sign up for the SS, and so they condemned us to death. Both of us would rather die than stain our consciences with such deeds of horror. (RG 2; see Gollwitzer et al. 1956)

With regards to this situation, Foot asks,

Was this a rational choice? On what theory of practical rationality—of the rationality of choices—can this be made out? (RG 2)

She believes she has found a new approach that shows the Sudetenland boy’s choice to be rational, and that it would be rational for any similarly situated human agent to make that choice. This constitutes a second reversal of her view on this subject. In her late period, she believes that she erred in her middle period by embracing a mistaken view of reasons for action. Her middle period view falls into a category of instrumentalist theories of reasons for action. On such views, genuine reasons for action advance the fulfillment of our desires or our interests. Foot came to think that these views are open to a serious objection that was pointed out by Warren Quinn, who argues that on such instrumentalist conceptions of reasons for action we can be rationally shameless. These views tell us that an agent is rational when she acts on reasons that maximize the fulfillment of her preferences or interests, and it bids us to do that without regard to their content. The consequence of this view is that those with nasty preferences are advised by such views of practical rationality to maximize the fulfillment of those preferences (Quinn 1994: 216). This sits awkwardly with the idea that rationality is something that is supposed to guide our action.

Foot proposes that we reject the demand that moral actions fit with a preconceived notion of practical rationality, such as a desire-satisfaction conception, and, instead, we ought to adopt the view that moral considerations are one set of considerations that generate reasons, among others kinds of considerations that a rational agent must take into account (NG 11). After all, if practical rationality is held to be an authoritative guide to action as well as a virtue, surely practical rationality must require an agent to take account of the moral features of ends. Whether or not practical rationality requires taking account of those features is clearly pertinent to whether it is a genuine virtue, much less a master virtue. This argument suggests that our standards of rationality should derive from our standards for goodness of the will, rather than the other way around. On this view, our conception of practical rationality must fit within our overall conception of the human good. Foot believes that we can see such an approach at work in the way we reject present-desire theories of reasons for action. We commonly think that someone who puts her future at risk for the sake of some trivial, transient desire is behaving foolishly. As Foot writes,

Being unable to fit the supposed ‘reason’ into some preconceived present-desire-based theory of reasons for action, we do not query whether it really is a foolish way to behave, but rather hang onto the evaluation and shape our theory of reasons accordingly. (NG 63)

Moral reasons are of course not the only reasons to which we must respond to be rational agents. Foot believes that moral considerations, such as those of justice and charity, are on par with self-interest and desire-fulfillment. She also believes that there are considerations of family and friendship that provide a separate category of reasons for action (RG 8–9). A judgment about what is practically rational requires weighing these various considerations, and she concludes, “It is not always rational to give help where it is needed, to keep a promise, or even… always to speak the truth” (NG 11). Hence, moral reasons are not overriding. For example, a soldier may lie to save himself when in the hands of an enemy (RG 7). Even considerations of desire fulfillment can trump moral considerations, as, for example, an insignificant promise may be overridden by an unexpected opportunity to fulfill a long-held desire.

For the case of the Sudetenland farm boy, the result of Foot’s view is that we need not demonstrate that his decision to embrace death rather than serve the Nazis is in his best interest or serves his strongest desires. Of course, there is a certain sense in which he would rather die than serve the Nazis, but, as Foot points out, he need not lack a strong desire to live for his action to count as rational. As she writes,

If, according to a particular theory of rationality, a good action such as his seems dubiously rational, then so much the worse, not for the judgment, but rather for the theory. (RG 6)

She returns to the view that there are different sets of considerations that have the ability to justify and explain actions. In her early work, Foot apparently appeals to intuitions about what we count as reasons for action, though in her late work she adds to this account a framework for assessing which considerations possess this independent rationalizing status. She believes that the human will must be assessed against the background of facts concerning human life, especially against facts about what humans need. As Foot puts it, “the evaluation of human action depends… on essential features of specifically human life” (NG 14). On Foot’s view, then, our conception of practical rationality is inevitably tied to what is good for human beings, and must answer to facts concerning what is good for human beings as a species. We must take certain facts about the human condition into account and then we will see that these facts provide the basis for a case in favor of virtues, including, most importantly for Foot, justice and charity.

The leads to the second central idea of Foot’s late work is that moral goodness is a form of what she calls ‘natural goodness’. That is, moral goodness is an aspect of what makes us good as human beings. In this idea, she is developing a strain of thought present in some of her early writings such as “Goodness and Choice” (1961), where she defends the idea that there are objective features of living things that make them good as members of their species. She argues against Hare that there is a sense of ‘good cactus’ that is not merely a matter of preferences that we have in cacti: there are features of a good cactus that depend on what it is to flourish as a cactus (1961 [VV 141]). That is, a blighted, damaged, or otherwise unhealthy cactus is not, in this sense, a good cactus. This notion of ‘natural goodness’ is developed in her late work, where she claims that virtue makes humans good in the same way that blight-free, lush green flesh in a certain shape makes a cactus good. The norms which determine what makes something a good member of its kind she calls ‘natural norms’.

In Natural Goodness Foot makes the claim that natural norms are essential to the identification of anything as an organism: to identify something as an organism is ipso facto to view it from a normative standpoint. We can look at an organism as an ordinary physical system, but to do so is to miss its biological nature. There are two premises to her argument for this point: first, grasping something as an organism requires us to situate the organism against the background of its species, and second, to situate an organism against the background of its species requires us to consider it from a normative perspective. The first premise draws on Michael Thompson’s work on living things. On that account, identifying something as an organism situates it within the ‘wider context’ of its kind. As Thompson puts it,

If a thing is alive, if it is an organism, then some particular vital operations and processes must go on in it from time to time—eating, budding out, breathing, walking, growing, thinking, photosynthesizing. (Thompson 2008: 56)

But nothing can fall under these descriptions when understood only in terms appropriate to a non-living physical thing. Consider, for example, the case of eating: for an organism to be regarded as eating something, one must take it to be ingesting that which is normally nutritious for its kind, as well as absorbing it in such a way as to derive nutrition from it. Otherwise, we could not say that we witnessed an organism eating something, but instead we would be observing a fortuitous occurrence whereby an organism takes in some sort of material which happens to further its life (Thompson 2008: 57). Only against the background of a life form, which determines a background of norms for understanding the doings of an instance of that form of life, can the activities of an organism be understood as eating, or any other vital activity (Thompson 2003).

On this account, we can see that all living things exhibit, in various ways, a special kind of agency (Thompson.2008: 43) The growth of a fern is essentially different from the growth of a non-living thing such as puddle of rainwater or a trash heap, as the fern brings about its own growth by a process of cell division. Also, we can provide a description of how such a process should advance, and recognize when it has gone awry, whereas there is no question of the growth of a trash heap going wrong. The growth of a fern differs from that of a rhododendron, even though they both exhibit the same sort of agency characteristic of living things. We must, in principle, be able to discern the growth of the fern from a growth on the fern that is due to blight, for example, and such discernment requires a conception of how the fern’s life should progress. Hence, the vital operations that characterize something as an organism are intelligible only against the background of a life form. A particular organism, then, is understandable only in its relation to its species and how an individual of that species characteristically lives; hence, it involves a rudimentary identification of the thing as functionally organized. Note that this is a logical claim about what is involved in identifying something as an organism; the existence of life forms, in the sense employed by Thompson, is not a contingent fact about the development of the present set of living organisms, as is the existence of genera and of phyla. The existence of a life form is presupposed whenever we identify anything as an organism, be it the first or the last of its kind.

To situate an organism against the background of the characteristic function of its kind is to consider it from a normative perspective. More precisely, it is to assess that organism against what is normal for organisms of its species, and in doing so we make a normative assessment. Of course, there are many variations that are possible within a species, and not every variation found in an individual will count as a defect. As Foot points out, a blue tit can lack the patch of blue on its head without being hindered in living its life; this lack is not, then, a defect (NG 30). So, natural normativity involves some recognition of the specific components that are crucial to carrying out an organism’s vital operations. We must note that to possess such insight we merely need to appreciate that the organism is functionally organized, which is precisely what occurs when we situate an organism against the background of its species. This further implies that to consider an organism as such involves some recognition (though possibly mistaken) of its needs.

As we have seen, to characterize something as possessing the agency distinctive of living things requires bringing to bear norms for the life form of that individual; this is no less true in our own case. Of course, humans are capable of various modes of living, and in light of such diversity, it is questionable whether there is any characteristically human life, and so, whether there is any univocal sense of ‘good human’. Foot acknowledges that humans are rational animals and she believes this characteristic introduces a ‘sea change’ in how we approach describing our own species; reasoning and the application of reasoning to action are features which are evaluated in human beings. As Foot writes, “[W]hile [non-human] animals go for the good (thing) that they see, human beings go for what they see as good” (NG 56). We are capable of responding to reasons in a distinctively explicit way, inasmuch as we act on some understanding of which things are good. In fact, it is precisely the application of reasoning to our action which interests us in ethical evaluation. Foot claims that vices are defects in our responsiveness to reasons for action, which constitutes a sort of natural defect in humans, and, specifically, individuals with vices have defective wills. Inasmuch as we have the capacity to reason about how to act, we are subject to a distinctive sort of evaluation; unlike other natural defects, which may simply be the result of bad luck, we are responsible for our conception of how to act, and therefore can answer to rational criticism of that conception.

Thus far, this view appears to build the foundations of ethics on the very general characteristic of rationality, leaving aside other aspects of our nature. If so, it will surely not advance the project of justifying the virtues, for such a view seems to lead us to the empty standard of acting in accordance with ‘right reason’. Yet as pointed out above, the appeal to human nature serves not only to tell us that we are rational, but also to define what it is to reason well. Neo-Aristotelian ethical naturalism, as Foot pursues it, must be understood as a thesis concerning rationality, according to which practical rationality is species-relative. Our reasoning cannot ignore what we need as human beings and yet still claim to exhibit practical rationality. Hence, Foot can claim that as rational animals we are freed from a certain kind of obedience to nature, while maintaining that nature has some normative role for us; nature is normative over our reasoning, but not directly over our action. Foot states that human beings strive for what we see as good rather than the good that we see, as non-human animals do; she adds that what we see as good is inevitably informed by a conception of our form of life. Making that conception explicit and subjecting it to criticism is an essential part of moral reform, for ethical naturalists.

Despite the diversity of lives that we can choose, Foot argues that human beings are vulnerable to deprivations that parallel natural defects found in plants and animals. For example, human beings need the mental capacity for learning language, understanding stories, joining in songs, and laughing at jokes (NG 43). Foot writes:

In spite of the diversity of human goods—the elements that can make up good human lives—it is therefore possible that the concept of a good human life plays the same part in determining goodness of human characteristics and operations that the concept of flourishing plays in the determination of goodness in plants and animals. So far the conceptual structure seems to be intact. (NG 44)

However, it is important to realize that Foot is not saying that our understanding of good human reasoning is to be based on a morally neutral, biological notion of flourishing. There is a straightforward misreading of Foot’s naturalism that misconstrues what is natural about Foot’s naturalism (Andreou 2006). These readings take Foot to argue that moral goodness is crucial for human survival and reproduction.

Foot argues that ethical naturalism need not define the aim of practical reasoning in terms of promoting what an individual needs for survival and reproduction in a narrow biological sense, and she explicitly claims that she is not doing so. Rather, she believes that we inevitably possess an understanding of what makes for a good human life that informs our understanding of good human reasoning, and good human character in general. Structurally, this is how the parts of a plant are deemed good with reference to the flourishing of a plant. But Foot does not mean to suggest that the content of norms of governing human reasoning and character must be pegged to a notion of lush-green-leaves-and-deep-roots flourishing as adapted to human terms. Certainly, there are norms governing our assessment of human health, but there are also norms specifying how events are suppose to proceed when we reason and act, and these norms cannot be equated with what promotes human health, survival or reproduction, except insofar as these are rationally chosen by humans. We do not hold survival and reproduction as sacrosanct values and therefore it is not always rationally chosen. We see this reflected by the fact that justice and other virtues may require us to forgo having children, or even to lay down our lives. Foot clearly has these points in mind when she says:

Lack of capacity to reproduce is a defect in a human being. But choice of childlessness and even celibacy is not thereby shown to be defective choice, because human good is not the same as plant or animal good. (NG 42)

It remains to ask whether the account achieves its goals when it is understood as Foot intended. Can Foot show morality to be something with a foundation in human nature, as she understands it? The account Foot gives is promising, yet also programmatic. Foot believes that the moral virtues, together with prudence and virtues like friendship and loyalty that pertain to human relationships are justifiable on the basis of facts about human life. But which facts matter and why should they matter to us? If survival and reproduction are not the touchstone for human goodness, then what is? And why should we care about what is naturally good for humans? These are questions that proponents of Foot’s later views continue to pursue.


Primary Sources

When abbreviations are used to cite Foot’s works in the text, the abbreviation begins the bibliographic item below.

Foot’s principal essays are collected in the following two volumes.

  • [MD] Moral Dilemmas and Other Topics in Moral Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002. doi:10.1093/019925284X.001.0001. Includes:
    • 1970, “Morality and Art”, Proceedings of the British Academy, 56: 131–144; reprinted MD, 5–19.
    • 1983, “Moral Realism and Moral Dilemma”, The Journal of Philosophy, 80(7): 379–398; reprinted MD, 37–58.
    • 1984, “Killing and Letting Die”, in Jay L. Garfield and Patricia Hennessey (eds.), Abortion: Moral and Legal Perspectives, Amherst: University of Amherst Press; reprinted MD, 78–87.
    • 1985, “Morality, Action, and Outcome”, in Ted Honderich (ed.), Morality and Objectivity: A Tribute to J.L. Mackie, London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, pp. 23–38; reprinted MD, 88–104.
    • 1989, “Von Wright on Virtue”, The Philosophy of Georg Henrik von Wright, P.A. Schilpp (ed.), Open Court Publishing Company; reprinted MD, 105–116.
  • [VV] Virtues and Vices and Other Essays in Moral Philosophy, second edition, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002 (first edition 1978). doi:10.1093/0199252866.001.0001. Includes:
    • 1958, “Moral Arguments”, Mind, 67(268): 502–513; reprinted VV, 96–109. doi:10.1093/mind/LXVII.268.502
    • 1959, “Moral Beliefs”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 59(1): 83–104; reprinted VV, 110–131. doi:10.1093/aristotelian/59.1.83
    • 1961, “Goodness and Choice”, Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volumes, 35(1): 45–80, part I of a two part article with Alan Montefiore; reprinted VV, 132–147. doi:10.1093/aristoteliansupp/35.1.45
    • 1967, “The Problem of Abortion and the Doctrine of Double Effect”, Oxford Review, 5: 5–15; reprinted VV, 19–32.
    • [MSHI] 1972, “Morality as a System of Hypothetical Imperatives”, The Philosophical Review, 81(3): 305–316; reprinted VV, 157–173 with a long footnote added. doi:10.2307/2184328.
    • 1975, “A Reply to Professor Frankena”, Philosophy, 50(194): 455–459; reprinted VV, 174–180.
    • 1977, “Euthanasia”, Philosophy and Public Affairs, 6(2): 85–112; reprinted VV, 33–61.
    • 1978, “Virtues and Vices”, essay for this volume, VV, 1–18.

Foot has one monograph:

  • [NG] Natural Goodness, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2001. doi:10.1093/0198235089.001.0001

Individual papers cited in the text:

  • [RG] “Rationality and Goodness” in Modern Moral Philosophy, (Royal Institute of Philosophy Supplement 54), Anthony O’Hear (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004: 1–14. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511550836.002
  • 1954, with Jonathan Harrison, “When is a Principle a Moral Principle?” (Symposium), Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society (Supplementary Volume), 28(1): 95–134. doi:10.1093/aristoteliansupp/28.1.95

Secondary Literature

  • Andreou, Chrisoula, 2006, “Getting on in a Varied World”, Social Theory and Practice, 32(1): 61–73. doi:10.5840/soctheorpract20063213
  • Annas, Julia, 2011, Intelligent Virtue, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199228782.001.0001
  • Conradi, Peter J. and Gavin Lawrence, 2010, “Professor Philippa Foot: Philosopher regarded as being among the finest moral thinkers of the age” The Independent, October 19, 2010.
  • FitzPatrick, William J., 2000, Teleology and the Norms of Nature, New York: Garland Pub.
  • Gollwitzer, Helmut, Käthe Kuhn, and Reinhold Schneider (eds), 1956, Dying We Live (Du hast mich heimgesucht bei Nacht), Reinhard C. Kuhn (trans.), London: The Harvill Press.
  • Hacker-Wright, John, 2009, “What Is Natural About Foot’s Ethical Naturalism?” Ratio, 22(3): 308–321. doi:10.1111/j.1467-9329.2009.00434.x
  • –––, 2009, “Human Nature, Personhood, and Ethical Naturalism”, Philosophy, 84(3): 413–427. doi:10.1017/S0031819109000394
  • –––, 2012, “Ethical Naturalism and the Constitution of Agency”, Journal of Value Inquiry, 46(1): 13–23. doi:10.1007/s10790-012-9321-5
  • –––, 2013a, “Human Nature, Virtue, and Rationality”, in Aristotelian Ethics in Contemporary Perspective, Julia Peters (ed.), London: Routledge, ch. 6.
  • –––, 2013b, Philippa Foot’s Moral Thought, London: Bloomsbury.
  • Hursthouse, Rosalind, 1999, On Virtue Ethics, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/0199247994.001.0001
  • –––, 2012, “Philippa Ruth Foot 1920–2010”, Biographical Memoirs of Fellows of the British Academy, XI: 176–196. [Hursthouse 2012 available online]
  • Hursthouse, Rosalind, Gavin Lawrence, and Warren Quinn (eds.), 1995, Virtues and Reasons: Philippa Foot and Moral Theory: Essays in Honour of Philippa Foot, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Lawrence, Gavin, 1995, “The Rationality of Morality” in Hursthouse, Lawrence, & Quinn 1995: ch. 5.
  • Lott, Micah, 2012, “Have Elephant Seals Refuted Aristotle? Nature, Function, and Moral Goodness”, Journal of Moral Philosophy, 9(3): 353–375. doi:10.1163/174552412X625727
  • –––, 2012, “Moral Virtue as Knowledge of Human Form”, Social Theory and Practice, 38(3): 407–431. doi:10.5840/soctheorpract201238323
  • Millgram, Elijah, 2009, “Life and Action”, Analysis, 69(3): 557–564. doi:10.1093/analys/anp087
  • Odenbaugh, Jay, 2017, “Nothing in Ethics Makes Sense Except in the Light of Evolution? Natural Goodness, Normativity, and Naturalism”, Synthese, 194(4): 1–25. doi:10.1007/s11229-015-0675-7.
  • Quinn, Warren, 1994, Morality and Action, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139172677
  • Rachels, James, 1975, “Active and Passive Euthanasia”, New England Journal of Medicine 292(2): 78–80. doi:10.1056/NEJM197501092920206
  • Smith, Michael, 1994, The Moral Problem, Malden, MA: Basil Blackwell.
  • Thompson, Michael, 2003, “Three Degrees of Natural Goodness”, originally appeared in Italian translation as “Tre gradi di bontà naturale”, Iride, 38: 191–197; author's preprint in English available online.
  • –––, 2004, “Apprehending Human Form”, Modern Moral Philosophy, (Royal Institute of Philosophy Supplement 54), Anthony O’Hear (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511550836.004
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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


Parts of this entry are adapted with significant revisions from my book Philippa Foot’s Moral Thought (London: Bloomsbury 2013).

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John Hacker-Wright <>

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