Moral Naturalism

First published Thu Jun 1, 2006; substantive revision Wed May 30, 2018

While the term ‘moral naturalism’ has a number of different meanings, it is most frequently used to describe naturalistic versions of moral realism. Moral realists hold that there are objective, mind-independent facts and properties; moral naturalists hold that these objective, mind-independent moral facts are natural facts. ‘Moral naturalism’ can also be used as a label for views in normative ethics which hold that things are good if they are natural, or as a label for any view in metaethics which is consistent with a general metaphysical naturalism. But naturalistic moral realism is the subject of this entry. Moral naturalism appeals to many, since it combines the advantages of naturalism and realism, but others have argued that moral naturalism does inadequate justice to central dimensions of our practice with moral concepts. In this entry, we examine the most prominent arguments for and against moral naturalism, and profile three of the most popular and influential versions of moral naturalism.

1. Introduction

There is a broad sense of “moral naturalism” whereby a moral naturalist is someone who believes an adequate philosophical account of morality can be given in terms entirely consistent with a naturalistic position in philosophical inquiry more generally. As science has developed over the last several centuries, it has seemed to many that the kinds of facts that scientists investigate through empirical methods are the only kinds of facts that there are. Religion and superstition have fallen by the wayside; the only things that we ought to believe in are the kinds of things that science can tell us about. This increasingly common attitude combines a metaphysical doctrine—that the only things that exist are natural things—with an epistemological doctrine—that we know about the world strictly by the use of experimentation and other empirical methods. Moral naturalism refers to any version of moral realism that is consistent with this general philosophical naturalism. Moral realism is the view that there are objective, mind-independent moral facts. For the moral naturalist, then, there are objective moral facts, these facts are facts concerning natural things, and we know about them using empirical methods.

Naturalism in this sense is opposed by those who reject a parsimonious naturalistic metaphysics and stand willing to allow a domain of nonnatural or supernatural facts to play an essential role in our understanding of morality. Naturalism is also opposed by “anti-realists”, including error theorists, constructivists, relativists, and expressivists. According to error theorists, there are no moral facts of any kind. And according to constructivists, relativists, and expressivists, there are moral facts, but these facts are subjective, rather than objective. Anti-realists hold that, if there are any moral facts, these facts are merely products of our contingent attitudes. Anti-realists are typically moral naturalists according to the more general definition of ‘moral naturalism’, as anti-realists typically attempt to understand morality in terms that are consistent with general philosophical naturalism. But for the purposes of this entry, anti-realism should be understood as opposed to moral naturalism.

1.1 What is Moral Naturalism?

We have said that moral naturalism is a conjunction of three claims:

Moral Realism: There are objective, mind-independent moral facts.

Metaphysical Naturalism: Moral facts are natural facts.

Epistemic Naturalism: We know moral claims are true in the same way that we know about claims in the natural sciences.

But moral naturalism is sometimes associated with a fourth, linguistic claim, about the nature of moral language. That claim is:

Analytic Naturalism: Our moral claims are synonymous with certain (highly complex) claims in the natural sciences.

Of these four claims, Metaphysical Naturalism is often taken to be the claim that is most central to the doctrine of moral naturalism. The debate between naturalists and non-naturalists is typically taken to be a debate about the nature of moral properties. Are those properties natural or non-natural?—this seems to be a straightforward metaphysical question.

But Metaphysical Naturalism is not an unproblematic thesis. What does the naturalness of a fact or property consist in, exactly? That’s a pretty basic question, but philosophers are often left embarrassingly tongue-tied when called on to answer it. Some claim (e.g., Bedke 2009, Enoch 2010, Lutz forthcoming) that natural properties or facts are those that have causal or explanatory power, while others have attempted to distinguish natural properties from non-natural properties in other metaphysical terms (see McPherson 2015). But the difficulty of defining a “natural” property, often combined with a general Humean or Kantian skepticism about philosophers’ ability to meaningfully investigate any metaphysical questions, has made many philosophers wary of discussing Metaphysical Naturalism directly. Accordingly, many define moral naturalism through the lens of Analytic Naturalism or Epistemic Naturalism.

We might define a “natural fact” not in metaphysical terms, but rather in linguistic terms: as the kind of fact about which we make certain kinds of claims—natural or descriptive claims. Claims are or are not “natural” depending on what kind of terminology they use. Claims that use normative terminology like ‘good’, ‘bad’, ‘right’, ‘wrong’, etc. are normative claims. Claims that avoid this use of evaluative terminology, and instead use terminology common to the natural sciences, are natural claims. If moral claims and natural claims are synonymous, as the Analytic Naturalist holds, then moral and natural claims must refer to the same facts. If the moral claims refer to the same facts that natural claims refer to, it follows that moral claims refer to natural facts. Thus, Analytic Naturalism can provide us with a sensible and tractable explanation of how moral facts could be “natural” facts (Parfit 2011, chapters 24–25).

Alternatively, we might define ‘natural facts’ in epistemic terms: as those facts that can only be investigated through empirical methods. Thus, if we accept Metaphysical Naturalism and hold that moral facts are “natural”, this entails Epistemic Naturalism—that moral facts are the kinds of facts that we investigate using empirical methods. Shafer-Landau (2003) defines a ‘natural’ fact in these epistemic terms, and so, because he believes that we can know moral facts by using intuition (which is not an empirical method), he rejects moral naturalism.

It might be tempting to say that moral naturalism should, properly understood, consist in the conjunction of Epistemic, Metaphysical, and Analytic Naturalism. But that suggestion would be unacceptable, as there is a strong tension between Epistemic Naturalism and Analytic Naturalism. If Analytic Naturalism is true, then it should be possible (at least in principle) to go through a process of conceptual analysis that would reveal the synonymy between moral claims and claims in the natural sciences. But if this is possible, then substantive moral principles are knowable a priori—which, in turn, entails that substantive moral principles are not known in the same way as scientific principles. Analytic Naturalism therefore seems to entail that Epistemic Naturalism is false, and vice versa. Naturalists who accept Analytic Naturalism are called, appropriately enough, analytic naturalists. Naturalists who reject Analytic Naturalism are synthetic naturalists, since they hold that claims regarding relations between the moral and the natural are synthetic rather than analytic.

This is not to say that analytic naturalists allow no room for empirical investigation into morality—far from it. If, for instance, an analytic naturalist were to hold that the term ‘good’ is synonymous with ‘pleasurable’, they would hold that the claim “Pleasure is good” is analytic, and knowable a priori. But the claim “It is good to help others” would be the kind of claim that is amenable to empirical investigation, in virtue of the fact that “It is good to help others” would be synonymous with “It is pleasant to help others”, and whether pleasure results from helping others is the kind of claim that can be empirically investigated. So analytic naturalists should be understood as saying that some moral claims—in particular, moral claims that state general relations between natural properties and moral properties (like “Pleasure is good”)—are knowable a priori. Synthetic naturalists claim that all moral claims are synthetic claims, knowable by empirical methods.

In sum, while any moral naturalist will agree with the statement that moral facts are natural facts, different philosophers will mean different things by that statement.

1.2 Why be a Moral Naturalist?

Moral naturalism is an attractive view. As a form of realism, it offers to make robust sense of moral objectivity and moral knowledge, allowing for moral utterances to be truth-apt in straightforward ways and for some of them to be true. And as a form of naturalism it is widely seen as preferable to rival forms of moral realism. Moral properties and facts, realistically construed, can often seem unpalatably “queer”, as Mackie famously expressed it (Mackie 1977, chapter 1, section 9): a realist can seem committed to the existence of metaphysically far out entities or properties and embarrassed by the lack of any plausible epistemic story of how we can obtain knowledge of them. The naturalist offers to save realism but eliminate the mystery.

Moral realism and general philosophical naturalism are both attractive views in their own right. Moral realism seems necessary to do justice to do our sense of right and wrong being more than a matter of opinion, and philosophical naturalism has proven to be the most successful project, ever, for advancing human knowledge and understanding. And while anti-realists and non-naturalists dispute realism and naturalism, respectively, moral naturalism is a plausible conjunction of two plausible views.

1.2.1 Support by Contrast

In recent years, moral non-naturalism has been the subject of much more discussion than moral naturalism, as moral non-naturalists have discovered new ways of articulating and defending their view. But along with an increase in the popularity of moral non-naturalism, there has been a corresponding increase in the popularity of arguments against non-naturalism. These arguments, indirectly, provide support for moral naturalism. If there are arguments that have force against the moral non-naturalist, but not the naturalist, then these arguments give us reason to be naturalists about morality. While many objections can and have been offered against non-naturalism, we’ll look at the two most prominent here.

The first argument against normative non-naturalism concerns normative supervenience. The normative supervenes on the natural; in all metaphysically possible worlds in which the natural facts are the same as they are in the actual world, the moral facts are the same as well. This claim has been called the “least controversial thesis in metaethics” (Rosen forthcoming); it is very widely accepted. But it is also a striking fact that stands in need of some explanation. For naturalists, such an explanation is easy to provide: the moral facts just are natural facts, so when we consider worlds that are naturally the same as the actual world, we will ipso facto be considering worlds that are morally the same as the actual world. But for the non-naturalist, no such explanation seems available. In fact, it seems to be in principle impossible for a non-naturalist to explain how the moral supervenes on the natural. And if the non-naturalist can offer no explanation of this phenomenon that demands explanation, this is a heavy mark against non-naturalism (McPherson 2012).

It is highly controversial whether this argument succeeds (for discussion, see McPherson (2012), Enoch (2011, Ch. 6), Wielenberg (2014, Ch. 1), Leary 2017, Väyrynen 2017, Rosen forthcoming,). But if it does succeed, then it provides a good reason to think that moral properties, if they exist, must be natural properties.

The second argument against moral non-naturalism concerns moral epistemology. According to evolutionary debunking arguments, our moral beliefs are products of evolution, and this evolutionary etiology of our moral beliefs serves to undermine them. Exactly why evolution debunks our moral beliefs is a matter of substantial controversy, and the debunking argument has been interpreted in a number of different ways (Vavova 2015). Sharon Street, whose statement of the evolutionary debunking argument has been highly influential, holds that debunking arguments make a problem for all versions of moral realism—her paper is entitled “A Darwinian Dilemma for Realist Theories of Value.” But according to another popular line of argument, these debunking arguments are only problems for moral non-naturalism. The fundamental worry is that our moral beliefs are the product of evolutionary facts rather than moral facts. If this is so, this would serve to debunk our moral beliefs, either because it is a necessary condition on justified belief that you take your beliefs to be explained by the facts in question (Joyce 2006, Ch. 6; Bedke 2009; Lutz forthcoming) or else because the non-naturalist is left with no way to explain the reliability of our moral beliefs (Enoch 2009, Schechter 2017).

But if moral naturalism is true, the realist needn’t grant the skeptic’s premise that our moral beliefs are the product of evolutionary facts rather than moral facts. If moral facts are natural, then we needn’t see moral facts as being contrary to natural, evolutionary facts. The moral facts might be among these evolutionary facts that explain our moral beliefs. If, for instance, to be good just is to be conducive to social cooperation, then an evolutionary account that says that we judge things to be good only when they are conducive to social cooperation would not debunk any of our beliefs about goodness. This account would, instead, provide a deep vindication of those beliefs (Copp 2008).

It is open to naturalists to say that the moral facts are wholly or partly responsible for us having the moral beliefs that we have. This allows them to address any number of different epistemic objections that the moral non-naturalist seems ill-equipped to answer. If these objections do succeed against only the non-naturalist, that’s a good reason to think that moral properties, if they exist, must be natural properties.

2. Objections to Naturalism

We’ve just seen that there is some reason to think that, if there are any moral properties, those properties must be natural moral properties. In this section, we’ll look at the most prominent objections to moral naturalism.

2.1 The Open Question Argument

By far the most famous and influential argument against moral naturalism is G.E. Moore’s Open Question Argument (Moore 1903, 5–21). Moore’s thought is as follows. Suppose “\(N\)” to abbreviate a term expressing the concept of some natural property \(N\), maximally conducing to human welfare perhaps, and suppose a naturalist proposes to define goodness as \(N\)-ness. We swiftly show this to be false by supposing someone to ask of something acknowledged to be \(N\), whether it was good. This, Moore urges, is an open question. The point is, essentially, that it is not a stupid question in the sort of way, “I acknowledge that Jimmy is an unmarried man but is he, I wonder, a bachelor?” is a stupid question: if you need to ask it, you don’t understand it. Given what the words concerned mean, the question of whether a given unmarried man is a bachelor is, in Moore’s terminology, closed—there is no way for a conceptually competent individual to be in doubt about the answer to this question. So goodness and \(N\)-ness, unlike bachelorhood and unmarried-man-hood, are not one and the same.

Of course the concepts may be coextensive. For all the Open Question Argument shows, it may be the case, for instance, that a thing is good if and only if it conduces to welfare: utilitarianism of that kind might be a synthetic moral truth. But what the Open Question Argument is supposed to rule out is that “good” and “\(N\)” pick out, in virtue of semantic equivalence, not two distinct and coextensive properties, but rather one and the same property. As Moore emphasizes, we should distinguish the question, “What is goodness?” from the question “What things are good?” (1903, 5) The Open Question Argument is supposed to rule out certain answers to the first question, i.e., naturalistic answers such as “conduciveness to happiness.” But it is not meant to rule out our answering the second question by offering, e.g., “those things which conduce to happiness.”

A lot of fire has been directed at this little argument in the century since Moore published it. A central worry is that he failed to consider a crucial possibility. Consider the biconditional:

\(x\) is good iff \(x\) is \(N\).

Moore, as we saw, notes that this may express a claim about what goodness is or a claim about what things are good. The former claim he understands as a claim that “good” and “\(N\)” are equivalent in meaning and so denote the very same property. He failed, however, to notice the possibility that they might denote the very same property even though they are not equivalent in meaning. The assumption at work here David Brink calls “the Semantic Test for Properties”, according to which two terms pick out the same property only if they mean the same (Brink 1989, chapter 6 and Brink 2001). Brink thinks we can be confident that this assumption is false (and all the more so if we understand sameness of meaning as something epistemically transparent to competent speakers so that epistemic inequivalence implies semantic inequivalence). One counterexample is by now proverbial:

\(x\) is water iff \(x\) is H\(_2\)O.

It seems obvious that “water” doesn’t mean the same as “H\(_2\)O” (and all the more so if we take speakers as authoritative as to what their words mean). For it was a discovery when 18th century chemists figured this fact out. But being water and being H\(_2\)O are not just a case of a pair of coextensive properties, such as being a cordate and being a renate. Being water and being H\(_2\)O are one and the same identical property, the property identity in question being a posteriori, not a priori and certainly not analytic. So the Open Question Argument cannot refute Metaphysical Naturalism. At most, the Open Question Argument gives us a reason to be synthetic, rather than analytic, naturalists.

But it is not clear that the Open Question Argument proves even this much. Another criticism, forcefully urged by Michael Smith, is that the Open Question Argument seems to prove too much, being just a particular instance of the piece of reasoning embodied in the Paradox of Analysis. The practice of conceptual analysis, this reasoning goes, aspires to provide real philosophical illumination; however, if all analytic truths have to be as obvious as “a bachelor is an unmarried male”, then all pieces of conceptual analysis must be either false or trivial. That conclusion would be highly embarrassing to much modern philosophy (Smith 1994, 37–39). But once we allow that analytic truths may be unobvious, the appearance of openness in the question whether an \(N\) thing is a good thing ceases to look very significant.

A further criticism of the Open Question Argument comes from William Frankena (1939). Frankena worries that the Open Question Argument begs the question at issue. “Is such-and-such, which is \(N\), good?” is an open question precisely when a definition of \(N\)-ness in terms of goodness is not an analytic truth—and that is precisely what Moore is trying to establish. Moore seems to owe us more support than has been given for the claim that all questions concerning natural-moral identities are open.

One might claim that the failure of other attempted analyses of ‘good’ gives us a kind of inductive reason to think that no analysis of goodness can be successful. This inductive argument, if successful, might answer Frankena’s objection. But it is not clear how strong such an inductive argument is. As Finlay (2014, Ch. 1) argues, if it is true that goodness can be analyzed, the very truth of that hypothesis predicts that every analysis except the correct one will be false. Thus, it also predicts that every question of the form ‘\(X\) is \(N\), but is \(X\) good?’ will feel open, except for the one question that includes the correct analysis of goodness in place of \(N\). So we should not take the existence of open questions of the form ‘\(X\) is \(N\), but is \(X\) good?’ as data against the hypothesis that ‘good’ can be analyzed, since that data is actually predicted by the hypothesis. The only way to know that an analysis fails is to test it, and it’s always possible that the correct analysis remains untested.

2.2 The Normativity and Triviality Objections

Although Moore’s original version of the Open Question Argument today has few defenders, there have been a number of recent attempts to refashion it into a more compelling form. One popular version of the Open Question Argument, called the Normativity Objection (Scanlon 2014; Parfit 2011), sidesteps questions about the cognitive significance of moral and descriptive terminology and appeals to considerations regarding the natures of natural and normative facts. Moral facts tell us what is good in the world and what we have reasons or obligations to do. Natural facts—the kinds of facts that scientists study—are facts about the innate physical structure of the universe and the causal principles that govern the interaction of matter. Those are obviously just two different kinds of facts. Moral facts, because they are facts about goodness, reasons, obligations, and the like, are normative facts. But natural facts are not normative. In trying to give a naturalistic account of morality, naturalists forgot the most important thing: that moral facts aren’t purely facts about the way the world is; they are facts about what matters.

There are, generally, two ways in which a naturalist might respond to this objection. First, a naturalist could say that moral facts aren’t essentially normative; it may be the case that we typically have reasons to act morally, but reason-giving force is not part of the essence of moral facts. That suggestion might have the feeling of an absurdity—of course moral facts are the kinds of things that provide reasons; if an action is morally required, that’s a good reason to do it! But according to some “reforming definitions” of morality (Brandt 1979; Railton 1986), while we may intuitively think that moral facts give reasons, that is a kind of defect in our conception of morality. It would be more accurate and fruitful to define moral facts in terms that are not necessarily reason-providing. Thinking about moral facts in this way is different than how we typically think about moral facts—that is why this kind of account constitutes a reforming definition of morality—but we are talking about morality all the same (Railton 1986).

The biggest problem for reforming definitions is that they suggest that normativity is somehow dispensable to morality. But as Joyce (2000, Ch. 1) argues, normativity is a non-negotiable commitment of our moral discourse. If the only kinds of facts that exist are natural, and natural facts are not a source of reasons for everyone, then, argues Joyce, this amounts to a proof that moral facts don’t exist. Reformers may respond by calling into question Joyce’s notion of “non-negotiable” commitments. For Joyce, it is obvious that facts that do not provide reasons for everyone are, ipso facto, not moral facts. But it is controversial whether any of our concepts have commitments that are non-negotiable in this way (cf. Prinzing 2017).

The second way to respond to the Normativity Objection is to say that moral facts are both natural and normative, in virtue of the fact that normativity itself is a natural phenomenon. This suggestion might also have a feel of absurdity to it. How could normativity be natural? The most popular strategy for substantiating natural normativity is a two-step strategy. First, show that all normative concepts can be analyzed in terms of one, fundamental normative concept. Second, show that that fundamental normative concept picks out a natural property. There are a number of ways that such an account could proceed: here are two recent, influential examples:

  • Mark Schroeder (2005, 2007) accepts the popular “buck-passing” or “reasons first” account of normativity (Scanlon 1998), which says that all normative concepts can be analyzed in terms of the concept of a reason. Schroeder also accepts the Humean Theory of Reasons (as a substantive, synthetic truth), which says that, roughly, \(S\) has a reason to \(\Phi\) just in case \(\Phi\)-ing will satisfy one of \(S\)’s desires.[1] If the Humean Theory is correct, then being a reason is a natural property. And, if all other moral facts are to be analyzed in terms of reasons, then all moral facts are natural facts.
  • Phillipa Foot (2001) rejects the “buck-passing” account and accepts a traditional “value first” account of normativity, which says that goodness is the fundamental normative concept. She also accepts a neo-Aristotelian account of goodness, which says that, roughly, something is good for a person just in case it contributes to that person’s flourishing (where flourishing is itself supposed to be a complex natural property including healthiness, happiness, etc.) If neo-Aristotelianism is correct, goodness is a natural property. And if all moral facts are to be analyzed in terms of goodness, then all moral facts are natural facts.

This two-step strategy is popular and promising, but it is certainly not uncontroversial. Those moved by the Open Question Argument and the Normativity Objection are skeptical that the second step of the naturalizing strategy could ever be completed. Non-naturalists doubt that it could ever be shown that the fundamental normative concept picks out some natural property because normative properties and natural properties just seem to obviously be different kinds of properties. Wittgenstein claimed to “see clearly, as it were in a flash of light, not only that no description that I can think of would do to describe what I mean by absolute value, but that I would reject every significant description that anybody could possibly suggest, ab initio, on the ground of its significance” (Wittgenstein 1965). David Enoch (2011) is more pithy, saying simply that natural properties and normative properties are just too different for any natural account of a fundamental normative property to be satisfying.

But while many have felt the force of this “just too different” intuition, it’s unclear what that charge amounts to. In what sense are the natural and the normative “just too different?” Schroeder thinks that the “too different” intuition has force only if there is “a perfectly general single truth about which any reductive view would be forced into error” (Schroeder 2005, 14). The existence of such a truth would be the proof that the natural and normative are just too different; without such a truth, the non-naturalist hasn’t offered much by way of an argument against naturalism. But because all normative claims conceptually reduce to claims about reasons, argues Schroeder, there will be no such general truth, provided that we have a coherent account of the foundational notion of a reason. If all normative claims are conceptually reducible to claims about reasons, then a coherent account of reasons can explain all normative claims, without error. These fundamental normative facts about reasons are themselves explained by the natural facts to which reasons reduce. But because this reduction of reasons will take the form of a synthetic reduction, there end up being no conceptual connections between the normative and the natural. This general lack of conceptual connections between the normative and the natural is what explains the presence of the “just too different” intuition, and it is fully compatible with moral naturalism as a synthetic metaphysical truth.

Schroeder’s response may succeed in providing a naturalist-friendly explanation of the “just too different” intuition, but it seems strange to say that the existence of numerous analytic relations between different normative concepts, combined with a lack of analytic relations between normative and natural concepts, should in any way work to support the thesis that the normative is natural. It may well be the case that the lack of conceptual connections between the natural and normative is better explained by non-naturalism (Enoch 2011).

Derek Parfit’s Triviality Objection (Parfit 2011) is another contemporary extension of the Open Question Argument. If moral naturalism is true, says Parfit, then it will be possible to make moral claims and natural claims and have those two claims be about the same fact. Parfit worries that if the two claims are about the same fact, then those two claims must contain all the same information. And a statement of equivalence between any two claims that contain the same information must be trivial. But moral claims that describe the relationships between moral facts and natural facts are not trivial at all—they are highly substantive.

Although Parfit’s focus on the nature of normative facts helps to illuminate exactly what is supposed to be deficient about the naturalist’s account, it is not clear that this Triviality Objection is any more forceful than the Open Question Argument. Parfit’s central motivating thoughts are that (a) natural-moral identity claims are substantive rather than trivial, and therefore (b) moral claims contain different information than natural claims do, which makes it plausible that (c) moral claims concern a different kind of fact. These are exactly the central thoughts behind Moore’s Open Question Argument, and so we can expect naturalists to respond to this objection in largely the same way that they respond to the Open Question Argument. And, indeed, this is what we find. Naturalists have typically responded to the Triviality Objection by saying that moral-natural identities contain additional information in virtue of the fact that they tell us something about the nature of the moral facts in question. Thus, moral-natural identities are informative in the same way that other natural identity claims (like water = H\(_2\)O) are (Copp 2017).

2.3 Motivation Objection

The last objection to moral naturalism that we will consider is the Motivation Objection. This objection is a favorite of metaethical expressivists, and they deploy it with equal fervor against all moral realists, both naturalists and non-naturalists alike. But it is still worthy of discussion as a major objection to naturalist moral realism, because naturalism is the realist view that seems to have the most problem answering the objection.

According to a view known as judgement internalism, you can’t make a moral judgement and not be at least somewhat motivated to act in accordance with it. If I sincerely judge that I ought to give money to charity, then it seems that I must be at least somewhat motivated to give when the opportunity arises. Someone who lacks any inclination to give to charity does not really judge that they ought to give to charity.

Judgement internalism is a plausible view, and, if it is true, that spells trouble for moral naturalists. Plausibly, if a moral judgement is just a belief to the effect that some natural fact obtains, I might at least conceivably hold that belief and simply not give a damn. In which case, if naturalism is true, internalism must be false. But many philosophers—particularly expressivists—hold that judgement internalism is true. So much the worse for naturalists.

What is at stake in the debate between judgement internalists and their opponents (“externalists”, inevitably) is the question of whether a certain kind of character is possible: the amoralist. The amoralist is precisely the sort of person the internalist says is not possible: a character who makes moral judgements but couldn’t care less about them. He features prominently in two influential defenses of externalism, found in the writings of David Brink and Sigrún Svavarsdóttir (Brink 1986; Brink 1989, chapter 3, section 3; Svavarsdóttir 1999, 2006). Both offer up descriptions of people of just this kind urging that they are eminently credible and all too intelligible.

Internalists deny that it is possible for anyone to be a genuine amoralist. While someone might appear to be making moral judgements they do not care about, such a person is in fact not making genuine moral judgements at all, according to the internalist. Rather they are making what R. M. Hare called inverted commas moral judgements (1952, 124–126, 163–165).

The internalist claims that in the mouth of the amoralist, a moral utterance fails to mean quite what it does when it is used by you or me. What is missing is some action-guiding motivation-entailing dimension of meaning that naturalism seems ill-suited to capture. This is disputed by externalists such as Brink and Svavarsdóttir, who deny that there is any such dimension to capture. However, a more subtle alternative view (Copp 2001; cf. Barker 2000) might deny that any such dimension was part of the “standard core meaning” (Copp 2001, 18) of moral terms, but admit its presence as something implicated, not entailed, by moral utterances. Because this dimension is merely implicated, the amoralist’s “Killing people is wrong but I couldn’t care less”, which cancels the implicature, may be somehow surprising and inappropriate, but it may nonetheless express a coherent, meaningful thought.

This move might promise to account for much of the intuitive appeal of internalism while remaining fundamentally naturalistic. That would leave in place worries about the intelligibility of a possible disconnection between thought about what is right, etc., and thought about what to do. These, however, might recede as the naturalist puts flesh on his account of moral properties. Thus, on Copp’s own view, the truth conditions of moral concepts are determined, roughly, by facts about which moral standards are such that their currency would best conduce to meeting society’s needs (Copp 2001, 28–29, recapitulating Copp 1995). Certainly, you and I might conceivably disagree about that while nonetheless coinciding in all our motivations. At which point the issue is going to turn on whether that sort of disagreement is really properly to be considered moral disagreement at all.

3. Contemporary Naturalism

In this final section, we will examine three leading versions of moral naturalism in detail.

3.1 Neo-Aristotelian Naturalism

One important school of thought here is represented by philosophers whose work is inspired by that of Aristotle. This view has its roots in the writings of G. E. M. Anscombe, P. T. Geach, and the early Philippa Foot, among others. Its contemporary representatives include Philippa Foot (2001), Rosalind Hursthouse (1999), Martha Nussbaum (1995), and Judith Jarvis Thomson (1996, 1997, 2001, 2008). As this list makes clear, this is very much the official metaethical theory among many important contemporary virtue ethicists.

According to (neo-)Aristotelian virtue ethics, the primary moral concept is that of virtue. Virtue is a property of people; virtuous people are good people. So what does it take for someone to be a good person? Aristotle’s influential answer to that question is that what it takes to be a good thing is for that thing to successfully perform its function. And, Aristotle argued, all living things have a proper function, which is determined by their nature. Just as hammers and nails have different functions which spring from the nature of those things, living things have functions that are also determined by their natures. Worker bees are supposed to collect honey—worker bees that do this well are good bees. Venus flytraps are supposed to capture flies—those that do this well are good flytraps. And humans are good if they pursue their function, as dictated by their nature.

A big problem here, it is widely supposed, is the biology. Aristotelian ethics embraces an essentialist, teleological conception of the nature of a species that doesn’t square with modern science. And the prospects for grounding ethics in modern post-Darwinian biology seem hopeless: evolutionary biology has very little (at least of a positive nature) to tell us about metaethics except insofar as it might be taken to add plausibility to the kind of broad naturalism described at the outset. (Indeed, as noted, evolutionary biology may debunk rather than support our moral beliefs.) Nussbaum has sought to respond to claims of this sort that have been ably canvassed in the work of Bernard Williams (Nussbaum 1995). Williams reads Aristotle as understanding questions about human nature as “external” scientific questions to be addressed independently of any ethical considerations. This, Nussbaum charges, is a mistake: an external understanding of human nature would indeed tell us little about ethics. Aristotle’s understanding of biology and indeed science generally is what she calls “internal”, and as such are pervasively informed by substantive ethical understandings. But to understand ethical facts as grounded in facts about human nature, where the facts about human nature are understood in a way that is already pervasively and substantively moralized, no longer looks much like a form of naturalism, and appears quite consistent with a variety of competing metaethical views such as constructivism, expressivism, or non-naturalism.

Neo-Aristotelian naturalism is articulated at length and along mutually similar lines in Foot’s Natural Goodness (2001) and Hursthouse’s On Virtue Ethics (1999). We will focus on Hursthouse, whose account is the clearer and more detailed of the two. Ethical naturalism, according to Hursthouse, views evaluation as an activity continuous with a kind of ethology that is focused on the evaluation of living things as specimens of their kind. In the case of plants, to say that an individual is a good member of whatever its species may be is to evaluate how well its parts and operations contribute in ways characteristic of that species to the two ends of survival and reproduction. With at least some animals a third end becomes salient—freedom from pain and pleasure and enjoyment of sorts characteristic to the species in question. And with social animals a fourth dimension comes into play: the good functioning of the group (Hursthouse 1999, chapter 9). Evaluation of this kind allows us to say, following Foot, that a free-riding wolf or a dancing bee who finds a source of nectar but does not alert other bees to it are defective (2001, 96, citing “Does Moral Subjectivism Rest on a Mistake?” in Foot 2002). Defectiveness in this context is a straightforwardly factual matter. Given the normal characteristics of their species, male cheetahs who help their heavily pregnant mates to hunt for food are to be classed as defective, as are male polar bears who nurture their young (Hursthouse 1999, 220–221).

Given such examples, a critic may urge that it’s hard to see how we are here concerned here with evaluation as opposed simply to a kind of classification. But Hursthouse demurs. A good human being is a human being endowed with characteristics that conduce in characteristically human ways to the four ends of survival, reproduction, characteristic enjoyment and freedom from pain, and the good functioning of the group. And, at the level of character, those characteristics are just the virtues. But humans are special, as a highly salient characteristic feature of human beings is rationality. This makes the evaluation of human conduct very different from that of cheetahs or polar bears. Being rational, we can elect to assign some feature of our characteristic behavior no normative weight at all, or even negative weight. There nonetheless remains a distinctive and characteristically human way of carrying on: the rational way, which we characteristically regard as good and take ourselves to have reason to pursue (Hursthouse, esp. 221–222).

Once this is said, it might be objected that we’ve more or less left the naturalism behind. We don’t need anything remotely like ethology to tell us that we should favor ethical views supported by good reasons over those not so supported. Nor do we need to be any sort of naturalists to believe it. And if we’re concerned with what is distinctively and characteristically human, we might legitimately follow Williams in asking why we should make such a big deal about rationality. Why not the making of fire, having sexual intercourse without regard to season, despoiling the environment and upsetting the balance of nature, or killing things for fun (Williams 1972, 73)? There’s a natural and obvious answer to this, which appeals to widely shared human commonalities of value. Perhaps we can bring this too under the heading of the characteristically human, but those humans who may not share these values might fairly retort, So what? Aren’t they free, for all this quasi-ethological picture tells us, to assign normative weights in their own ways? The hallmark feature that is distinctive of naturalism, Hursthouse would respond, is the regulatory role of the four ends (Hursthouse 1999, 224–226). But these too seem to be decidedly up for grabs, as when she acknowledges that nothing in particular need follow from her view about the ethical status of (e.g.) celibacy and homosexual sex (Hursthouse 1999, 215).

We turn now to the views of Judith Jarvis Thomson. Thomson follows Geach in her rejection of the view (which she associates in particular with Moore) that “goodness” names a property of good things, which are accordingly susceptible to more or less unrestricted ranking by the “betterness” relation. “Good”, Geach insists, is an attributive, not a predicative adjective (Geach 1956). To illustrate briefly: “brown” is predicative, as “Hector is a brown mouse” is analysed straightforwardly as “Hector is a mouse and he is brown;” the claims “Hector is a brown mouse” and “Hector is an animal” entail “Hector is a brown animal.” “Enormous”, on the other hand, is attributive, as “Hector is an enormous mouse” is not analyzed as “Hector is a mouse and he is enormous.” An enormous mouse may still be quite a tiny mammal. This has the effect of neutralizing the Open Question Argument. If there’s no such thing as goodness, but only goodness of a kind, then of course we won’t be able to give an analysis of goodness.

Thomson’s account of goodness makes most sense if we consider it through the lens of the concept of a ‘good toaster.’ A toaster is a functional kind of thing; for something to be a toaster is for it to toast things. And, for something to be a good toaster, it must be something that toasts things well. The goodness of a good toaster is not mysterious in any way. It is entirely a matter of the toaster being composed and organized in such a way as to efficiently and effectively perform its characteristic function. And if you have no objection to the idea that some toasters are good and others are bad, then you should have no objection to the idea that other things can be good or bad as well.

There is such a property as being a good \(K\) only if \(K\) is a goodness-fixing kind (Thomson 2008, 21). For instance, “knife” is a goodness-fixing kind; thus, there is the property of being a good knife. Goodness need not always be understood in terms of a particular substantive. Things can be good in other respects, as we see from examples such as “good for use in making cheesecake” or “good for Alfred” (Thomson 1997, 278). Thomson calls things that are good in this way “good-modified.” Recognizing ways in which things can be good-modified allows us to evaluate things that we might not otherwise be able to evaluate. There is no such thing as “a good smudge”, full stop, because smudges have no characteristic functions or correctness standards. “Smudge”, according to Thomson, is not a goodness-fixing kind in the way “knife” is. But there might be a smudge that is good for using in a Rorschach test, because “being used in a Rorschach test” is a way that smudges can be good-modified. So that is a way that a smudge can be good (Thomson 2008, 21–22).

Thomson also argues that we can relativize our notion of goodness to a class of things. One can be a good piano player for a six-year old without being a good piano-player, full stop. And this class-relativization can occur whether we are talking about good instances of kinds or good-modified things. Thus, we can have a good typewriter (for a typewriter built in 1900), or an individual who is good at crossword puzzles (for an athlete).

Thomson, following the two-step strategy outlined in Section 2.2, holds that goodness is the most fundamental normative concept, and that we can define different normative concepts in terms of goodness. For instance, “for \(F\) to be a virtue in a [kind] \(K\) is for it to be the case that (i) \(K\) is a goodness-fixing kind, and (ii) a \(K\) is as good a \(K\) as a \(K\) can be only if it has \(F\), and (iii) it is possible for there to be a \(K\) that lacks \(F\), and (iv) it is not nomologically impossible for there to be a \(K\) that has \(F\)” (Thomson 2008, 85). Thomson also defines notions of “better”, “correct”, “ought”, “reason”, and “defective” in terms of goodness (Thomson 2008).

With an account of virtue in hand, we can now begin to define moral terms. Thomson is a virtue theorist: to be moral is to be virtuous. For Thomson, it makes no sense to ask whether an act is morally good or not, because “act”, like “smudge”, is not a goodness-fixing kind. Accordingly, acts are only the kinds of things that can be good-modified. Just as there is no such thing as a good smudge, but only smudges that are good in some respect (e.g., for use in Rorschach tests), there is no such thing as a good act, but only acts are good in some respect—e.g., a moral respect. Acts are morally good when they spring from an agent’s morally virtuous traits. And a trait is a moral virtue when a \(K\) is as morally good as a \(K\) can be only if it has that trait (and it’s possible for \(K\) to either have or lack that virtue) (Thomson 2008, 79).

Moral goodness is itself explained in terms of moral virtue and vice concepts. There is no such thing as being morally good, full stop, but only morally good-in-a-way; by being brave, generous, just, prudent, etc. To have a moral virtue is a way of being good, but it is a “second-order” way of being good, because moral goodness is defined in terms of other kinds of goodness. (Thomson 1996, 144–147; 1997, 279–281; 2001, 59–67). As the examples of the good toaster and the good knife illustrate, for Thomson the morally good is just one sub-class of good things (and it is not a particularly large sub-class; the non-morally good is vastly larger than the morally good). In addition to the morally good, there are four other sub-classes of goodness: the useful (as in “good for” governing a verb), the skilful (“good at”), the enjoyable, and the beneficial (as in “good for” governing a noun) (Thomson 1996, 131–133). In general, Thomson suggests, a virtue is a trait such that, whatever else is true of those among whom we live, it is better if they have it (Thomson 1997, 282). For example, generosity is a moral virtue because generous people will act in ways that are beneficial for others.

All five kinds of goodness are natural properties. Being good for use in \(\phi\)-ing is a matter of being such as to facilitate \(\phi\)-ing in a way conducive to the wants that people typically seek to satisfy when \(\phi\)-ing. Being good at \(\phi\)-ing is a matter of being capable of \(\phi\)-ing in the way that people who want to \(\phi\) typically want to \(\phi\) (Thomson 1996, 134–137). Thomson acknowledges that enjoyment is a little tricky: some people enjoy what is not good (example: Koolaid ), so a role must be given to expertise, which can be hard to characterize (Thomson 1996, 138–140). The beneficial can also be complicated. It is easy enough to account for with such things as carpets. What is good for a carpet is what conduces to its being in the condition that people who want carpets typically want their carpets to be in (Thomson 1996, 141). In the case of plants and lower animals, what is good for them is what conduces to health, and health is whatever conduces to their being in a condition to do what they were designed by nature to do (Thomson 2001, 56–57). What is good for a person is the trickiest case. It’s not straightforwardly what conduces to health, as something may be good for someone for reasons that have little to do with health (example: going to law school [Thomson 2001, 55]). Nor is it a matter of conducing to what one most wants (example: I might most want to smoke 60 cigarettes a day [Thomson 2001, 54]). So she thinks the truth is some form of compromise between the want story and the health story (Thomson 2001, 55–56). And moral goodness is a matter of having character traits that promote these other kinds of goodness (particularly by being beneficial).

This is a beautifully elegant and straightforward account that makes a valiant attempt to represent moral claims, and indeed evaluative and normative claims more generally, as straightforward matters of natural fact. The main critical concerns that might be raised are liable to echo points already aired. Thus, our earlier remarks about the role of biology might make us suspicious of Thomson’s explication of health, and so of the beneficial, in terms of nature’s designs. And if Thomson’s account of the beneficial is in jeopardy, then so is her account of moral virtue, since moral virtue is largely a matter of acting in ways that are beneficial to oneself and others.

It is likely true that the property of being a good toaster is nothing more than the naturally-respectable property of being useful for toasting. But it remains controversial whether Thomson’s naturalistic account of the goodness of good toasters can be extended to provide an adequate account of the goodness of good people.

3.2 Cornell Realism

If moral naturalism is, generally, the view that moral facts are the kinds of facts that can be investigated empirically, in a broadly scientific way, then no view captures the spirit of naturalism better than Cornell realism. Cornell realism was developed by in the 1980s by Boyd (1988), Brink (1986), Sturgeon (1985), and Railton (1986); the view gets its name from the fact that Boyd, Brink, and Sturgeon were working or studying at Cornell University at the time. It is a comprehensive metaethical system, with interrelated linguistic, metaphysical, and epistemological commitments, that is driven by a commitment to mirroring scientific methodology in ethics as closely as possible.

It might seem odd to suggest that we can come to know things about morality by using scientific methodology. Empirical methods are all, ultimately, grounded in an epistemology of observation. But, as Gilbert Harman (1977, Ch. 1) famously argued, it does not seem that we can observe moral facts in anything like the same way that we can observe other kinds of natural facts. It’s rather obvious how we can have empirical knowledge of natural properties such as redness or roundness; they are directly observable. But goodness doesn’t seem to be directly observable, and that looks like an important disanalogy between moral properties and natural properties.

The problem with this thought is that not all natural properties are directly observable. Some kinds of natural properties are highly complex, and knowable only through the functional role they occupy. Consider, for instance, the property of being healthy. Being healthy isn’t like being red; there’s no way that healthy people look. Of course, there may be some characteristic visual signs of healthiness—rosy cheeks, a spring in one’s step—but these visual signs are neither necessary nor sufficient for healthiness. These directly observable properties are only indications of healthiness. Healthiness is a complex natural property, wholly constituted by an organism’s body being in the “proper” configuration. Healthiness has a robust causal profile. There are many things that can cause or impede health by their presence or absence: food, water, disease, etc. And there are many things that will result from health in typical circumstances: energy, long life, etc. Rosy cheeks and a spring in one’s step are indications of healthiness because these are properties that are—typically—caused by health. Our awareness of the causal profile of healthiness thus gives us a way of figuring out which things have or do not have the complex property of healthiness.

The Cornell realists hold that goodness is exactly like healthiness in all of these ways (Boyd 1988). Like healthiness, goodness is a complex natural property that is not directly observable, but nonetheless has a robust causal profile. Like “healthiness”, “goodness” is not synonymous with any simpler set of more directly observable claims. Instead, “goodness” describes the functionally complex natural property that is the effect of certain characteristic causes, and the cause of certain characteristic effects. Many different things contribute to or detract from goodness—things like pleasure or pain, honesty or untruthfulness—and there are many things that will result from goodness in typical circumstances—things like human flourishing, or political peace. Because goodness is a natural property with a complex causal profile, the property of goodness can enter into explanatory relations. Thus, contra Harman, it is possible for goodness to explain our observations (Sturgeon 1985). We can, accordingly, observe whether something is good by looking for indications of goodness. This is exactly the same way that we observe whether something is healthy.

The great asset of Cornell realism is that it directly adopts widely accepted views about the nature of natural properties and scientific knowledge in order to answer the foundational questions of moral metaphysics and moral epistemology. What are moral properties? Highly complex natural properties, individuated by their causal profiles—Boyd calls these homeostatic cluster properties. Are there, generally, properties like this? Yes; healthiness is one; moral properties are properties like that. How do we know about moral properties? By looking for directly observable properties that are characteristically functionally upstream or downstream from the moral property that we are interested in (provided that we have justified background beliefs about the functional roles of moral properties). Do we, generally, have knowledge like this? Yes; this is how we have scientific knowledge; moral knowledge is knowledge like that. In this way, the theoretical resources of scientific realism also turn out to support moral realism (Boyd 1988).

A skeptic might object that it’s impossible to have justified background beliefs about the functional profile of moral properties. But this kind of objection threatens to prove too much. We are entitled to rely on background beliefs in moral theory development because we’re entitled to do so in science, generally (Boyd 1988, 189–191). Our theories and background beliefs are justified together by their overall coherence. So if there are no substantial metaphysical or epistemological issues raised by the claims that healthiness exists and that we can know about healthiness, then there should be no substantial metaphysical or epistemological issues raised by the claims that goodness exists and that we can know about goodness.

It is not essential to Cornell realism that goodness be identified with any particular complex natural property—different Cornell realists have different first-order normative commitments.

The most influential of these accounts is due to Railton (1986). Railton, like Thomson, holds that moral goodness is defined in terms of what is non-morally good for agents. Whereas Thomson, as a neo-Aristotelian, defines what is good for a human in terms of human biology, Railton defines non-moral goodness in terms of the desires of a fully-informed counterpart (see also Brandt 1979, Smith 1994). To illustrate, Railton asks us to imagine a traveler, Lonnie, who feels terrible because he is badly dehydrated. Lonnie does not know that he is dehydrated, and so is not taking appropriate steps to make himself feel better. But we can imagine a fully-informed version of Lonnie—Railton names him Lonnie-Plus—who knows about his dehydration and knows that drinking clear liquids will make him feel better. Lonnie-Plus, who (like Lonnie) desires to feel better but who (unlike Lonnie) knows the best means to that end, would choose to drink clear fluids. The fact that Lonnie-Plus would choose to drink clear fluids means that drinking clear fluids is good for Lonnie. But this is not a relativist view of morality, because the fact that Lonnie-Plus would choose to drink clear liquids is determined by Lonnie’s circumstances and constitution, and facts about Lonnie’s circumstances and constitution are objective facts. In general: the complex natural property of being good for an agent is identical to the complex natural property that agent’s fully-informed counterpart would choose. This makes goodness “objective, though relational” (Railton 1986, 167).

This is an intuitive account of goodness, but it’s certainly not uncontroversial. Loeb (1995) argues that we have no way of knowing what a fully-informed version of ourselves would desire—it’s absurd to think that we have any basis for making judgements about what we would desire if we knew literally everything, since we are so far from being omniscient ourselves. An omniscient agent’s desires might look nothing like our own. Thus, what would satisfy an omniscient agent might well be something that we would in no way recognize as beneficial.

We might also worry about the fact that, on Railton’s view, what is morally good is grounded in what is non-morally good for agents, and what is non-morally good for agents is grounded in those agents’ contingent circumstances and constitution. This suggests that moral facts would not provide the same reasons for everyone. As we’ve already seen, Railton accepts this somewhat counter-intuitive conclusion. That’s what makes his account a “reforming definition”.

There may, in practice, be substantial overlap between the metaphysical commitments of neo-Aristotelianism and Cornell realism. Cornell realists say that the good is a certain higher-order natural property. Neo-Aristotelians say that goodness has something to do with human flourishing, which is itself a kind of higher-order natural property. Both Cornell realists (Boyd) and neo-Aristotelians (Thomson) have found the analogy with healthiness illuminating when explaining the nature of moral properties (see also Bloomfield 2001). So Cornell realists and neo-Aristotelians do tend to be similar in the way that they conceive of normative properties. But they differ with respect to what they say about language.

Neo-Aristotelians, such as Thomson, tend to favor an attributive semantics for ‘good.’ To be good is always to be good in a way or a good thing of its kind. But because Cornell realists regard moral terms as terms for a certain kind of complex natural property, they accept a causal reference theory for moral terms, because a causal reference theory is the standard theory of reference for natural kind terms.

Adopting the causal reference theory is a sensible thing for the Cornell realists to do, for two reasons. First, it continues their foundational commitment to treating moral properties as a kind of causally-individuated natural property. And second, it helps them evade the Open Question Argument (Brink 2001). By accepting a causal theory of reference, the Cornell realists thereby reject a description theory of reference; for a Cornell realist, moral terms cannot be defined in any verbal way. They simply refer to the (complex higher-order natural) property that causally regulates their use. This makes Cornell realism a form of synthetic naturalism. As we saw in 1.2, Moore’s Open Question Argument shows, at most, that analytic naturalism is false.

But the Cornell realist’s semantics is also the source of the most influential objection to Cornell realism. According to this objection—Horgan and Timmons’s Moral Twin Earth Objection (Horgan and Timmons 1991)—we do not use moral terms in the way that the Cornell realist predicts.

To understand the Moral Twin Earth Objection, we need to first understand how causal regulation semantics are supposed to work. The following thought experiment, from Putnam (1975), has been highly influential: Imagine a world—Twin Earth—where there is no H\(_2\)O, but there is another substance called XYZ. This substance XYZ, while distinct from H\(_2\)O, fills the rivers and lakes, is clear and tasteless, etc. XYZ even has the property of being called ‘water’—when residents of Twin Earth fill up a glass with XYZ from the tap, they will say “I have a cup of water.” Yet for all this, we would not say that Twin Earth is a planet where water is XYZ. We would say that this is a planet where there is no water. There is, instead, another substance—XYZ—that plays the same functional role. Yet when the person on Twin Earth fills a cup from the tap and declares “I have a cup of water”, that assertion seems true. What could account for that? Putnam argues that the word ‘water’ just means something different on Twin Earth than it does in the actual world. In the actual world, ‘water’ means H\(_2\)O because, in the actual world, H\(_2\)O is that thing that is clear, tasteless, fills the rivers and lakes, and is referred to with the inscription ‘water.’ But on Twin Earth, ‘water’ means XYZ because, on Twin Earth, it is XYZ that is clear, tasteless, fills the rivers and lakes, and is referred to with the inscription ‘water.’ Natural kind terms like ‘water’ refer to those properties that causally regulate the use of those terms. That is why the word ‘water’ literally means something different on Twin Earth than it does in the real world.

According to the Moral Twin Earth Objection, things don’t work this way at all for moral terms.

Imagine a world—Moral Twin Earth—that is exactly like the actual world, except on Moral Twin Earth, people’s use of moral terminology is causally regulated by different properties from those in the actual world. People use moral terminology to praise and blame and to guide action, but they take very different kinds of actions to be worthy of praise or blame and they guide their actions in very different ways. Thus, if the causal reference theory is true for moral terms, the word ‘right’ literally means something different on Moral Twin Earth than it does in the real world—this is the common intuition that drives Putnam’s original Twin Earth case. But we do not have the same judgement about how people use moral language on Moral Twin Earth! If people on Moral Twin Earth take different actions to be worthy of praise or blame, we don’t conclude that our words ‘right’ and ‘wrong’ mean different things. We conclude that there is a substantive moral disagreement between the denizens of Moral Twin Earth and the people in our world, and that such disagreement is possible only because we and the Twin Earthers mean the same thing by our moral terms. Horgan and Timmons argue that this proves that moral terms like ‘right’ and ‘wrong’ do not refer to whatever it is that causally regulates their use. So much the worse for Cornell realism. (See Dowell (2016) for a recent, influential criticism of this argument).

To put the point another way: Assume that causal reference theory is true for moral terms, and assume that different properties causally regulate the use of moral terms in different societies. If both of these assumptions are true, it follows that moral terms refer to different things in different societies. And it does seem, empirically, to be the case that different properties causally regulate the use of moral terms in different societies. Thus, if causal reference theory is true, cross-cultural moral disagreement should be impossible. Just as someone on Twin Earth doesn’t have a word in their language to refer to water—they just refer to something else (XYZ) that they call ‘water’—people in different societies don’t have words for right or wrong—they only have words for something else that they call ‘right’ or ‘wrong.’ To the extent that this is a counter-intuitive implication, this is a problem for causal reference theory. (It is worth noting that some moral relativists have not found this implication to be counter-intuitive at all. Prinz (2007) and Wong (2006) have both defended versions of moral relativism that are grounded entirely in the Cornell realists’ empirical methodology.)

One might think that Cornell realists can respond by offering a new account of moral language. But this response faces severe difficulties, on two fronts. First, the causal reference theory is what allows Cornell realists to avoid a commitment to analytic naturalism and the accompanying Open Question Argument. If the causal reference theory is false of moral terms, the naturalist may be forced to accept a description theory of moral semantics. This would re-open the Open Question Argument as an important line of objection to naturalism.

Second, the causal reference theory for moral language is essential to the Cornell realists’ methodological and epistemological commitments. If moral goodness is the thing that regulates our use of moral terminology, then the terms of our empirical investigation are simple: we just investigate what regulates the use of our moral language. But if the moral facts are not (necessarily) the facts that regulate the use of our moral language, then which facts are they? We need an answer to that question before we can proceed with any empirical inquiry into morality. Consider: If, for half of the world’s population, their use of the word ‘water’ were causally regulated by the odorless tasteless stuff that fills rivers and lakes, but, for the other half of the world, ‘water’ were causally regulated by the intoxicating liquid found in wine, beer, and liquor, Lavoisier would have had no methodological basis for concluding that water is H\(_2\)O (rather than C\(_2\)H\(_6\)O.)

Because of this, the Moral Twin Earth objection is often presented as a kind of extension of Moore’s Open Question Argument. The Open Question Argument is, in Moore’s formulation, an attack on the idea that there can be analytic natural-normative property identity claims. But in a larger sense, the Open Question Argument picks out a kind of epistemic shortcoming for moral naturalists. Moral naturalists are committed to the idea that moral facts are a kind of natural fact—but which natural facts are the moral facts? If moral claims are synonymous with certain natural claims, we can know by conceptual analysis which natural facts are the moral facts. And if moral facts are the facts that causally regulate our use of moral terminology, that provides us with another way of investigating which facts are the moral facts. But if neither of those stories are available, it seems that we have no way of identifying which natural facts are the moral ones (Huemer 2005, chapter 4; Bedke 2012). This would be a serious methodological problem for moral naturalists, and would also mark a critical disanalogy between moral epistemology and scientific epistemology. This disanalogy would be crippling to Cornell realists, who hold that there is no such disanalogy.

3.3 Jackson’s Moral Functionalism

Frank Jackson’s Moral Functionalism is the most influential contemporary version of analytic naturalism. (Finlay (2014) endorses another version of analytic naturalism.) Jackson believes that ethical properties are natural properties or, as he prefers to say in this context, descriptive properties. His argument for this appeals to the supervenience of the moral on the descriptive. This is the claim that no two completely specified situations that differ in their ethical properties can be exactly alike in their descriptive properties. Supervenience entails that no two worlds that are exactly like each other descriptively can differ ethically, which means that ethical properties and descriptive properties are necessarily coextensive. And Jackson does not believe there are any necessarily coextensive but distinct properties. If two properties not only coincide in the actual world but could not fail to coincide we have, he contends, not two properties but one. Thus, Supervenience entails that ethical properties are descriptive.

Jackson doesn’t just argue that ethical properties are descriptive properties. He also has an account of which descriptive properties ethical properties are (Jackson 1998, 129–134, 140–143). It goes as follows.

To begin with, take some platitudinous thoughts about morality and write them down in a great big sentence.

FM1. Wrong actions ought to be discouraged and shunned; right actions ought to be promoted and encouraged; virtuous people are disposed to perform right actions and not to perform wrong actions; vicious people are disposed to perform wrong actions and not to perform right actions; right actions are right because they have certain natural properties on which rightness supervenes; similarly for wrong actions; and so on.

Now let’s transform this as follows:

FM2. Actions with property \(w\) stand in relation \(o\) to being discouraged and shunned; actions with property \(r\) stand in relation \(o\) to being promoted and encouraged; people with property \(v_1\) are disposed to perform actions with \(r\) and not to perform actions with \(w\); people with property \(v_2\) are disposed to perform actions with \(w\) and not to perform actions with \(r\); actions with \(r\) have \(r\) because they have certain natural properties on which \(r\) supervenes; similarly for actions with \(w\); and so on.

What we just did was to take all and only the moral terms in FM1, get rid of them, and uniformly replace them with variables. FM2, unlike FM1, doesn’t contain any moral terms. But that fact is not yet very interesting, as FM2 isn’t really a meaningful sentence. But we can turn it into one by simply doing this:

FM3. There exists a property \(w\) and a property \(r\) and a property \(v_1\) and a property \(v_2\) and a relation \(o\) (and whatever further properties and relations are designated by the variables in a complete statement of FM2) such that: actions with \(w\) stand in \(o\) to being discouraged and shunned; actions with property \(r\) stand in \(o\) to being promoted and encouraged; people with \(v_1\) are disposed to perform actions with \(r\) and not to perform actions with \(w\); people with \(v_2\) are disposed to perform actions with \(w\) and not to perform actions with \(r\); actions with \(r\) have \(r\) because they have certain natural properties on which \(r\) supervenes; similarly for actions with \(w\); and so on.

(Sentences like this that result from performing this sort of maneuver are called Ramsey sentences.) Now notice something about FM3. Unlike FM2, it is a meaningful if not very pretty sentence. But unlike FM1, it is a sentence you would be able to understand without possessing any moral concepts. All you need to do is understand all the nonmoral, descriptive concepts in FM3 and follow its rather complicated structure.

What FM3 says is that there are a bunch of things \(w, r, v_1\) etc. that together play the complex roles FM3 specifies in the complex structure FM3 describes. This isn’t yet quite what’s wanted. What we want is a sentence that says there’s exactly one bunch of such things. Logicians have a standard trick for doing this. This calls for a decidedly complicated sentence that goes like this:

FM4. There exists a property \(w\) and a property \(r\) and a property \(v_1\) and a property \(v_2\) and a relation \(o\) (etc.) such that: actions with \(w\) stand in \(o\) to being discouraged and shunned; actions with property \(r\) stand in \(o\) to being promoted and encouraged; people with \(v_1\) are disposed to perform actions with \(r\) and not to perform actions with \(w\); people with \(v_2\) are disposed to perform actions with \(w\) and not to perform actions with \(r\); actions with \(r\) have \(r\) because they have certain natural properties on which \(r\) supervenes; similarly for actions with \(w\); and so on;


for all \(w^*\) and all \(r^*\) and all \(v_1^*\) and all \(v_2^*\) and all \(o^*\) (etc.): actions with \(w^*\) stand in \(o^*\) to being discouraged and shunned; actions with property \(r^*\) stand in \(o^*\) to being promoted and encouraged; people with \(v_1^*\) are disposed to perform actions with \(r\) and not to perform actions with \(w^*\); people with \(v_2^*\) are disposed to perform actions with \(w\) and not to perform actions with \(r^*\); actions with \(r^*\) have \(r^*\) because they have certain natural properties on which \(r\) supervenes; similarly for actions with \(w^*\); and so on IF AND ONLY IF \(w^* = w\) and \(r^* = r\) and \(v_1^* = v_1\) and \(v_2^* = v_2\) and \(o^* = o\) (etc.).

Now suppose FM4 is true. Now we can do something neat: we can define ethical terms in pristinely natural terms. Here’s how. Let’s take “right.” “Right” is what we replaced with the variable “\(r\)”. So we can just say:

RIGHT. Rightness is the property \(r\) such that: There exists a property \(w\) and a property \(v_1\) and a property \(v_2\) and a relation \(o\) (etc.) such that: actions with \(w\) stand in \(o\) to being discouraged and shunned; actions with property \(r\) stand in \(o\) to being promoted and encouraged; people with \(v_1\) are disposed to perform actions with \(r\) and not to perform actions with \(w\); people with \(v_2\) are disposed to perform actions with \(w\) and not to perform actions with \(r\); actions with \(r\) have \(r\) because they have certain natural properties on which \(r\) supervenes; similarly for actions with \(w\); and so on; AND … (Uniqueness clause as for FM4).

This is neat because it allows us to offer reductive definitions of moral concepts in spite of their highly holistic character. The fact that moral concepts can all be defined in terms of one another might make it seem prohibitively difficult to try to offer reductive definitions of these concepts one by one. But by considering all moral concepts together and offering reductive definitions of networks of moral concepts, this difficulty can, perhaps, be overcome.

But is FM4 true? Well, it depends how much structure we offer. It depends, that is, on how rich and determinate its full content is. And how rich is it? Well, we may in the first instance think of the “platitudinous thoughts” we put into it as giving the content of what Jackson calls “folk morality” (Jackson 1998, 130):

The network of moral opinions, intuitions, principles, and concepts whose mastery is part and parcel of having a sense of what is right and wrong and of being able to engage in meaningful debate about what ought to be done.

The trouble is that folk morality is pervasively contested. There’s a lot of agreement, to be sure: we’d all be talking past each other were there not (Jackson 1998, 132). But what’s left when you leave the contested stuff out plausibly won’t furnish enough determinate content to make the uniqueness clause we added at FM3 come out true. So what Jackson proposes is that, instead of taking the input to this analytic procedure to be folk morality in its current state, we should take it to be what he calls “mature folk morality”, where this designates what folk morality will have evolved into when critical reflection has done all it can to sharpen it up.

We can then see how it may be possible to offer definitions in descriptive terms of moral concepts. Our moral concepts serve to pick out the properties that occupy the various roles in the network of such roles specified by a suitable ramsification of mature folk morality. And the properties that occupy these roles will be descriptive properties, Jackson believes, in the light of the argument aired above. Thus, moral terms pick out descriptive properties.

Jackson seeks to describe a reductive analysis of ethical terms that understands them as picking out the properties that play a certain role in the conceptual network determined by mature folk morality. The most worrying difficulty with Jackson’s approach is that this looks unpromising as a reductive analysis, as there is a term in it that appears decidedly evaluative in character: “mature” (Yablo 2000). “Mature” had better not apply to any old terminal point our ethical development may happen to take us to, but only to a terminus we could arrive at by good, reasonable ethical discussion and argument. One possible answer in the spirit of the wider theory might be to say that “mature” picks out whatever plays the “mature” role in mature folk morality. But that seems circular. After all, maturity in current folk morality is plausibly pretty contested. There are many ways morality could develop to a more settled state, and we are liable to differ about which of them we count as maturation and which we would describe less favorably. So a naturalistic account of ‘maturity’ fails to pick out one set of platitudes as being the unique platitudes of mature folk morality. And if we attempt to narrow down the range of sets of platitudes that might count as “mature folk morality” by attempting to specify the best candidate for mature folk morality, a central question seems to be getting begged. Or, as we might say, echoing Moore, left open.


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