# Intertheory Relations in Physics

*First published Tue Jan 2, 2001; substantive revision Mon Jul 18, 2016*

Many issues in the philosophy of science concern the nature of theories
and certain relations that may obtain between them. Typically, one is
interested in the degree to which a successor to a given theory “goes
beyond” (both descriptively and explanatorily) the theory it succeeds.
Most often these issues are framed in the context of *reductive*
relations between theories. When does a theory \(T'\) reduce
to a theory \(T\)? How is one to understand the nature of this
reduction relation? Interestingly, there are two distinct, yet, related
ways of understanding the reductive relationship between \(T\) and
\(T'\). Thomas Nickles noted this in a paper entitled “Two
Concepts of Intertheoretic Reduction.” On the one hand, there is the
“philosopher’s” sense of reduction on which the supplanted theory is
said to reduce to the newer more encompassing theory. On the other
hand, the “physicist’s” sense of reduction puts things the other way.
The newer, typically more refined theory is said to reduce to the older
typically less encompassing theory in some sort of limit. These two
senses of reduction will be discussed in turn.

- 1. Philosopher’s Sense of Reduction
- 2. Physicist’s Sense of Reduction
- 3. Hierarchies of Theories
- 4. Intertheory Relations
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Philosopher’s Sense of Reduction

Most contemporary discussions of reductive relations between a pair of
theories owe considerable debt to the work by Ernest Nagel. In *The
Structure of Science*, Nagel asserts that “[r]eduction … is the
explanation of a theory or a set of experimental laws established in
one area of inquiry, by a theory usually though not invariably
formulated for some other domain.” (Nagel 1961, 338) The general
schema here is as follows:

- \(T\) reduces \(T'\) just in case the laws of \(T'\) are derivable from those of \(T\).

Showing how these derivations are possible for “paradigm” examples of intertheoretic reduction turns out to be rather difficult.

Nagel distinguishes two types of reductions on the basis of whether or not the vocabulary of the reduced theory is a subset of the reducing theory. If it is—that is, if the reduced theory \(T'\) contains no descriptive terms not contained in the reducing theory \(T\), and the terms of \(T'\) are understood to have approximately the same meanings that they have in \(T\), then Nagel calls the reduction of \(T'\) by \(T\) “homogeneous.” In this case, while the reduction may very well be enlightening in various respects, and is part of the “normal development of a science,” most people believe that there is nothing terribly special or interesting from a philosophical point of view going on here. (Nagel 1961, 339.)

Lawrence Sklar (1967, 110–111) points out that, from a
historical perspective, this attitude is somewhat naive. The number of
actual cases in the history of science where a genuine homogeneous
reduction takes place are few and far between. Nagel, himself, took as
a paradigm example of homogeneous reduction, the reduction of the
Galilean laws of falling bodies to Newtonian mechanics. But, as Sklar
points out, what actually can be derived from the Newtonian theory are
*approximations* to the laws of the reduced Galilean theory. The
approximations, of course, are strictly speaking *incompatible*
with the actual laws and so, despite the fact that no concepts appear
in the Galilean theory that do not also appear in the Newtonian theory,
there is no deductive derivation of the *laws* of the one from
the *laws* of the other. Hence, strictly speaking, there is no
reduction on the deductive Nagelian model.

One way out of this problem for the proponent of Nagel-type reductions is to make a distinction between explaining a theory (or explaining the laws of a given theory) and explaining it away. (Sklar 1967, 112–113) Thus, we may still speak of reduction if the derivation of the approximations to the reduced theory’s laws serves to account for why the reduced theory works as well as it does in its (perhaps more limited) domain of applicability. This is consonant with more sophisticated versions of Nagel-type reductions in which part of the very process of reduction involves revisions to the reduced theory. This process arises as a natural consequence of trying to deal with what Nagel calls “heterogeneous” reductions.

The task of characterizing reduction is more involved when the
reduction is heterogeneous—that is, when the reduced theory
contains terms or concepts that do not appear in the reducing theory.
Nagel takes, as a paradigm example of heterogeneous reduction, the
(apparent) reduction of thermodynamics, or at least some parts of
thermodynamics, to statistical
mechanics.^{[1]}
For instance, thermodynamics contains the concept of temperature
(among others) that is lacking in the reducing theory of statistical
mechanics.

Nagel notes that “if the laws of the secondary science [the reduced
theory] contain terms that do not occur in the theoretical assumptions
of the primary discipline [the reducing theory] … , the logical
derivation of the former from the latter is *prima facie*
impossible.” (Nagel 1961, 352) As a consequence, Nagel introduces
two “necessary formal conditions” required for the reduction to take
place:

*Connectability*. “Assumptions of some kind must be introduced which postulate suitable relations between whatever is signified by ‘A’ [the term to be reduced, that is, an element of the vocabulary of theory \(T'\)] and traits represented by theoretical terms already present in the primary [reducing] science.”*Derivability*. “With the help of these additional assumptions, all the laws of the secondary science, including those containing the term ‘A,’ must be logically derivable from the theoretical premises and their associated coordinating definitions in the primary discipline.” (Nagel 1961, 353–354)

The connectability condition brings with it a number of interpretive
problems. Exactly what is, or should be, the status of the “suitable
relations,” often called bridge “laws” or bridge hypotheses? Are they
established by linguistic investigation alone? Are they factual
discoveries? If the latter, what sort of necessity do they involve? Are
they identity relations that are contingently necessary or will some
sort of weaker relation, such as nomic coextensivity, suffice? Much of
the philosophical literature on reduction addresses these questions
about the status of the bridge
laws.^{[2]}

The consideration of certain examples lends plausibility to the
idea, prevalent in the literature, that the bridge laws should be
considered to express some kind of identity relation. For instance,
Sklar notes that the reduction of the “theory” of physical optics to
the theory of electromagnetic radiation proceeds by
*identifying* one class of entities — light waves —
with (part of) another class — electromagnetic radiation. He says
“… the place of correlatory laws [bridge laws] is taken by
empirically established *identifications* of two classes of
entities. Light waves are not correlated with electromagnetic waves,
for they *are* electromagnetic waves.” (Sklar 1967, 120) In
fact, if something like Nagelian reduction is going to work, it is
generally accepted that the bridge laws should reflect the existence of
some kind of synthetic identity.

Kenneth Schaffner calls the bridge laws “reduction functions.” He
too notes that they must be taken to reflect synthetic identities
since, at least initially, they require empirical support for their
justification. “Genes were not discovered to be DNA via the analysis of
*meaning*; important and difficult empirical research was
required to make such an identification.” (Schaffner 1976, 614–615)

Now one problem facing this sort of account was forcefully presented
by Feyerabend in “Explanation, Reduction, and Empiricism.” (Feyerabend
1962) Consider the term “temperature” as it functions in classical
thermodynamics. This term is defined in terms of Carnot cycles and is
related to the strict, nonstatistical second law as it appears in that
theory. The so-called reduction of classical thermodynamics to
statistical mechanics, however, fails to identify or associate
*nonstatistical* features in the reducing theory, statistical
mechanics, with the nonstatistical concept of temperature as it appears
in the reduced theory. How can one have a genuine reduction, if terms
with their meanings fixed by the role they play in the reduced theory
get identified with terms having entirely different meanings? Classical
thermodynamics is not a statistical theory. The very possibility of
finding a reduction function or bridge law that captures the concept of
temperature and the strict, nonstatistical, role it plays in the
thermodynamics seems impossible.

The plausibility of this argument, of course, depends on certain views about how meaning accrues to theoretical terms in a theory. However, just by looking at the historical development of thermodynamics one thing seems fairly clear. Most physicists, now, would accept the idea that our concept of temperature and our conception of other “exact” terms that appear in classical thermodynamics such as “entropy,” need to be modified in light of the alleged reduction to statistical mechanics. Textbooks, in fact, typically speak of the theory of “statistical thermodynamics.” The very process of “reduction” often leads to a corrected version of the reduced theory.

In fact, Schaffner and others have developed sophisticated Nagelian type schemas for reduction that explicitly try to capture these features of actual theory change. The idea is explicitly to include in the model, the “corrected reduced theory” such as statistical thermodynamics. Thus, Schaffner (1976, 618) holds that \(T\) reduces \(T'\) if and only if there is a corrected version of \(T'\), call it \(T'^*\) such that

- The primitive terms of \(T'^*\) are associated via reduction functions (or bridge laws) with various terms of \(T\).
- \(T'^*\) is derivable from \(T\) when it is supplemented with the reduction functions specified in 1.
- \(T'^*\) corrects \(T'\) in that it makes more accurate predictions than does \(T'\).
- \(T'\) is explained by \(T\) in that
\(T'\) and \(T'^*\) are
*strongly analogous*to one another, and \(T\) indicates why \(T'\) works as well as it does in its domain of validity.

Much work clearly is being done here by the intuitive conception of “strong analogy” between the reduced theory \(T'\) and the corrected reduced theory \(T'^*\). In some cases, as suggested by Nickles (1973) and Wimsatt (1976), the conception of strong analogy may find further refinement by appeal to what was referred to as the “physicist’s” sense of reduction.

## 2. Physicist’s Sense of Reduction

Philosophical theories of reduction would have it that, say, quantum mechanics reduces classical mechanics through the derivation of the laws of classical physics from those of quantum physics. Most physicists would, on the other hand, speak of quantum mechanics reducing to classical mechanics in some kind of correspondence limit (e.g., the limit as Planck’s constant \((h/2\pi)\) goes to zero). Thus, the second type of intertheoretic reduction noted by Nickles fits the following schema:

\[ \tag*{\({\bf Schema\ R}\)} \lim_{\varepsilon \rightarrow 0} T_f = T_c \]Here \(T_f\) is the typically newer, more fine theory, \(T_c\) is the typically older, coarser theory, and \(\varepsilon\) is a fundamental parameter appearing in \(T_f\) .

One must take the equality here with a small grain of salt. In those
situations where **Schema R** can be said to hold, it is
likely not the case that every equation or formula from
\(T_f\) will yield a corresponding equation of
\(T_c\) .

Even given this caveat, the equality in **Schema R**
can hold only if the limit is “regular.” In such circumstances, it can
be argued that it is appropriate to call the limiting relation a
“reduction.” If the limit in **Schema R** is singular,
however, the schema fails and it is best to talk simply about
intertheoretic relations.

One should understand the difference between regular and singular
limiting relations as follows. If the solutions of the relevant
formulae or equations of the theory \(T_f\) are
such that for small values of \(\varepsilon\) they *smoothly* approach
the solutions of the corresponding formulas in
\(T_c\), then **Schema R** will
hold. For these cases we can say that the “limiting behavior” as
\(\varepsilon \rightarrow 0\) equals the “behavior in the limit” where
\(\varepsilon = 0\). On the other hand, if the behavior in the
limit is of a *fundamentally different character* than the
nearby solutions one obtains as \(\varepsilon \rightarrow 0\), then the schema will
fail.

A nice example illustrating this distinction is the following: Consider the quadratic equation \(x^2 + x - 9\varepsilon = 0\). Think of \(\varepsilon\) as a small expansion or perturbation parameter. The equation has two roots for any value of \(\varepsilon\) as \(\varepsilon \rightarrow 0\). In a well-defined sense, the solutions to this quadratic equation as \(\varepsilon \rightarrow 0\) smoothly approach solutions to the “unperturbed” \((\varepsilon = 0)\) equation \(x^2 + x = 0\); namely, \(x = 0, -1\). On the other hand, the equation \(x^2\varepsilon + x - 9 = 0\) has two roots for any value of \(\varepsilon \gt 0\) but has for its “unperturbed” solution only one root; namely, \(x = 9\). The equation suffers a reduction in order when \(\varepsilon = 0\). Thus, the character of the behavior in the limit \(\varepsilon = 0\) differs fundamentally from the character of its limiting behavior. Not all singular limits result from reductions in order of the equations. Nevertheless, these latter singular cases are much more prevalent than the former.

A paradigm case where a limiting reduction of the form \(\mathbf{R}\) rather straightforwardly holds is that of classical Newtonian particle mechanics (NM) and the special theory of relativity (SR). In the limit where \((v/c)^2\rightarrow 0\), SR reduces to NM. Nickles says “epitomizing [the intertheoretic reduction of SR to NM] is the reduction of the Einsteinian formula for momentum,

\[ p = \frac{m_0 v}{\sqrt{1 - (v/c)^2}} \]
where \(m_0\) is the rest mass, to the classical formula
\(p = m_0 v\) in the limit as
\(v\rightarrow 0\).”^{[3]}
(Nickles 1973, 182)

This is a regular limit—there are no singularities or
“blowups” as the asymptotic limit is approached. As noted one way of
thinking about this is that the exact solutions for small but nonzero
values of \(|\varepsilon\)| “smoothly [approach] the unperturbed or
zeroth-order solution [\(\varepsilon\) set identically equal to zero] as
\(\varepsilon \rightarrow 0\).” In the case where the limit is *singular*
“the exact solution for \(\varepsilon = 0\) is *fundamentally different in
character* from the ‘neighboring’ solutions obtained in
the limit \(\varepsilon \rightarrow 0\).” (Bender and Orszag 1978, 324)

In the current context, one can express the regular nature of the limiting relation in the following way. The fundamental expression appearing in the Lorentz transformations of SR, can be expanded in a Taylor series as

\[ \frac{1}{\sqrt{1\rightarrow(v/c)^2}} = 1 - \frac{1}{2}(v/c)^2 - \frac{1}{8}(v/c)^4 - \frac{1}{16}(v/c)^6 - \cdots \]
and so the limit is analytic. This means that (at least some)
quantities or expressions of SR can be written as Newtonian or
classical quantities plus an expansion of corrections in powers of
\((v/c)^2\). So one may think of this
relationship between SR and NM as a *regular* perturbation
problem.

Examples like this have led some investigators to think of limiting
relations as forming a kind of new rule of inference which would allow
one to more closely connect the physicists’ sense of reduction with
that of the philosophers’. Fritz Rohrlich, for example, has argued that
NM reduces (in the philosophers’ sense) to SR because the
*mathematical framework* of SR reduces (in the physicists’
sense) to the *mathematical framework* of NM. The idea is that
the mathematical framework of NM is “rigorously derived” from that of
SR in a “derivation which involves limiting procedures.” (Rohrlich
1988, 303) Roughly speaking, for Rohrlich a “coarser” theory is
reducible to a “finer” theory in the philosophers’ sense of being
rigorously deduced from the latter just in case the mathematical
framework of the finer theory reduces in the physicists’ sense to the
mathematical framework of the coarser theory. In such cases, we will
have a systematic explication of the idea of “strong analogy” to which
Schaffner appeals in his model of philosophical reduction. The
corrected theory \(T'^*\) in this context is the perturbed
Newtonian theory as expressed in the Taylor expansion given above. The
“strong analogy” between Newtonian theory \(T'\) and the
corrected \(T'^*\) is expressed by the existence of the
*regular* Taylor series expansion.

As noted the trouble with maintaining that this relationship between
the philosophical and “physical” models of reduction holds generally is
that far more often than not the limiting relations between the
theories are *singular* and not regular. In such situations,
**Schema R** fails to hold. Paradigm cases here include
the relationships between classical mechanics and quantum mechanics,
the ray theory of light and the wave theory, and thermodynamics and
statistical mechanics of systems in critical states.

## 3. Hierarchies of Theories

Despite the fact that limiting relations between theories may be
singular in this way, it is (at times) useful and appropriate to think
of physical theories as forming a hierarchy related by length or
energy scales. The idea is that different theories may apply at
different length or energy scales. If one takes this idea seriously,
then it may very well be the case that each theory in this hierarchy
will be phenomenological relative to those theories at higher energies
or shorter distances. Equivalently, such a hierarchy may form a tower
of *effective* theories. An effective theory is one that
describes the relevant phenomena in a circumscribed domain—a
domain characterized by a range of energies, for example.

The idea of effective theories is not new. In the 19th century and
earlier, scientists developed continuum equations such as the
Navier-Cauchy equations describing the behavior of isotropic elastic
solids and the Navier-Stokes equations for incompressible viscous
fluids. These equations were, and still are, remarkably safe. This
means that once one inputs the appropriate values for a few
phenomenological parameters (such as Young’s modulus and the sheer
stress in the Navier-Cauchy equations), one arrives at equation models
that allow us to build bridges and buildings that do not collapse. It
is remarkable that a theory/model that *almost* entirely fails
to refer to the details of the atomic and molecular structure of a
steel beam, say, can be so successful and safe. A question of deep
philosophical interest concerns how this can be the case. The
phenomenological parameters must encode at least some details about
the atomic and molecular make up of the beam. (Hence, the “almost” in
the statement above.)

However, this raised an important question: Can one tell a story bridging the models at the atomic scale and those at the continuum scale of centimeters and greater? Reductionists typically believe that it is possible to connect, and presumably to derive, the continuum models starting from atomic scale details. There has been a battle for two centuries, at least, between those who are persuaded that such a bottom-up story can be told, and those such as Duhem, Mach, and others who have championed a top-down modeling strategies. In the 19th century this took the form of a heated dispute between so-called rari-constancy and multi-constancy theorists who, respectively, tried to determine the continuum equations from top-down (ignoring unknown micro details) considerations, and theorists trying to determine the continuum equations with small scale atomic assumptions guiding the constructions. In fact, surprisingly, the former prevailed. (Todhunter and Pearson 1960; Batterman 2012)

The debate between bottom-up, reductionist modelers and top-down, continuum modelers receives its modern presentation, at least in part, in the debates about the existence and nature of emergent phenomena. One area of recent interest where this occurs is in our understanding of effective quantum field theories.

In quantum field theory, for instance, there has been considerable
success in in showing how a theory appropriate for some range of
energy scales is related to a theory for another range via a process
of renormalization (Bain 2012). Renormalization provides a kind of limiting
relationship between theories at different scales despite the fact
that the reductive **Schema R** typically fails because
of divergences related to singular limits. The physics at one scale
is relatively independent of that at some higher energy (shorter
length). In effect, renormalization is a mathematical scheme for
characterizing how the structure of interactions changes with changing
scale: it turns out that the domain characterized by some lower energy
(or larger length) scale is surprisingly and remarkably decoupled from
that of higher energies (or smaller lengths). In other words, the
decoupling entails that the higher energy regime does not much effect
the behaviors and character of the lower energy regimes.

New work, more generally on the problem modeling systems at widely different scales (10+ orders of magnitude), in nano chemistry and in materials science, brings some hope that the all-or-nothing dichotomy between reduction and emergence can be somewhat blunted. As noted, a question of real philosophical interest concerns how to understand the relative autonomy of theories and models at large scales. (Why, again, are the continuum equations so safe for large scale modeling?) Contemporary work in applied mathematics on so-called homogenization theory is beginning to provide interesting connections across these widely separated scales. (Torquato 2002; Phillips 2001)

The mathematics of renormalization is best understood as an instance of this general strategy for homogenization or upscaling. (Batterman 2012) It is crucial for a contemporary understanding of relations between theories. It is fair to say, however, that being able to understand such intertheoretic relations via homogenization and renormalization techniques does not entail the existence of reductive relations between the theories either in the philosophers’ or the physicists’ sense of the term. However, such an understanding may very well lead to a more nuanced and precise characterization of the debates about reduction and emergence.

## 4. Intertheory Relations

It seems reasonable to expect something like philosophical
reductions to be possible in those situations where **Schema
R** holds. On the other hand, neither philosophical nor
“physical” reduction seems possible when the limiting correspondence
relation between the theories is singular. Perhaps in such cases it is
best to speak simply of intertheoretic relations rather than
reductions. It is here that much of philosophical and physical interest
is to be found. This claim and the following discussion should not be
taken to be anything like the received view among philosophers of
science. Instead, they reflect the views of the author.

Nevertheless, here is a passage from a recent paper by Michael Berry which expresses a similar point of view.

Even within physical science, reduction between different levels of explanation is problematic—indeed, it is almost always so. Chemistry is supposed to have been reduced to quantum mechanics, yet people still argue over the basic question of how quantum mechanics can describe the shape of a molecule. The statistical mechanics of a fluid reduces to its thermodynamics in the limit of infinitely many particles, yet that limit breaks down near the critical point, where liquid and vapour merge, and where we never see a continuum no matter how distantly we observe the particles … . The geometrical (Newtonian) optics of rays should be the limit of wave optics as the wavelength becomes negligibly small, yet … the reduction (mathematically similar to that of classical to quantum mechanics) is obstructed by singularities … .

My contention … will be that many difficulties associated with reduction arise because they involve

singular limits. These singularities have both negative and positive aspects: they obstruct the smooth reduction of more general theories to less general ones, but they also point to a great richness of borderland physics between theories. (Berry 2001, 43)

When **Schema R** fails this is because the mathematics
of the particular limit \((\varepsilon \rightarrow 0)\) is singular. One can ask
what, physically, is responsible for this mathematical singularity. In
investigating the answer to this question one will often find that the
mathematical blow-up reflects a physical impossibility. For instance,
if **Schema R** held when \(T_f\)
is the wave theory of light and \(T_c\) is the
ray theory (geometrical optics), then one would expect to recover rays
in the shortwave limit \(\lambda \rightarrow 0\) of the wave theory. On the ray
theory, rays are the carriers of energy. But in certain situations
families of rays can focus on surfaces or lines called “caustics.”
These are not strange esoteric situations. In fact, rainbows are, to a
first approximation, described by the focusing of sunlight on these
surfaces following its refraction and reflection through raindrops.
However, according to the ray theory, the intensity of the light on
these focusing surfaces would be *infinite*. This is part of the
physical reason for the mathematical singularities. See also the discussion of the rainbow by Pincock 2011, and Belot 2005.

One is led to study the asymptotic domain in which the parameter
\(\varepsilon\) in **Schema R** approaches 0. In the example
above, this is the short wavelength limit. Michael Berry (1980; 1990;
1994a; 1994b) has done much research on this and other asymptotic
domains. He has found that in the asymptotic borderlands between such
theories there emerge phenomena whose explanation requires in some
sense appeal to a third intermediate theory. This is a claim
(Batterman 2002) that when taken literally, has raised a number of
hackles in the literature. However, understood in terms of the
mathematics of characteristics and wavefronts, as was originally
intended, the current author believes some of the debates are
misdirected. The emergent structures (the rainbow itself is one of
them) are not fully explainable either in terms of the finer wave
theory or in terms of the ray theory alone. Instead, aspects of both
theories (through asymptotic investigation of the wave equations) are
required for a full understanding of these emergent phenomena.

This fact calls into question certain received views about the nature
of intertheoretic relations. The wave theory, for example, is surely
the fundamental theory. Nevertheless, these considerations seem to
show that that theory is itself explanatorily deficient. There are
phenomena within its scope whose explanations require examining
the *asymptotics* of the appropriate equation. This involves
paying attention to mathematical structures called characteristics and
wavefronts. See Bóna and Slawinski 2011. These mathematical
investigations of the deep asymptotic structure of hyperbolic
equations are not at all like the straightforward derivations from
initial data that are typical of *in principle* derivations
often referred to in carrying out the dictates of Nagel style
explanatory reductions. A similar situation arises in the asymptotic
domain between quantum mechanics and classical mechanics where
Planck’s constant can be considered asymptotically small. (See Belot
2005 for an alternative point of view.)

There is much here worthy of further philosophical study. Some very recent work by Butterfield (2011), Butterfield and Bouatta (2011), Norton (2012), Menon and Callender (2012) challenges the point of view suggested by the above discussion. These authors address issues about the nature of infinite idealizations, reduction, and emergence. A common theme is that it is possible to reconcile emergence and reduction. By and large these authors adopt a Nagelian sense of reduction as definitional extension. For a contrary point of view one can see Batterman (2002; 2012).

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## Other Internet Resources

- Berry, M.V., and Howls, C.J., 1993,
“Infinity Interpreted,”
*Physics World*(June 1993): 35–39