Scientific Reduction

First published Tue Apr 8, 2014; substantive revision Wed Feb 27, 2019

The English verb ‘reduce’, derives from the Latin ‘reducere’, whose literal meaning ‘to bring back’, informs its metaphorical use in philosophy. If one asserts that the mental reduces to the physical, that heat reduces to kinetic molecular energy, or that one theory reduces to another theory, one implies that in some relevant sense the reduced theory can be brought back to the reducing theory, the mental can be brought back to the physical, or heat can be brought back to molecular kinetic energy. The term ‘reduction’ as used in philosophy expresses the idea that if an entity x reduces to an entity y then y is in a sense prior to x, is more basic than x, is such that x fully depends upon it or is constituted by it. Saying that x reduces to y typically implies that x is nothing more than y or nothing over and above y.

Though the term ‘reduction’ in this use may not correspond to everyday use nor to scientific discourse, its technical meaning is not fixed by mere stipulation. ‘Reduction’ is a term of natural language, and, building upon its common metaphoric meaning philosophers use it to designate relations of particular philosophical importance in a number of closely related fields, especially in the philosophy of science, the philosophy of mind, and metaphysics.

The notion of scientific reduction as used in contemporary analytic philosophy differs from conceptions of reduction according to which we learn about the instantiation of reduction-relations on a purely a priori basis from basic religious, metaphysical or epistemological principles. ‘Scientific reduction’ applies to reductionist claims supposedly justified by scientific evidence and the success of science.

Different accounts of scientific reduction have shaped debates about diverse topics including scientific unification, the relation between (folk-)psychology and neuroscience, the metaphysics of the mind, the status of biology vis à vis chemistry, and the relation between allegedly teleological explanations and causal explanations. Understanding the relevant notions is thus a prerequisite for understanding key issues in contemporary analytic philosophy. Moreover, the notion of reduction itself has become a target of recent philosophical discussion, especially in the philosophy of science and in metaphysics.

1. Historical background

Conflicts between reductionist views and their dualist and pluralist metaphysical rivals have loomed large in the history of philosophy. The classical debate between materialism and mind-body dualism is simply the most familiar of many such disputes. The Cartesian dualist is committed to distinct types of substances—minds and bodies each with its own essence. Different versions of dualism—interactive, epiphenomenal, parallelist – disagree about whether the two causally interact, but they all assert the ontological difference between the mind and body. Neither reduces to the other. They are distinct, and both are real.

Most contemporary reductionist as well as eliminativist positions include some commitment to materialism or physicalism—the view that the physical or material provides the fundamental reductive base. However reductionism per se is ontologically neutral. The concept of reduction entails no specific ontological positions. It is logically independent of physicalism or materialism. Indeed reductionism could be true of the entities in a totally nonphysical world as long as it had some base and everything in that world reduced to that base. Reduction is a general relation between entities or theories that might hold in many sorts of specific cases.

Some historical reductivists have been resolutely opposed to materialism and physicalism. Bishop Berkeley’s phenomenal idealism reduced ordinary tables and chairs to collections of ideas and denied the existence of matter. On Berkeley’s reductive view everything real reduces to minds and ideas. Idealism, as proposed by Fichte can also be given a reductive interpretation. On this view, the non-mental does not exist over and above the mental. The non-mental can be fully explained in terms of the mental, and it can be ultimately assimilated to the mental. According to this interpretation, everything just is ultimately mental. Idealists are reductionists whose reductive base is mental.

Idealism does not have many contemporary supporters, but there are current reductive theories that are logically independent of physicalism though consistent with it. Nominalism, for example, can be regarded as a reductive theory about kinds. The nominalist argues that the supposed reality of abstract objects—whether properties and kinds or numbers and sets—can be reduced to facts about concrete objects and our ways of talking about them. French structuralists can be seen as reductionists about subjects, or subjectivism; they suggest that the functioning of individual intentions and goals reduces to the inner workings of larger discourses.

Carnap’s mid-20th century unificationism presents an interesting example of ontologically neutral, phenomenological reductionism. Carnap’s reductionism states that:

… science is a unity, [such] that all empirical statements can be expressed in a single language, all states of affairs are of one kind and are known by the same method. (Carnap 1934: 32)

This interpretation covers several aspects—semantic ones (concerning the expressive power of a language), metaphysical ones (states of affairs being of one kind), and methodological ones. Assume that any empirical statement, or proposition, can be expressed in a single language. This language is, on Carnap’s view, a language that employs observational concepts only. This seems to amount to an ontologically neutral form of reductionism. In principle, any reductionist—the idealist as well as the materialist—can subscribe to this thesis. Disagreement will start only when it comes to specifying the ontological status of the kinds designated by this language’s observational expressions. Are they external mind independent properties of objects or are they phenomenal properties directly present in perceptual experience?

In sum, though most contemporary reductionists are also physicalists, there are many actual reductionist positions that are independent of materialism and physicalism. Such positions have played an important role in the history of philosophy, and some are actively supported today even as forms of scientific reduction.

The notion of reduction itself has become a target of philosophical investigation. If science is to provide (at least partial) answers to questions of reduction, such as whether the mental reduces to the neural, then we need to understand what reduction requires. What are the necessary conditions and how might scientific evidence show whether they are fulfilled?

J.J.C. Smart provided an influential, tentative description of the reduction relation according to which an entity x reduces to an entity y only if x does not exist ‘over and above’ y (Smart 1959: 143). Smart frames the question as one of existence, an ontological question: What really exists? How many basic kinds of things exist? Approaching the issue from a different slant, the philosophical notion of ‘reduction’ might be cashed out in terms of an explanatory relation. If x reduces to y, then it can in a relevantly strong sense be explained in terms of y. Take an example from Ernest Nagel. Describing the possible reduction of headaches, he writes that when

the detailed physical, chemical, and physiological conditions for the occurrence of headaches are ascertained … an explanation will have been found for the occurrence of headaches (Nagel 1961: 366)

Alternatively, reductions can be conceived of as consisting in a specific form of assimilation—a description that can also be found in Nagel (1961):

[In a reduction, a] set of distinctive traits of some subject matter is assimilated to what is patently a set of quite dissimilar traits. (Nagel 1961: 339f.)

Reductivists are generally realists about the reduced phenomena and their views are in that respect conservative. They are committed to the reality of the reducing base and thus to the reality of whatever reduces to that base. If thoughts reduce to brain states and brain states are real, then so too are thoughts. Though conservative realism is the norm, some reductionists take a more anti-realist view. In such cases the reducing phenomena are taken to replace the prior phenomena which are in turn eliminated. The idea of mental illness as a type of psycho-neural disorder replaces the idea of demon possession. Demons and their voices have no role or reality in the new theory. The oxygen theory of combustion replaced the phlogiston theory and phlogiston was eliminated.

Whether to count such eliminativist views as a variety of reduction is a matter of theoretical choice. Some might argue reduction entails realism about the reduced phenomena. If so, elimination is not reduction. On the other hand, replacement has sometimes been classed as a form of reduction (Kemeny & Oppenheim 1956), and it corresponds to an everyday sense in which theories are described as ‘reductive’. There is clearly a reductive aspect to the eliminativist’s claim that nothing is real other than the replacing phenomena, e.g., that there is nothing real other than brain states. Nonetheless most reductive views are realist, so ‘reduction’ hereafter should be understood in the conservative sense that entails the realism of the reduced phenomena unless otherwise noted.

Attempts to characterize the reduction-relation go back to the early years of logical empiricism. Neurath (1931) and Carnap (1934) described reduction as a relation of translation, or at least of unification by the universal requirement that all statements have testable consequences that can be stated in a shared observation language.

In more recent decades two closely related strands of debate have focused on the nature of reduction, one within the philosophy of science and the other within the philosophy of mind. Philosophers of science have proposed several explications of the notion of reduction, often with an eye on broader conceptions of explanation, scientific change, and unification. Philosophers of mind concerned with specific questions about whether the mental just is physiological or even physical in nature have asked what notions of reduction might be relevant and how they might apply to particular cases in psychology and neuroscience. The former philosophy of science strand is the topic of section 2, and the philosophy of mind debate is discussed in section 3.

2. Models of scientific reduction in the philosophy of science

The philosophical discussion of reduction-relations in the sciences was inspired by cases such as the alleged reduction of Newtonian mechanics to relativity theory, of chemistry to atomic physics, and of gas laws to statistical mechanics. However, in what respects these actual episodes of theory change count as reductions is a complex matter. Many factors might be relevant, not merely logical and metaphysical relations but also epistemic, psychological, and pragmatic ones. Questions also arose about the generalizability of these cases and their role in scientific progress or change, which led to the idea that an appropriate model of reduction should mainly focus on cases of actual theory succession. The main target in the reduction debate within the philosophy of science, however, was not a reconstruction of the process of scientific change, but rather an explication of the relation between successive theories that justified the relevant change, i.e., relations alleged to hold between pairs of theories such as Newtonian mechanics and relativity theory, or thermodynamics and statistical mechanics. In this context, the relata of reductions were conceived of as theories or models, rather than properties, events, or kinds. Thus, they are often referred to as ‘theory reductions’.

2.1 Reduction and theory-succession

The term ‘reduction’ oscillates between two different uses (at least). Kemeny and Oppenheim (1956) regard the idea that reductions somehow relate to scientific progress as being crucial for understanding reduction:

The label ‘reduction’ has been applied to a certain type of progress in science. As this process has been the subject of much philosophical controversy, it is the task of the philosophers of science to give a rational reconstruction of the essential features of reduction. […] Scientific progress may broadly be divided into two types: (1) an increase in factual knowledge, by the addition to the total amount of scientific observations; (2) an improvement in the body of theories, which is designed to explain the known facts and to predict the outcome of future observations. An especially important case of the second type is the replacement of an accepted theory (or body of theories) by a new theory (or body of theories) which is in some sense superior to it. Reduction is an improvement in this sense. (Kemeny & Oppenheim 1956: 6f.)

According to this use of the term, reduction is a relation of actual theory-succession, such that reductions happen at a certain time, namely, when scientists did bring it about. Often, philosophers employ the term ‘reduction’ in this sense, thereby designating an activity of scientists, or the outcome of such an activity. Whether or not a theory actually becomes the successor of another theory will depend not only on logical and metaphysical features of the respective theories, but also on pragmatic and epistemic aspects. The most relevant of these aspects are to be captured in a rational reconstruction, which plays a major role in some models of reduction.

When discussing the status of bridge-principles (intuitively, statements that connect the vocabulary of the reducing theory to the reduced theory), Ernest Nagel suggested that they might play different roles in the discovery of reductions than in after the fact analyses. They may function as hypotheses to be tested, or they may rely on empirical evidence already gathered. Similarly, Kenneth Schaffner suggests that an appropriate model of reduction should take into account not only logical or metaphysical aspects regarding the reduced and the reducing theory. Rather, it should also be sensitive to pragmatic and epistemic aspects underlying the actions of scientists who carry out reductions (Schaffner 1993: 515f.)—an idea he labels ‘logical pragmatism’. New Wave reductionists criticized other models, especially Nagel’s, for not being adequately sensitive to how reductions are actually carried out, a point also made by Ager, Aronson, and Weingard (1974).

The distinction between reduction as an activity and reduction as a relation that is independent of what scientists actually do is tentatively captured by the distinction between diachronic and synchronic reduction.

The main idea of diachronic reduction is not merely that reduction is a temporal affair but that they consist in the replacement of one theory by another theory, such that one theory (the reducing one) becomes the successor of the reduced theory (Dupré 1993; Rosenberg 2006). It is also often described as a sort of theory-improvement or scientific progress: particularly one in which the laws of the prior theory apply to a proper subset of the cases covered by the laws of the succeeding theory (Dizadji Bahmani et al. 2010).

The notion of reduction as a scientific activity, or as an event of scientific change, is discussed in the entries scientific revolutions and scientific progress. The remainder of this entry will deal with “synchronic” aspects of reduction.

2.2 Nagelian models of reduction

Recent reduction debates in the philosophy of science were initiated by Ernest Nagel’s model of theory reduction (Nagel 1949, 1961, 1970), which has also received considerable attention in the philosophy of mind (see, e.g., Fodor 1981: 150; Kim 1993: 150, 248). More recent approaches to reduction depart from or were developed in opposition to the Nagel model (Hooker 1981; Churchland 1985; Schaffner 1993; Bickle 1998, 2003; Dizadji-Bahmani, Frigg, & Hartmann 2010; van Riel 2014), though it has been argued that most of these approaches merely echo the Nagel model instead of proposing fundamentally new interpretations (Endicott 1998, 2001; Dizadji Bahmani et al. 2010).

2.2.1 Nagel’s model

Nagel describes his model as follows:

A reduction is effected when the experimental laws of the secondary science (and if it has an adequate theory, its theory as well) are shown to be the logical consequences of the theoretical assumptions (inclusive of the coordinating definitions) of the primary science. (Nagel 1961: 352)

The basic idea is simple: a theory TR reduces to a theory TB if and only if TR is derivable from TB with the possible help of the relevant bridge laws (here labeled ‘coordinating definitions’), often with an emphasis of the derivation of the laws of the reduced theory. If we add the remarks Nagel opened his discussion on reduction with—namely, that reduction has to be understood as a certain kind of explanation (1961: 338)—the core idea of the Nagel model is fully characterized. Adding Nagel’s idea of reduction as a kind of explanation, the so called “Nagel model of reduction” can be fully specified as follows: Reduction is (i) a kind of explanation relation, which (ii) holds between two theories if and only if (iii) one of these theories is derivable from the other, (iv) with the help of bridge laws under some conditions. The basic model covers two sorts of reduction, one in which bridge laws are not required (homogeneous cases) and one in which they are (nonhomogeneous cases; for a presentation of homogeneous cases of reductions and the question of whether or not alleged cases of reductions really should count as reductions in the Nagelian sense, see the entry on intertheory relations in physics). Nagel conceives of sciences or theories as developing entities that undergo changes, across which their vocabulary remains unchanged (though it is, presumably, sometimes extended). These successive states of theories are covered by the notion of homogeneous reductions—deduction of an early stage from a later stage of a theory is possible without bridge laws since they share a common vocabulary. Nonhomogeneous cases of reduction hold between pairs of different theories, employing different vocabularies. Whereas the former variant of reduction did not attract much attention (by Nagel and others), the latter has been a subject of intense discussion since Nagel introduced it in 1949.

2.2.2 Direct and indirect reduction

The Nagel model of reduction parallels the so called “deductive nomological model” (DN-model) of explanation according to which explaining some fact involves showing how its truth can be deduced from a set of other truths containing at least some laws. For example according to the DN model, one explains the acceleration of a falling body by showing how it can be deduced from Newton’s laws. The Nagel model of reduction thus seems to suggest that a reduced theory is directly explained by the corresponding reducing theory.

In this sense, Nagel reduction is sometimes (cf. Schaffner 1967: 137, 1993: 423) interpreted as a kind of direct reduction, in contrast with indirect reductions—those that hold in virtue of the fact that the reducing theory explains the occurrence of the phenomena of the reduced theory (rather than the reduced theory itself)—a view associated with Kemeny and Oppenheim (1956) and Friedman (1982), and captured as one variant of reduction by Schaffner’s model (Schaffner 1993).

However, some have argued that the distinction itself may not be viable (van Riel 2011). First, it is not clear what it is to explain a theory (except for explaining it to, say, a student). Second, the examples Nagel discusses suggest that he believed his model to be indirect—an “explanation” of a theory in terms of derivation from a reducing theory amounts to using the reducing theory to explain the phenomena dealt with by the reduced theory.

2.2.3 Bridge principles

Nagel’s major (and perhaps most controversial) contribution was the introduction of bridge principles. The notion of bridge principles, (also: ‘bridge laws’ and ‘coordinating definitions’) can be spelled out in several different ways. The most common way in accord with Nagel (1961: chap. 11, Sec. II.3) is to describe them syntactically as bi-conditionals linking terms in the vocabularies of the two theories. In the same context, however, Nagel describes them in terms of the ‘nature of the linkages postulated’ (Nagel 1961: 354). He distinguishes three such linkages:

  • The links mimicked by the bridge laws are ‘logical connections’ (1961: 354), which are understood as meaning connections.
  • The links postulated by bridge laws are conventions or stipulations (‘deliberate fiat’; 1961: 354).
  • The links postulated by bridge laws are ‘factual or material’ (1961: 354); that is, bridge laws state empirical facts (these truths are then described as empirical hypotheses).

These alternatives characterize bridge laws semantically in ways that seem more fundamental than their syntactic status and role in derivation. There is a gap between characterizing a sentence as a bi-conditional and as postulating the relevant sort of link. Bi-conditionals in themselves can express nothing other than truth functional relations, and real bridge laws cannot be defined in purely syntactic terms. Bi-conditionals are rendered true by a great variety of “links” (but ‘being rendered true by’ is not to be conflated with ‘postulating’): contingent co-instantiation or co-occurrence is not enough for reduction, even though it is enough for some bi-conditionals to hold (and, therefore, for some pairs of—possible—theories to instantiate the official Nagel model). Therefore, logical form (in first-order predicate logic) is not what we should focus on when we consider the syntactic nature of bridge laws. But what, then, is the relevant characterization? This is a matter of dispute among Nagel interpreters and those who refined the Nagel-model. Some tend to suggest weaker notions, such as (nomologically necessary) co-instantiation or co-relation (Dizadji Bahmani et al. 2010, also discussed in Klein 2009 and Kim 1998: 90, 2008), whereas others suggest stronger interpretations in terms of nomic conections or identities (Sklar 1967; Schaffner 1993; Esfeld & Sachse 2007; van Riel 2011).

In Nagel 1970, he explicitly states that bridge-laws state identities of the properties signified by the relevant predicates or nomic relations among extensions. If bridge laws should thus be conceived of as stating identities or relations among the relevant terms’ extensions, then clearly reduction on such a view incorporates essential reference to the theories’ ontologies and is more than just a two-place relation holding among theories.

Consider the following passage:

In … cases [of reduction in which the vocabularies of the two relata of the reduction relation differ], the distinctive traits that are the subject matter of the [reduced] science fall into the province of a theory that may have been initially designed for handling qualitatively different materials…. The [reducing] science thus seems to wipe out familiar distinctions as spurious, and appears to maintain that what are prima facie indisputably different traits of things are really identical. (Nagel 1961: 340)

Thus, Nagel-reduction is a relation that holds not just between theories but also between their ontologies. Sometimes, however, the Nagel model has been characterized as an epistemological model of reduction, because it is a model of theory-reduction (Sarkar 1992; Hoyningen-Huene 1989; Silberstein 2002), because it is a model of explanatory reduction (Sarkar 1992), or because bridge-laws are to be interpreted epistemologically (Fazekas 2009, following Klein 2009).

2.2.4 Arbitrary and non-arbitrary reductions

Finally, it is worth noticing that Nagel introduces a distinction between arbitrary and non-arbitrary reductions: These criteria are “non-formal” (1961: chap. 11, Sec. III). The first criterion Nagel mentions is that the premises of a reduction—the bridge laws and the reducing theory—should be well established rather than arbitrarily chosen (1961: 358). Second, Nagel alludes to the fact that the reducing theory should be better established than the reduced one. The third criterion states that reduction is concerned with unification. The fourth criterion states that the reducing theory corrects and augments the reduced theory.

Ideas similar to those of Nagel have been pursued, amongst others, by Robert Causey and Lawrence Sklar (Sklar 1967). Causey’s model of microreductions suggests that reductions are based in cross-theoretic identities and are, in a sense, decompositional (Causey 1972a,b). Kenneth Schaffner explicitly built upon Nagel’s model, extending it especially to cover cases of correction and replacement.

2.2.5 Reduction and replacement

Kenneth Schaffner explicitly built upon Nagel’s model, with a special focus on extending it to cover cases of correction and replacement. Appealing to the facts of actual scientific theory succession, Schaffner proposed an alternative model of reduction (Schaffner 1993: chapter 9; earlier versions can be found in his 1967, 1974, and 1976) based on the following main idea: If we want our definition to cover the relevant sort of cases of actual scientific developments, we must not focus solely on straightforward reductions; mere replacements and cases of theory-correction should be incorporated as well because (most, or at least a considerable number of) actual theory-successions do not fit into the picture of reductions in the more narrow sense (see, for example, Schaffner 1993: 426, 427f).

It thereby reflects the most powerful criticism that has been raised against the Nagel-model (see Section 5.3). Schaffner proposes a complex definition comprising several disjuncts, which are intended to encompass both genuine reductions and different sorts of replacement ranging from complete replacements via a continuum of relations to cases of correction fully within the reduced theory. Schaffner notes in many cases what gets strictly reduced in intermediate cases is not the original theory but a corrected version of that theory constructed within the vocabulary of the reducing theory.

2.3 Problems for Nagelian models of reduction

Many criticisms have been raised against both the original Nagel model and its variants. The original Nagel model was faulted as too narrow because it allows only for theory reduction (Wimsatt 1972; Hull 1976; Darden & Maull 1977: 43; Sarkar 1992), whereas an appropriate model would cover cases of reduction of mere models and the like—sciences like biology and neuroscience should be regarded as being possible candidates for reduction, although they do not contain full-fledged theories (see also the entry on reductionism in biology; for a discussion of this and the following criticisms, see van Riel 2011).

In a more general sense, the Nagel model has been criticized as exemplifying all the shortcomings of the orthodox view on science. For example, it conceives of theories as syntactic entities, and it views reduction as explanation cashed out in terms of the DN model (Hempel & Oppenheim 1948), which has itself been challenged on many grounds, especially those regarding the asymmetry of explanation (for an overview that focuses on problems arising from reduction as explanation, see Craver (2007: chap. 2), and for problems concerning the DN model, see Salmon 1989).

The Nagel model describes reduction in terms of direct theory explanation, whereas an appropriate model of reduction should shape the notion in terms of indirect theory explanation, that is, in terms of explanation of the phenomena of a theory (Kemeny & Oppenheim 1956; Schaffner 1967; Friedman 1982).

Three formal worries of the Nagel model merit mention: if reduction is derivation plus (sometimes) bridge laws, then any theory would reduce to itself (because any theory is derivable from itself); moreover, any theory would reduce to any inconsistent theory; and contrary to what one might expect, reduction would not turn out to be an asymmetric relation—derivability does not entail asymmetry.

Feyerabend (1962, 1966), Churchland (1986), Schaffner (1993), and Bickle (1998), amongst others, have argued that Nagel’s model allows neither for correction in the reducing theory nor for replacement, and that, therefore, it is fundamentally misguided. Recall, however, that Nagel suggests that at least some interesting reductions involve correction. He writes that:

[t]he [reducing] theory must also be fertile in usable suggestions for developing the secondary science, and must yield theorems referring to the latter’s subject matter which augment or correct its currently accepted body of laws. (Nagel 1961: 360)

At first sight, it is not clear how correction is possible if deduction is the basis for reduction. The truth of the reducing theories entails the truth of the reduced theories. This is what deduction is about. So, it is worth noting that Nagel introduced this criterion, even though it seems hardly compatible with his official model. However, as suggested by Putnam (1965: 206ff., esp. n. 3), there are a number of ways to incorporate correction within Nagel’s model: by speaking of approximate truth, by contextualizing the reduced theory, or by introducing probabilistic notions. Moreover, in discussing Feyerabend’s criticisms based on the alleged incommensurability of expressions in different sciences, Nagel explicitly stated that reductions may rely on approximations (1970: 120–21, 133). A similar idea seems tied to Nagel’s suggestion that some reductions may require boundary conditions (Nagel 1961: 434) in order to connect the relevant kind terms in an appropriate bridge law, thereby altering and adjusting one of the terms’ extensions. As has been pointed out by Endicott (1998), any account that allows for boundary conditions, correction, approximation and the like (such as the account proposed by Schaffner) will be able to cover such cases. Kemeny and Oppenheim suggest that idealization may be justified in developing models of reduction, noting that without idealization things would become “hopelessly complex” (Kemeny & Oppenheim 1956: 13).

Finally, Nagel’s model has been criticized for the role it attributes to bridge-laws. New Wave reductionists in particular have argued that bridge-laws do not play the role they are supposed to play in discovering reduction-relations. Contrary to Nagel, we do not use bridge-laws when discovering for example that parts of chemistry reduce to atomic physics. Rather, we infer bridge-laws from the discovery of relevant similarities between the two theories (for the explanatory role of bridge-laws and identity statements, see also Marras (2005: 351) and Block & Stalnaker (1999: 28)).

In response to those critiques, some, like Schaffner and Dizadji-Bahmani et al. (2010) and Butterfield (2011a&b) have developed variants of the Nagel model that retain its spirit but avoid many of the problems faced by the original. Prominent suggestions concern refinements of the logical framework in which Nagelian reduction is described (Dizadji-Bahmani, Frigg, and Hartmann (2010) and Butterfield (2011a)) as well as a relaxation of the condition that reductions must be complete. The idea is that even in physics, reductions are “most likely partial, and thus not fully systematic” (Schaffner 2012: 559). As Schaffner observed, even “almost sweeping reductions” (Schaffner 2006: 379) in physics, such as the reduction of physical optics by Maxwell’s electromagnetic theory, fail at some point. Partial reductions are conceived of as “largely completed reductions containing exceptions or failures of attempted reductions” (Schaffner 2012: 563). An interpretation of partial reductions for sciences such as biology has been developed in Schaffner (2006) and further developed by Winther (2009). His suggestion heavily draws on explanatory notions and mereological relations: In a partial reduction, the objects referred to in the explanans are parts, or a microstructure of the phenomenon to be explained. The phenomenon to be explained is a macro-object. The microstructure needs to be linked via “connectability assumptions” to the macro-object. These assumptions may suggest causal links or, in more straightforward cases, identity. Such explanations may turn out to be partial for various reasons: For example, they often do not explain all cases of the target phenomenon, the reduction base may span levels of organization, and they may fall short of straightforward derivations of the target phenomenon. Such partial reductions share important features with mechanistic explanations; for example, they are local, postulate a causal mechanism that is responsible for the occurrence of the target phenomenon, refer to constituents in the explanation, and may span different levels.

Partial reductions thus allow for emergence; we get a partial reduction only, some aspects of the target phenomenon are emergent. On Schaffner’s interpretation, this sort of emergence is purely pragmatic (Schaffner 2006: 382).

Others have rejected the Nagel model and used different frameworks to account for reduction. The most relevant alternatives will be discussed in the next sections.

2.4 Structuralist models of reduction

One alleged problem of Nagelian models is that they start from a mistaken background view of science in that they conceive of theories as syntactic objects and rely on dubious notions about the nature of laws and theoretical terms. Structuralists tried to overcome these alleged problems (as well as others, such as the problem of incommensurability) by revising the notion of a theory.

Part of the classical structuralist program consists in the idea that philosophy of science, properly construed, pursues an ideal of rational reconstruction of science (cf. Stegmüller 1979; Balzer 1984: 331), which is to be understood as a reconstruction of actual scientific developments. Since it is common knowledge that cases of straightforward reductions are rare, if they exist at all, structuralists focused primarily on cases of mere replacement or on similarities between theories, which are cashed out in terms of approximation or (semantic counterparts of) derivation under ideal conditions (Moulines 1984; Scheibe 1999; Stegmüller 1979 & 1986: ch. 4).

According to the structuralist picture (Sneed 1971; further developed in: Stegmüller 1979), to give an account of a theory T is to define the predicate ‘_is a (model of) T’ in set-theoretical terms. A theory basically consists of a set M, a set of potential models MP, a set of potential partial models MPP and a set of intended applications I, which is supposed to be “open”, or non-extensionally individuated. The relation between the different variants or stages of I is, as Stegmüller suggests, best thought of as being pragmatically fixed (Stegmüller 1979). Building on such a notion of a theory, Patrick Suppes proposes the following characterization of inter-theory reduction:

Many of the problems formulated in connection with the question of reducing one science to another may be formulated as a series of problems using the notion of a representation theorem for the models of a theory. For instance, the thesis that psychology may be reduced to physiology would be for many people appropriately established if one could show that, for any model of a psychological theory, it was possible to construct an isomorphic model within physiological theory. (Suppes 1967: 59)

These set-theoretical structures are then used to define a reduction relation in terms of mapping functions from one structure to another. It is worth noting, however, that structuralists believed their models of reduction to be advantageous because they believed their concept of a theory to be more appropriate. The general status of structuralism is an important factor in assessing the problems these models of reduction seem to face.

2.5 Problems for structuralist models of reduction

Schaffner has argued that the structuralist notion of reduction is too weak a notion to be useful, and that (official) Nagelian reduction is a special case of Suppes’ model. That is, whenever there is a Nagel-reduction, then there is a Suppes-reduction. Moreover, according to Schaffner, Suppes’ model covers cases that should not be covered, namely, arbitrary reductions (Schaffner 1967). Similar problems arise for successors of Suppes’ model that try to cash out reduction in terms of an isomorphism or an analogy-relation, which have been developed and refined by Sneed (1971) and Stegmüller (1979). The basic problem of these accounts has been described by Moulines (1984: 55) and a similar idea can be found in Hoering (1984). Moulines puts it as follows:

There is at least one further aspect of reduction that is overlooked by [the structuralist conception]. This is what I would like to call “the ontological aspect”. I wish to argue that, for a complete picture of a reductive relationship between two theories, one has to take into account some sort of relation between the respective domains. Otherwise, when confronted with a particular example of a reductive pair, we would feel that all we have is an ad hoc mathematical relationship between two sets of structures, perhaps by chance having the mathematical properties we require of reduction but not really telling something about “the world”. We could have a reductive relationship between two theories that are completely alien to each other. (Moulines 1984: 55)

Thus, the problem is that mere structural similarity does not guarantee that both theories are actually concerned with the same phenomena, or the same properties. This is a problem Nagelian models do not face if they describe bridge-laws in semantic terms, i.e., in terms of extensional or intensional relations among the relevant predicates or kind terms. Relatively independent of structuralist models, philosophers who work at the interface of the philosophy of mind and the philosophy of science have developed accounts that later have been labeled ‘New Wave’ reductionism.

2.6 “New Wave”-models of reduction

Relatively independent of structuralist models, philosophers who work at the interface of the philosophy of mind and the philosophy of science have developed accounts that have come to be known as ‘New Wave’ reductionism.

New Wave reductionists take it that their models give an appropriate reconstruction of a specific kind of scientific development (Churchland 1986: 279ff.; Bickle 1998: chapter 1). At the same time, however, this movement is associated with a reductionist metaphysical position. Arguing that neuroscience reduces or eliminates psychology, some protagonists try to show that we should embrace an eliminative form of reductionism about the mind (e.g., Paul Churchland 1981, 1985; Patricia Churchland 1986; Bickle 1998). Thus, there is a tendency to continue debates originating from the philosophy of mind tradition. The so called New Wave model (or better: a family of similar models), which was developed in a series of articles and books by Clifford Hooker (1981), Paul Churchland (1979, 1985) and more recently John Bickle (esp. 1998), builds on some aspects of Schaffner’s current model (1993) and its earlier versions (Schaffner 1967, 1974, 1976). Here is a formulation of Hooker’s definition:

Within TB construct an analog, T*R, of TR under certain conditions CR such that TB and CR entail T*R and argue that the analog relation, AR, between T*R and TR warrants claiming (some kind of) reduction relation, R, between TR and TB. Thus (TB & CRT*R) and (T*R AR TR) warrants (TB R TR). (Hooker 1981: 49)

The conditions, CR, will consist of limiting assumptions and boundary conditions that guarantee that if TB is more comprehensive than TR, the application of elements of TB’s vocabulary is restricted to the domain relevant for TR. The idea is to effect reductions that include corrections by working on the reducing theory (here ‘TB’) and not by working with corrections formulated in the vocabulary of the reduced theory. Ronald Endicott (1998: 56) identifies four core aspects of New Wave reduction: (i) “New Wave construction”: the corrected version of the reduced theory is constructed within the vocabulary of the reducing theory; (ii) “New Wave deduction”: this corrected version is deduced from the reducing theory; (iii) “New Wave relation”: analogical relations play the role bridge-laws play within Nagelian models; (iv) “New Wave continuum”: these analogical relations may differ in degree of strength—reductions based on strong analogical relations justify a conservative stand towards the (ontology of) the reduced science, whereas reductions based on weak analogical relations justify elimination. Identity (a limiting case for the continuum), for example, ensures that the ontology of the reduced theory is preserved by the reducing theory.

So, what is the basic refinement of New Wave reduction? According to Bickle (1998: 29 & 1992: 224) and Paul Churchland (1985: 11), avoiding reference to bridge-principles has a great epistemological advantage: The epistemological virtue of reduction does not depend upon knowledge of bridge-principles. Rather, comparison of reduced and reducing theories justifies identity claims.

New Wave reductionists typically allow for a great variety of relations backing up the analogical relation established between TR and TR*. In New Wave reduction, bridge-laws are replaced by ordered pairs of elements of the descriptive parts of the vocabularies of the two theories, which enable us to judge the degree of similarity between the derived image (which is formulated in the language of the reducing theory) and the reduced theory (Bickle 1992: 223). Reduction is associated with a space of theory-relations ranging from “perfectly smooth” or “retentive” reductions to “bumpy” reductions, which are best understood as mere replacements (Bickle 1992: 223; Hooker 1981: 45). Bickle describes smooth reductions as follows: (‘IN’ designates the derived image and ‘TO’ designates the reduced or the “old” theory):

In cases lying at or near the retentive endpoint, the IN is the exactly equipotent isomorphic image of the TO, and no counterfactual limiting assumptions or boundary conditions are required for the derivation of IN. (Bickle 1992: 223)

In this case, the pairing of the terms corresponds to identity of referents (Bickle 1992: 224) and IN can be directly obtained from TR (the reducing theory), whereas in cases on the opposite point of the spectrum, pairing is achieved only by reference to counterfactual limiting assumptions and boundary conditions. In this case, ontology is eliminated, as in the reduction of phlogiston-theory case.

2.7 Problems for “New Wave”-models of reduction

The main criticism raised against New Wave reductionism has been that it either misses the target of reduction, or that it is not new at all. Ronald Endicott argues that New Wave reductionists fail to recognize the important distinction between mere replacements on the one hand (that correspond to eliminativism, rather than reductionism), and proper reductions on the other (Endicott 1998, 2001). Insofar as New Wave reductionists conceive of reduction in terms of replacement, they just miss the target. If they conceive of reduction in terms of smooth reductions, then, basically, they repeat the Nagelian model in new terminology. A similar point has been made by Dizadji Bahmani et al. (2010). The authors point out that, especially when Schaffner’s model is conceived of as being basically Nagelian in spirit, New Wave reductionism just is Nagelian reduction.

Endicott as well as Dizadji Bahmani et al. (2010) argue that the sole difference between the classical Nagel-model and New Wave reduction is that New Wave reductionists highlight the procedural aspect of how reductions are carried out—or of how scientists may argue that reduction-relations are instantiated, whereas Nagel was mostly concerned with questions regarding the relation that is so discovered. How scientists may arrive the truth of bridge-principles is a question different from the question as to the nature of bridge-principles.

2.8 Reduction and mechanisms

The recent debate on mechanistic explanation took its point of departure in reflections on sciences other than physics. Most proponents of a mechanistic turn in the philosophy of explanation oppose a number of mainstream interpretations of core notions in the philosophy of science, especially that of a scientific explanation, a law, the layer-cake model of a hierarchy of sciences (Wimsatt 1976), and the notion of a theory. Most often, mechanistic explanation is characterized as (i) being related to the use of ‘by’ rather than ‘because’ (Craver 2007), (ii) being such that the functioning of a complex entity is explained in terms of the coordinated activation of its constituents, (iii) by being tied to a hierarchical order of local mechanisms, whose constituents can themselves become the target of a mechanistic explanation, and (iv) by the relevance of the notion of organization—mechanisms are organized to do something. This is how Craver puts it:

Mechanistic explanations are constitutive or componential explanations: they explain the behavior of the mechanism as a whole in terms of the organized activities and interactions of its components. (Craver 2007: 128)

A number of aspects concerning the relation between reduction and mechanistic explanation are dealt with in the entry on reductionism in biology. Thus, suffice it to say that some philosophers, like Craver, reject a reductionist interpretation of mechanistic explanation (Craver 2007), whereas others seem to suggest that a conservative form of reductionism may be compatible with mechanistic explanation (Bechtel 2007 and, especially, Schaffner 2006). Interestingly, the example of the reduction of headaches as described by Nagel (see above, Section 1) seems to suggest that he conceives of reductive explanation as mechanistic explanation. This is consonant with his first publication on reduction: In his early paper on reduction (Nagel 1935), he describes reduction as a constitution relation. Van Riel (2014) suggests that reductive explanation is a cognate of mechanistic explanation.

2.9 Reduction and causation

Mechanistic explanation is non-causal, and so is reductive explanation. However, sometimes, reductionist models are phrased in causal terminology. Enç (1976) is a case in point. He describes reductive explanation and reductive dependence as causal. The description he gives of this relation, however, does not fit the usual use of the term ‘causation’. Enç describes it as a ‘generative’ relation that may hold between an object a and an object b even if a=b. Hence, despite the fact that he uses the term ‘causation’, he should not be interpreted as stating that literally, reductive explanation is causal explanation. This has been overlooked by Schaffner (1993) who reflects upon Enç’s description, criticizing him for assuming that reduction is causation.

3. Models of scientific reduction in the philosophy of mind

Reductionist positions have gained attention within the philosophy of mind in four main respects. Firstly, type-identity theory was proposed as a reductionist position about the mind. Secondly, token-identity theories are sometimes conceived of as being reductionist in spirit as well. Thirdly, models of functional reduction have been intensively discussed. And, finally and corresponding to the previous distinctions, there are different conceptions of reduction that are discussed and rejected by non-reductive physicalism.

3.1 Type-identity theories

Type-identity theory claims that for types of some domain D1, (e.g., psychology) there are types of a domain D2 (e.g., neuroscience) such that for any member x of D1, there is a member y of D2 such that x=y. This aspect is revealed in the theory’s name—it is type-identity theory. It is not just the items falling under the types that are said to be identical but also the types themselves; e.g., being a pain is said to be the very same type as being a certain pattern of neural firing. However, just to claim that for any type x of some domain D1, there is a type y of a domain D2 such that x=y does not make you a type-identity theorist. Rather, it is a specific reductionist as well as a naturalist stance that accompany these identity-claims that make them proper “type-identity” claims.

The main concern was to defend this position against various counterarguments. The question of what exactly makes this position reductive did not receive considerable attention. Primarily, this theory is a monistic theory; but monism is not identical to reductionism. Herbert Feigl gives the following characterization of type-identity theory when answering the question of “whether the mental and the physical can in some sense be identified”:

[I]t is proper to speak of “identification […]”. Concepts of molar behavior theory like habit strength, expectancy, drive, instinct, memory trace, repression, superego, etc., may yet be identified in a future psychophysiology with specific types of neural-structure-and-process patterns. (Feigl 1967: 77)

This quote suggests a connection between type-identity theories and models of theory-reduction: It suggests that reduction, understood as an inter-theory relation, is closely related to type-identity theory. The idea seems to be this: Within a future psychophysiology, the fact that mental types are identical to physiological types might be revealed, and the nature of mental states will ultimately be given in terms of psychophysiology, rather then in terms of psychology. Similar positions have been held by Place (1954, 1956, 1960), who primarily speaks of constitution rather than identity, whereas Smart explicitly stated this thesis in terms of identity (Smart 1959).

3.2 Token-identity theories

Type-identity theory was largely, though not completely, abandoned when arguments from multiple realizability were put forward to show that due to the fact that at least some mental kinds can be multiply realized—that is: instantiated in different physiological kinds—an identification of mental with physiological kinds is impossible. Still, this left space for token-identity theories, according to which any mental kind is physically instantiated. The identity is that of the objects or items that are of the two types or that possess the two relevant properties, even though the types or properties themselves are not identical; e.g., one and the same item might have both mental and neural properties. The bearers of those properties, i.e., the items falling under the types, are identical, but the properties or types themselves are distinct. Token-identity theory is still a reductionist position in that it opposes any form of interactionist substance-dualism, substance-parallelism, and substance-epiphenomenalism. Even though it is not a very common term, in the literature, we sometimes find variants of the expression ‘token reduction’ (Cartwright 1999: 32ff.; Hooker 1981: part III; Bickle 1998: 223ff.).

Token-identity theories perfectly match weak interpretations of theory reduction. If for reduction, bridge-laws that state correlations or merely extensional relations are sufficient (Richardson 1979), or if bridge-laws are not laws in any robust sense, (Klein 2009; Dizadji Bahmani et al. 2010) then token-identity may be sufficient for Nagelian theory reduction.

Token-identity theories also match theory-reduction according to Schaffner’s and the New Wave reductionist’s models. Within these models, token-identity theories do not back up strong or perfectly smooth cases of reduction, but they nevertheless support reductions that are stronger than those that are merely extreme cases of replacement, not involving correction in any robust sense.

3.3 Local reductions and disjunctive kinds

Anti-reductionist arguments based on the assumption that mental kinds are multiply realizable have been attacked on at least two different grounds.

Clapp (2001) and Walter (2006) argued that high-level kinds can be legitimately identified with disjunctive kinds. The high-level type is identical to a kind we can refer to by a term consisting of a disjunction of expressions each of which refers to one of the different low-level kinds that realize the high-level kind: Hx = (L1x or L2x or……Lnx). We may be able to specify the relevant term only in principle in cases where the disjunction is infinitely long. This strategy is also pertinent in Dizadji Bahmani et al. 2010.

An alternative strategy suggested by David Lewis (1969, 1972) and developed by Jaegwon Kim argues in favor of local reductions (Kim 1992). High-level kinds are multiply realized in virtue of the fact that different physical kinds play the required role in different organisms, systems or contexts. Thus, if we individuate the high-level kinds in a more fine-grained way, we can save a weaker form of type-identity theory. Even though kind K might be multiply realized by kinds P1, P2, … Pn, there are more specific contexts C1, C2 Cn, such that in each context Ci, only one physical kind Pi plays the role of K in that context. Thus we make more local or contextual identifications. For example, pain in general may not be identical with any one neural kind, but we may be able to reductively identify human-pain with one neural kind, lizard-pain with a second neural kind and octopus-pain with a third. The relevant context could be species-specific, individual-specific or even specific for conditions of occurrence within an individual.

This idea was further developed by Brian Loar (1981: ch. 4), Jackson, Pargetter and Prior (1982), and Michael Esfeld and Christian Sachse (Sachse 2007; Esfeld and Sachse 2007). Esfeld and Sachse (2007) and Sachse (2007) describe how this insight can be accommodated within the high-level science by constructing fine-grained versions of the high-level types—so called ‘functional sub-types’—which can then be linked to the relevant low-level kinds, using the resources of high-level science.

3.4 Functional reduction

Functionalism about properties of a given sort is the view that such properties are functional in nature. For example: Functionalism about the mental is the view that mental properties are functional. Intuitively, a functional property is a property whose nature, essence or significance is fully captured by a description of the role it plays within a system. Versions of functionalism can be distinguished with respect to the sort of role they attribute to functional properties and the sorts of resources required to specify those roles. The relevant roles might be specified solely in terms of causal input-output relations. Alternatively, they can be conceived of in terms of relationally defined computational states (computational functionalism), or in terms of goal-directed interactions (teleological functionalism) (cf. Block forthcoming; Lycan 1987; Van Gulick 1980; Sober 1990).

‘Functional reduction’ signifies a family of models which are concerned with the reduction of such causal, computational, or goal-related properties. These models describe reduction as consisting of a relation between a functional property P and a structural or substrate property P* that plays the role determined by the functional property P, or at least does in a restricted class of systems or contexts. This general description leaves the question of the exact relation between P and P* open, nor does it say anything about the specific epistemic status of functional reduction. On this issue different models of functional reduction disagree.

Some functionalists assume that the functional property P and the property that plays the P-role, P*, are identical. On this view (also called ‘filler-’, ‘realizer’ or ‘occupant-functionalism’) a specification of the relevant role—typically obtained by a logical construction (the so called “Ramsey sentence”) from the theory containing a predicate that signifies this property—merely serves as a description to pick out the property that plays the functional role in the actual world. That is, ‘P’ refers to the underlying property that actually plays the role, namely P*. Others (so called ‘role-functionalists’) assume that the functional property P is a “higher order” property; it is simply the property of playing the relevant role and is not to be identified with any given underlying property P* that does so. On this view, P* merely realizes P; it is not identical with P. Given its denial of property identity, this latter view seems less apt to a reductionist interpretation. However, there may be means by which the higher-order properties might be logically constructed from lower-order ones that count as reductive (Putnam 1970).

Moreover, there is disagreement about how we arrive at a functional definition of a property. Some tend to assume that this is a more or less a priori affair. Others tend to think that it is an empirical matter.

Thus functional reduction is primarily concerned with the connection between reduction and the metaphysics of specific properties, namely, functional ones. That is: prima facie, it is compatible (if compatible at all, cf. Block forthcoming) with various definitions of reduction. It can be incorporated within a Nagelian framework (Esfeld and Sachse 2007), and it matches New-Wave reductionist ideas. Occupant-functionalism can be regarded as being compatible even with classical type-identity theory. Thus, models of functional reduction do not give sui-generis models of reduction; rather, they can be regarded as yielding detailed theories about how functional properties behave with respect to reduction. In short, the question addressed under the heading of ‘functional reduction’ is this: How do functional properties fit into a reductionist perspective?

If the following three are true: mental properties are functional in nature, occupant-functionalism is correct, and the role of mental properties is played by physiological properties, then mental properties reduce in a straightforward sense to physiological properties. Alternatively, it has been suggested that even if identification of the functional property with its realizer is not always possible, a reduction of such properties can still be achieved, either by way of local reductions (Kim 1993), by way of the reduction to disjunctive kinds (Clapp 2001; Walter 2006), or by way of the reduction of functional sub-types (Esfeld and Sachse 2007).

Others have argued that functionalism best suits non-reductive physicalism in the following sense: It maintains the naturalist’s intuition that there is unity among the underlying property-realizers which are all ultimately physical; hence, token identity theory is true. Nevertheless, it opens the possibility to accommodate the threat of multiple realizability in a particular way: Functional kinds can be multiply realized, and, hence, they can be regarded as being distinct from the lower-level physical properties. Moreover, if a pragmatic dimension is incorporated in the conception of functionalism, functionalism seems to contradict reductionist interpretations; it may be impossible as a matter of practice to specify the relevant roles using only the resources of the lower-level theories (cf. Van Gulick 2010).

Thus, differing models of functionalism and functional reduction might be used to either justify or criticize various forms of reductionism.

4. Definitions of ‘_reduces to_’

As discussed above, the term ’reduction’ can be interpreted in many ways. These rival explications can be distinguished (i) with respect to how they conceive of the relata of the reduction relation, and (ii) with respect to how they conceive of the conditions the relevant relata have to meet in order to instantiate the relation. Often, an epistemic aspect complements these characterizations. This section groups the rival accounts with respect to the objects they offer as candidate relata, and with respect to the links they offer as candidates for the conditions the relata have to meet in order to instantiate the reduction relation. Three remarks are in place:

In what follows, only candidates for the primary relata of the reduction relation are listed; it is the primary relata with respect to which philosophers disagree. The distinction between primary and secondary relata can be explained by way of example: Patricia Churchland holds that

[s]tatements that a phenomenon PR reduces to another phenomenon PB are derivative upon the more basic claim that the theory that characterizes the first reduces to the theory that characterizes the second. (Churchland 1986: 278)

On this view, the relation signified by the reduction-predicate in its basic, or proper use is instantiated by pairs of theories only. A derivative notion of reduction (and, hence, a deviant use of the predicate) allows for statements of the form ‘a reduces to b’ to be true, even if the respective instances of ‘a’ and ‘b’ do not designate theories. The truth of this statement then depends upon a corresponding truth about theory-reduction. For example, if water reduces to H2O, then on this view it does so only if, and if so: in virtue of the fact that folk-chemistry reduces to chemistry.

On the other side of the spectrum, those who view reduction in terms of real world entities rather than theories would not claim that statements of the form ‘a reduces to b’ are always false when the instances of ‘a’ and ‘b’ designate theories, and true only when they designate properties, or parts and wholes. Rather, they would hold that claims about theory-reductions are derivative upon claims about property-reductions or that the notion of theory reduction depends upon a notion of property reduction in a more ontological sense. Thus if folk-chemistry reduces to chemistry, it does so because water reduces to H2O, and because Iron reduces to Fe, and so on.

Secondly, this way of conceiving of the primary relata of reduction suggests that the reduction-relation is a binary relation. Recall, however, the observation that on Nagel’s account, in heterogenic cases of reduction, no theory reduces to another theory simpliciter; it does so only with respect to certain bridge-laws and/or boundary conditions. Depending on how one counts the arity of a relation, i.e., the number of items it relates, this might suggest that even on the classical interpretation, reduction is not a binary relation. More recently, alternative explications have been suggested according to which reduction is of an arity higher than 2. Thus, the intuitive notion of primary relata should be tied to the designata of the expressions flanking the reduction predicate in true reduction statements.

Finally, talking about candidate relata, we talk about types of objects that possibly function as the relata of an instance of the reduction-relation, rather than these objects themselves.

4.1 Representational and ontological reduction

Many reductionist views seem to involve ontological claims. If one denies classical substance-dualism and advocates a version of reductionism rather than eliminativism for minds, persons and mental state, then one seems to assert that objects or substances reduce to objects. If one rejects any dualistic parallelism of mental and physical events and advocates a version of reductionism rather than eliminativism for events such as perceivings, willings or pain events, then one seems to assert that events may reduce to events. If one denies property-dualism, and advocates a version of reductionism regarding properties such as that of being a person or of being a pain, then one seems to be committed to the assumption that properties reduce to properties. These different candidate-relata share one important feature: They are non-representational in nature (ignoring cases of objects that are used as vehicles for representations); they are real world items, not representations about items in the world. Especially in the philosophy of mind, these candidate relata have received special attention.

In contrast, most classical explications of reduction developed in the philosophy of science treat the reduction relation to be primarily instantiated by representational entities, such as theories or models. Building on these two lines of thought, one can, following Van Gulick (2001), draw a distinction between representational and non-representational relata of the reduction relation, and accordingly between representational and ontological reduction. Intuitively, the conditions on an appropriate model of ontological reduction require the identification of a specific sort of intrinsic similarity between non-representational objects, such as properties or events. In contrast, the conditions on an appropriate model of representational reduction require the identification of a specific sort of intentional similarity; if one representation reduces to another, it does so because of a similarity in what, and maybe how, these representations represent.

It is noteworthy that different candidate relata come with different candidate relations: Whereas those who regard properties as the primary relata of reductions might coherently suggest that identity is the relevant link, those who assume that theories are the primary relata of reduction should refrain from this move: No theory reduces to itself.

A brief survey of the candidate-relata should thus pair them with the candidate relations that best fit each in turn (Van Gulick 2001).

4.2 Theories

The most prominent candidates are theories. On the classical interpretation, theories are sets of sentences. This suggests a specific view on the reductive link: The reduction-relation is instantiated when the reduced theory is syntactically derivable from the reducing theory, with the help of bridge-laws. We thus get the following definition where x is the theory being reduced, y is the reducing theory and z is a set of bridge laws.

Theory-Reduction I: x reduces to y if and only if x is a theory & y is a theory & ∃z (y, zx)

The quantification is restricted to bridge-laws of the appropriate kind. A variant of this definition interprets the relata as sets of laws of two theories. Nagel’s homogeneous reductions are trivially covered (bridge-laws are irrelevant for the derivation; however, they do exist and state trivial connections not connecting distinct predicates, but the very same predicate in the reduced and the reducing theory). Variants of this definition include Schaffner’s model that, in addition, mentions possible replacements and catches aspects of the epistemological dimension of reductions, concerning the way scientists actually arrive at reductions (Schaffner 1993). These additional requirements might be regarded as imposing further constraints on the reductive link; however, especially in Schaffner’s model as well as in New Wave models of reduction, these further constraints are always disjunctive and seem to play the role of characterizations that accompany the definition. They do not form necessary conditions for reduction.

Depending on how bridge-laws are characterized (epistemically, semantically, metaphysically, or syntactically), a full-blown characterization of the link might or might not be a purely syntactic affair: If, for example, appropriate bridge-laws state property-identifications, or relations among the predicates’ extensions, then the characterization of the reductive link contains a metaphysical aspect.

On a structuralist interpretation, theories are complex model-structures. Here, mapping-relations play the role derivation is supposed to play on the syntactic interpretation of theories. We thus get (schematically, since the relevant function f is left unspecified):

Theory-Reduction II: x reduces to y if and only if x is a theory & y is a theory & (f(y)=x)

The conditions on this function differ according to different accounts; however, the function is characterized solely in structural terms. It is supposed to capture a relevant similarity relation between the respective theories, such as a structural isomorphism (Suppes 1967; Sneed 1971). Moulines’ criticism that this picture of reduction lacks an ontological link to rule out arbitrary reductions (Moulines 1984) reflects the idea that bridge-laws shouldn’t be given a purely structural interpretation.

4.3 Models

The notion of a model is also used more widely outside structuralist interpretations of scientific theories. Talk of models often refers to fragments of theories, to mere approximations and to objects (or descriptions of objects) that are used to represent a given target. Given that the common interpretation of classical conceptions of reduction requires the relata to be fully fledged theories, it is not clear how sciences such as biology, psychology, and neuroscience fit into the picture. In these areas, such imperfect, highly idealized or merely approximately correct models dominate theorizing, and often model-descriptions are accompanied by visualizations, which might raise further questions as to the applicability of purely or mainly syntactic notions of reduction (Bechtel & Abrahamsen 2005). There are no definitions of reduction that accommodate that fact directly; that is, there are no definitions of how one model reduces to another that might serve as a counterpart to those we have for theory-to-theory reduction. Rather, definitions of reduction directed at model-based theorizing are often described in ontological terms: It is the mechanisms, or phenomena captured by the models that allegedly reduce. The models themselves reduce only in a derivative sense (a discussion of these and related issues is covered in the entry on reductionism in biology.)

If, on the other hand, structuralist reconstructions of “imperfect” theories are successful, then model-reductions might be covered by Theory-Reduction II. Moreover, it has been argued that Nagel’s model should not be interpreted too strictly; at least, it maybe was intended to cover model-reductions as well (van Riel 2011).

4.4 Concepts

Reduction may also apply to concepts, where concepts are conceived of loosely as whatever is expressed by a meaningful term, or as the cognitively significance of a linguistic representation, or in Fregean terms as the mode of presentation under which an object is given by a representation. Concepts can be grouped into conceptual frameworks and networks of interconnected concepts. Most notably, there seems to be a fundamental difference between the framework that applies to our psychological states from the first-person perspective, and those that apply to our psychological states from the third-person perspective, such as the framework of neurophysiology.

Whereas models and theories as candidate-relata for reduction received considerable attention in the philosophy of science, within the philosophy of mind reduction as a conceptual issue also played a major role.

4.4.1 Conceptual issues and analytic functionalism

One such view is tied to functionalism, although this connection is mainly implicit: If a functional description of a property can be obtained from an analysis of a functional concept, then conceptual issues play an important role in the epistemology of functional reduction. On one standard version of functionalism, it is conceptual analysis which provides the functionalist with the specification of the functional roles defining mental properties that are needed to carry out the reduction. The condition on analytic functional reduction is thus (schematically) this:

Analytic Functional Reduction: P1 reduces to P2 only if instances of P2 play role R and it is a conceptual truth (or analytic) that whatever instantiates P1 plays role R.

4.4.2 Conceptual issues and the explanatory gap

Another motivation for believing that conceptual issues are crucial for reduction stems from the idea that the identity of properties or kinds expressed by two predicates P1 and P2 manifests in the fact that there is an a priori route from P1 to P2. This interpretation is implicit in the received view attacked early on by Smart (1959). It also plays a role in Levine 1993, 1998 and Chalmers 1996; the idea is that for reductions to be explanatory, they must not leave out any aspect of the phenomenon to be explained. If qualia-concepts or concepts of conscious states pick out mental states in terms of features that cannot be fully explained in terms of the vocabulary of the reducing science, the explanation and hence the reduction is not successful. Even if our mental terms and neural terms refer to the same states, if the former pick them out using mental concepts that cannot be neurally explained, we will not have reduced the mental to the neural. There will be a residual explanatory gap (Levine 1993, 1998).

Thus, even if two theories instantiate a relation of the sort required by Nagel’s model, we should not speak of proper reduction, if as a matter of epistemic possibility the connection between the domains of the two theories remains too loose to support the materialist claims. Levine (1993) gives this an epistemological interpretation; Chalmers (1996) seems to suggest that the epistemic possibility of two concepts coming apart implies that there is a metaphysical possibility of the two properties coming apart. Many (e.g., Block & Stalnaker 1999; Van Gulick 1999; Yablo 1999) have criticized this view. Even a hard-core physicalist will deny that the postulation of a mind-brain identity as a brute fact would suffice for reduction, but at the same time accept that it would suffice for the relevant sort of derivation. However, this does not support the further claim that there must be a conceptual path from concepts or predicates of the reducing science to concepts or predicates of the reduced science. Explanations are not an all-or-nothing affair; there might be explanations that are more than mere brute-fact postulates, but still less than the tight conceptual connections required by those who demand an a priori link between the reduced and the reducing science or conceptual framework (Van Gulick 1992; Kim 1998).

This a priori link can, following Beckermann (2009: 162), be described as an a priori implication of the truth of the reduced science, theory, or framework by the truth of the reducing science, theory, or framework:

A Priori Reduction-1: P1 reduces to P2 only if the set of all truths about the relevant domain employing concepts of the P2-framework conceptually implies the set of truth formulated using concepts of the P1-framework.

This way of putting it relies on an intuitive understanding of different conceptual frameworks. Stronger versions require there to be a conceptual connection between pairs of properties (Jackson 2005). At least under some interpretations, this apriorist view has clear predecents in early considerations about the unity of science.

4.4.3 Conceptual issues and the unity of science

According to Carnap, scientific unification should be effected by way of a theory that has the same expressive power as the reduced theories, and, hence, by translation.

… science is a unity, [such] that all empirical statements can be expressed in a single language, all states of affairs are of one kind and are known by the same method. (Carnap 1934: 32)

The notion of translation relevant here is not particularly precise; however, as long as the notion of expressing the same thing is not fully captured by that of designating the same thing, then reference to conceptual aspects of language obviously plays a role for this view on reduction. A particularly strong version, though apparently not Carnap’s, is this (this schematic conditional is restricted to properties signified by predicates, which makes the condition easier to formulate):

A Priori Reduction-2: The property signified by the predicate ‘_F’ reduces to the property signified by predicate ‘_G’ only if it is conceptually necessary that whatever is F is G, and vice versa.

The demand for conceptually necessary links echoes the position of Smart’s (1959) anonymous opponent who claims that if a type T is identical to a type T*, then a corresponding conceptual relation holds between expressions signifying these types.

4.4.4 Conceptual issues and the pragmatic dimension of reductions

Van Gulick (1992, 2010) highlights another aspect of the relevance of conceptual considerations for models of reduction. He suggests that conceptual issues might play a role for reduction insofar as their pragmatic function is concerned. People use representational devices, such as concepts, but also theories, models, and expressions, in order to successfully deal with objects in specific contexts. The directedness of a representation is not exhausted by the object it represents; a representation is typically embedded in a context in which it is used for a certain purpose. Here, the epistemic difference between different conceptual frameworks becomes apparent: The way the first-person perspective enables us to evaluate and deal with our mental states seems to be radically different from ways in which a third person perspective could enable us to deal with these states. If similarity in this respect is required by an appropriate conception of reduction, then the prospects for reduction seem rather meager.

4.4.5 Conceptual issues and the a posteriority requirement

The idea that reference to concepts is required by any appropriate explication of the reduction-predicate is also implicit in Nagel’s work (Nagel 1961): Nagel describes bridge-laws as being a posteriori, thereby opposing any sort of analytic reductionism. It has been argued that this might be crucial for fully understanding the concept of reduction. If so, then reduction turns out to be a four-place relation, involving not only entities but also the concepts by which they are picked out or referred to. Truth conditions for sentences of the form ‘a reduces to b’, where the expressions ‘a’ and ‘b’ designate properties, events, phenomena or the like, are sensitive not only to what ‘a’ and ‘b’ designate but also to how they do so, i.e., to the concepts or modes of presentation ‘a’ and ‘b’ express (van Riel 2010, 2013 & 2014; Jenkins 2011).

4.5 Properties

Consider the example of pain reducing to C-fiber stimulation. Under one interpretation, the expressions ‘pain’ and ‘C-fiber stimulation’ pick out abstract objects, namely natural kinds, properties or types. On this reading of ‘pain reduces to C-fiber stimulation’, the primary relata of reduction should be conceived of as properties or types. This view has played an important role in the philosophy of mind, underlying classical versions of type-identity theory and being the main target of anti-reductionist’s counter-attacks (Putnam 1967; Fodor 1974, 1997).

4.5.1 Property-identity

What sort of reductive link might suit those who assume that the primary relata of reduction are properties? Doing justice to the idea that if some a reduces to some b, then a does not exist over and above b, one might tend to assume that property-reduction requires identity:

Identity reduction: P1 reduces to P2 only if P1 = P2.

This condition is, under a certain interpretation, what underlies Nagelian bridge-principles (van Riel 2011, see however Sarkar 2015 for a different interpretation). It is also explicitly endorsed by Robert Causey (1972a, b, 1977), who connects it to theory reduction via micro-reductions. Just as in the writings of Smart (1959, 1963), the idea is that the relevant identities are not a priori. In addition, he suggests that by identifying the relevant kinds, attributes and properties of the reduced theory with kinds, attributes and properties of the reducing theory, we arrive at explanatory reduction because the laws of the respective theories will thereby be shown to be nomologically equivalent (Causey 1974: 5).

Identity Reduction is, at the same time, obviously compatible with various sorts of a-priorism. Moreover, it has been suggested that it offers a possible way to escape the explanatory gap: If some mental state just is some physical state, then there is nothing to be explained about how “these states” connect; it is a sheer misunderstanding to ask for more than just the identity-statement. Identity claims are basic in the sense that they cannot be successfully explained in the relevant sense (Block & Stalnaker 1999). As is well known, it is often hard to decide whether or not we are faced with identity or mere correlation; Wimsatt (1976: 697ff) argues that when we conceive of reduction as a scientific process, we are well advised to interpret apparent correlations as identities.

Recently, van Riel (2014) has argued that the idea that reduction is relevantly tied to identity generates a puzzle: Intuitively, identity seemingly contradicts the directionality, or what is sometimes called ‘asymmetry’ of reduction. More precisely: if a reduces to b, then b does not reduce to a. But how can this be if for a to reduce to b, it is required that a=b? The suggested solution is that ‘_reduces to_’ generates hyper-intensional contexts, and that this is best explained by the idea mentioned above: For a to reduce to b, two conditions must be satisfied: (i) a=b and (ii) ‘a’ expresses a conceptual content that relevantly differs from the conceptual content expressed by ‘b’. Another option would consist in giving this a pragmatist reading as in (Van Gulick 1992, 2010), or giving up on the idea that identity is required for (property-)reduction.

4.5.2 Alternatives to property-identity

There are three rival suggestions on the market, all of which argue that weaker notions of reduction still serve the purpose of the reductivist: The reductive link could be spelled out in terms of supervenience (Kim 1982, 1990), causation (Enç 1976) and realization (Kim 1998; Melnyk 2003; Shoemaker 2007. Whereas usual stipulations of supervenience do not rule out the possibility that a supervenes on b and, at the same time, b supervenes on a, at least causation seems to be relevantly directional and so do justice to the directionality of reduction. Nevertheless, causation is probably not what is required: the occurrence of water is not caused by the occurrence of H2O (in the usual meaning of the term ‘causation’); there is no temporal component involved, what is, on most accounts, required by causation.

4.5.3 Supervenience

Supervenience does not fare better, though for different reasons: It seems to be too weak a notion to capture the idea that guided reduction-talk, although it surely is a necessary condition for reduction. In a sense, if mental states merely supervene on physiological states, they exist in a straightforward sense over and above the latter. Such supervenient states are dependent; but being dependent is not enough for reduction (Kim 1998). Note that this is, up to a certain point, a matter of stipulation. However, the stipulation is driven by an intuition: An appropriate definition of the reduction-predicate should adequately mimic the intuitions that guided the use of the term. If, for example, one hope was to formulate a strictly monist position, then relying on supervenience does not serve this goal: Supervenience makes room for a weak form of dualism. For example, it is compatible with emergent property dualism. The emergent properties on such a view are something over and above the physical, but in so far they emerge from the physical base according to natural laws of emergence, they would supervene on that base. Any two cases in which the physical bases were the same would also agree in their emergent properties. Thus supervenience is generally not judged sufficient for reduction. However, many regard it as consistent with reduction or even required. With regard to the mind body case, for example, Kim argues that supervenience is needed for what he calls “minimal physicalism”, whether reductive or not. Under a somewhat liberal though well established interpretation of Nagelian reduction, there is a sense in which reduction is compatible even with emergence, that is: a theory about “novel behavior” (and, thus, emergent behavior) can be deduced from another theory (Butterfield 2011a&b).

4.5.4 Realization

Realization, which has figured prominently in recent versions of non-reductive physicalism may seem too weak a relation to support a reduction claim, but nonetheless strong enough to guarantee ontological unity on the token level that underlies physicalism. Realization can be described in terms of dependence; e.g., for a particular physiological event-type to realize pain is for it to be such that in virtue of its physiological organization, its instances play the pain-role. This obviously suits the (role-) functionalist interpretation of higher-level properties; these higher-level properties are realized by lower level ones in the sense that instances of the latter play the role of the former in virtue of their physical organization.

Most functionalists, being opposed to type-identity theory, regard the realization-relation as too weak a relation for reduction. Given a strong interpretation of what reductionism consists in—e.g., the type-identity of properties – the realization-interpretation might not suffice to guarantee reduction. It might ensure reductionism at the token-level, but it might, at the same time, be committed to dualism at the property level—though perhaps only a relatively innocent form of dualism. Options to reconcile role-functionalism with reductionism have been introduced in Section 3.4.

4.6 Wholes and their parts

The idea that reduction is tied to part-whole relations is frequently alluded to in the literature (esp. Schaffner 1993; Place 1956, 1960). The most elaborate version of this assumption forms part of Causey’s more general picture of scientific unification. Intuitively, and abstracting away from numerous details of his elaborate model (described in terms of theory-reduction), a micro-reduction in Causey’s sense relies on an identification of a property P1 with a property P2, where the syntactical arrangement of the terms forming the complex term ‘P2’ reflect the mereological composition of P1, whereas ‘P1’ does not. ‘P1’ simply refers to the whole without explicitly referring to its parts as ‘P2’ does, but they in fact refer to the same complex. Whereas mereological relations alone are compatible with emergentist or dualist interpretations combining mereological composition and identity seems to ensure a link strong enough to count as a reductive link.

Another way of connecting reduction to composition is this: one could try to describe reduction as a one-many relation. In one use of the term ‘composes’, a given object a may be composed out of several objects b1, b2, b3bn. At least at the face of it, there is nothing in the use of ‘reduction’ that should prevent us from, say, stating that a whole reduces to its parts.

At the same time, it is not clear how tying reduction to mereology could deal with cases like this: Iron reduces Fe (the chemical structure kind). Both expressions, ‘iron’ and ‘Fe’, are syntactically simple. More importantly, ‘Fe’ does not present us with Iron-atoms as composed wholes. Similarly, the often-used example of pain and C-fiber firing does not match this idea.

Moreover, this move would come at the price of building a sort of atomistic materialism into the very notion of reduction; if we were to define reduction in mereological terms, it would be conceptually impossible that parts reduce to the whole they form. However, it seems possible (though, in the light of science, maybe highly unlikely) that in some cases parts do not exist over and above the whole they form. Such was the view of certain historical varieties of holistic idealism (see for example entry on F.H. Bradley), and some have argued it is true of quantum systems including entangled particles (Silberstein 1999). Thus if we were to tie the notion of reduction to mereology, it would not be general enough to capture the full range of possible reductionist positions.

Finally, mereological relations are usually regarded as being instantiated by concrete objects and the wholes they form. A derivative notion can be defined for properties via reference to mereological relations between their instances. However, it is not clear how this could extend to events or event-types. Thus interpreting reduction as a matter of mereology might prevent us from applying it to events and deprive us of a fully general notion of reduction.

4.7 Mechanisms

One solution to this problem would be to connect reductive explanation to mechanistic explanation, even though mechanistic explanation is often described by its proponents as non-reductivist in spirit (Kauffmann 1970; Cummins 1975, 1983, 2000; Bechtel & Richardson 1993; Bechtel 1994; Glennan 1996; Machamer et al. 2000; Craver 2005, 2007).

The proposal would be to define a phenomenon a as reductively explained by a phenomenon b iff a is mechanistically explained by b. Mechanistic dependence might be distinguished from a mereological relation, if mechanisms are not the sorts of things that have parts in the ordinary sense of the term as some have claimed (Craver 2005). On one reading, the entity explained in a mechanistic explanation is an event. A mechanistic explanation explains an event in terms of events that together form the event to be explained. On this view, mechanistic dependence is analogous to mereological dependence but not the same, and might thus complement the mereological approach to yield a fully-fledged characterization of reduction.

5. Unresolved issues

The mainstream in the philosophy of mind is, apparently, one version or another of non-reductive physicalism. The majority within the philosophy of science has nowadays abandoned the unificationist program, to which reduction was intimately connected right from the start. However, as became apparent only in recent years, some questions regarding the concept of reduction have not successfully been accounted for yet, and recent developments in metaphysics in connection with metaphysical grounding may shed new light on the concept of reduction.

5.1 Reduction and explanation

Philosophers do not agree upon the relation between reduction and explanation. Some argue that the concept of reduction is on a par with concepts such as causation in that it is intimately tied to certain ‘because’, ‘in virtue of’ or ‘by’ statements, or that there is no fundamental split between explanatory and ontological models of reduction (van Riel 2011; McCauley 1981). Others have held that not only is there a difference between explanatory reduction, which is an epistemological matter, and ontological reductionism, but that there might even be a difference between explanatory reduction and derivation-based models of theory reduction (see the entry on reductionism in biology; see also Klein 2009; Dizadji-Bahmani et al. 2010).

For notions of reduction that are connected to explanation, the different options are, apparently, these:

  1. The notion of reduction is itself an explanatory concept, in the sense that it is a concept which is to be cashed out in terms of explanatory concepts: stating that a reduces to b, one states that b is explanatorily tied to a.
  2. The reduction relation is an explanatory relation, despite the fact that the concept is not to be cashed out using explanatory notions: that a reduces to b merely implies that b is explanatorily tied to a.

If the concept of reduction is an explanatory concept, then a definition of it is either of the form [… because …], or it relevantly involves an analysis of explanatory notions. If it is not, but still is such that the relation is explanatory, then a definition would at least imply the truth of a corresponding explanation.

Given this broad outline, it seems reasonable to assume that most models of reduction are concerned with explanation in one of these senses. Possible exceptions would include models that highlight replacement issues, where an apparent phenomenon is not explained but rather “explained away”, and perhaps some more technical notions of reduction that are guided neither by intuitions of the “nothing over and above” sort, nor by any metaphysical positions such as functionalism (e.g., Dizadji-Bahmani et al. 2010; Bickle 2008; Butterfield 2011a&b).

5.2 Epistemological and ontological issues

In a similar spirit, notions of reduction are often characterized as being either ontological or epistemological. There is, again, no uniform use of these qualifications. For Oppenheim and Putnam (1958), epistemological reduction is a reduction that is “true in virtue of the meanings of the terms involved” (1958: 3), i.e., reduction that is tied to analysis in the spirit of A Priori Reduction-2; this use, however, is relatively rare. First of all, it will prove useful to draw a distinction between epistemological and ontological forms of reductionism.

5.2.1 Epistemological and ontological reductionism (and non-reductive physicalism)

An epistemological reductionist concerning a science or theory S holds that in fact, we are (or at some point will be) able to reduce S to a more fundamental science. It is a thesis about what we can epistemically achieve. The ontological reductionist is, in this respect, more modest: She just holds that in fact, there is just one sort of objects and properties out there in the world; however, due to our cognitive limitations, we might never be able to actually carry out all the reductions that would be appropriate given the actual ontological structure of our world (Scerri & McIntyre 1997; Esfeld & Sachse 2010).

This distinction motivates different versions of non-reductive physicalism. On one interpretation, the non-reductive physicalist opposes the idea that we can and should in fact reduce high-level sciences; we need them for epistemic or pragmatic purposes (Fodor 1974, 1997; Putnam 1978; Van Gulick 1992). We need a plurality of autonomous theories and frameworks. However, the non-reductive physicalist accepts that what is actually out there might very well be all of one kind, at least in some ultimate sense such that ontological reductionism is true.

This version of non-reductive physicalism has to be distinguished from an ontological version, which is best described as token-physicalism, or token-token identity theory. Token-physicalism is the view that what occurs in our world is just physical; however, mental types are not identical to physical types. Hence, in this form, non-reductive physicalism is compatible with a weak form of ontological pluralism at least of properties or kinds.

It is noteworthy that it is often rather difficult to draw the line between these two versions of non-reductive physicalism. This is mainly due to the fact that the notion of a type or a natural kind is far from clear. Hempel, for example, tentatively suggests that what makes a type/kind a mental type/kind is that it is referred to within psychology or psychological theories (Hempel 1969); thus the nature of a kind or type becomes dependent upon the context in which we refer to it, which in turn might be epistemically or pragmatically constrained. Fodor suggests that being a kind is to be mentioned in a law; and that the locution ‘it is a law that…’ generates intensional contexts, i.e., contexts that are sensitive to how things are referred (Fodor 1974: 109). Hence, being a kind again might not be an all-or-nothing affair. If to be a kind is to play a certain epistemological role (this is, to be sure, not Fodor’s official point), then the distinction between ontological and epistemic versions of non-reductive physicalism (and, analogously, between ontological and epistemological reductionism) might be hard to spell out.

5.2.2 Epistemological and ontological reduction

Independent of issues regarding epistemic and ontological reductionism, philosophers sometimes allude to a distinction between epistemic and ontological forms of reduction. Sarkar (1992) suggests that a notion of reduction is epistemic if and only if it cashes out reduction in terms of explanation, presumably based on the assumption that the concept of explanation is an epistemic concept. Thus insofar it enters the concept of reduction, the latter is epistemic as well. On this view, an ontological concept of reduction would be one that is defined solely in non-epistemic terms.

Silberstein (2002), Sarkar (1992), Brigandt and Love (2012), and Hoyningen-Huene (1989) suggest another use of ‘epistemic reduction’: Reduction is epistemic if and only if its primary relata are representational in nature (and, hence, this use is equivalent to Van Gulick’s use of ‘representational reduction’ in 2001). Again this use seems motivated by the idea that epistemic concepts enter this characterization of reduction; for example, one might regard the very notion of a theory as an epistemic notion insofar as a theory is a body of knowledge. Accordingly, ontological reduction can be distinguished again in terms of the relevant relata: they must be non-representational entities.

It is noteworthy that this way of putting things is contentious and possibly misleading; after all, on a technical understanding theories are sets of sentences. The notion of a theory is thus a “linguistic”, rather than an epistemic notion. Labeling theory-reduction as ‘representational’ rather than ‘epistemic’ leaves open the possibility that the concept of theory-reduction is independent of concepts such as knowledge, belief, justification or understanding. At least Nagel’s official definition does not make use of epistemic concepts.

Moreover, this use of ‘epistemic reduction’ suggests a misleading distinction. Any description of bridge-laws that involves reference to the predicates’ extensions or intensions involves an “ontological” aspect. In this sense, the classical accounts of “epistemological” reduction are ontological, or at least include an ontological element.

5.3 Reduction and Ground

Recently, explanatory connectives, such as ‘because’ and ‘in virtue of’ have attracted considerable attention in the study of metaphysical ground. Very briefly, the term ‘ground’ is used to articulate dependence claims, without commitment to specific modal or counterfactual interpretations of various sorts of metaphysical dependence. Let us first provide some background and then hint at possible connections between reduction and ground.

5.3.1 A very short introduction to ground

Following Schaffer (2009), one can draw a distinction between two types of metaphysics in terms of their alleged subject matter. Quinean metaphysics deals with existence questions. It asks: What exists? What is part of the ontology of a given theory, such as physics? In contrast, (Neo-)Aristotelian metaphysics is permissive regarding existence. It is mainly concerned to identify what is fundamental and what depends on the fundamental. In Schaffer’s terms, it is concerned with “what grounds what” (Schaffer 2009). Examples of dependence claims the Neo-Aristotelian is concerned with include:

  1. The particularized property depends in its bearer.
  2. The mental depends on the physical.
  3. Aesthetic properties depend on physical properties and attitudes.
  4. Mechanisms depend on their constituents and these constituents’ interactions.
  5. The whole depends on its parts.
  6. Sets depend on their elements.
  7. The hole in the Swiss cheese depends on the cheese.

At least some of these claims, or cognates thereof, have formed part of metaphysics carried out in the Quinean spirit. Until recently, however, metaphysics did not provide the means to address these claims properly, says the defender of ground. Consider the claim that the mental depends on the physical. Until recently, metaphysicians would have suggested that this claim is to be cashed out in modal or counterfactual terms. The claim could be given an interpretation in terms of supervenience: Any shift in mental properties necessitates a shift at the level of physical properties.

Any analysis along these lines will leave the grounding theorist dissatisfied. One reson to be skeptical about an analysis of dependence in terms of supervenience is that supervenience is neither irreflexive nor asymmetric (unless by way of stipulation). In contrast, the sort of dependence grounding theorists are after when claiming that the mental depends on the physical requires that the physical does not depend on the mental, neither in whole nor in part. Unlike supervenience, dependence, at least of the sort assumed in the grounding literature, is asymmetric and irreflexive. And dependence claims may concern necessarily (co-)existing entities; dependence, unlike supervenience, appears to generate hyper-intensional contexts, i.e. contexts in which even substitution of necessary equivalents is not guarantee to preserve truth value (for further discussion, see Schaffer 2009, 364).

The concept of ground is supposed to do the trick. Ground is regarded as a primitive (Fine 2001). As a consequence, instead of giving an analysis of the concept of ground, philosophers have studied the structural features of ground – it is transitive, irreflexive, asymmetric, and it generates hyper-intensional contexts (Fine 2012; see also the contributions in Correia and Schnieder 2012). But if this notion is primitive, how do we get access to it? After all, ‘ground’ is, like ‘reduction’, a philosophical term; reflection on ordinary usage will not give access to its meaning in philosophical contexts.

One influential idea is that explanatory connectives such as ‘because’ or ‘in virtue of’ introduce a basic notion of ground (Fine 2012). ‘Because’ and ‘in virtue of’ are arguably asymmetric and irreflexive, and they generate hyper-intensional contexts (Schnieder 2011). They are part of ordinary discourse, and we are competent in using these expressions. When taken in a non-causal sense, or in a context where these connectives do not track causal dependencies, they may give access to the sort of metaphysical dependence philosophers have sought to capture for decades, if not centuries.

Alternatively, one could give an ostensive definition and introduce the notion of ground by way of examples; reflection on lists of dependence claims, or pairs of objects that are supposed to instantiate the grounding relation, may give access to the notion of ground (Schaffer 2009).

There are different interpretations of ground – in particular with respect to what can bel labeled ‘relational’ grounding and ‘operational’ grounding (Tahko 2013). Moreover, philosophers who accept a relational interpretation disagree about the primary relata of ground (candidates include: facts, propositions, properties etc).

Summing up: The primitive notion of ground is supposed to do justice to dependence claims, without any aspiration to further reduce this concept to modal or counterfactual concepts; and it has been suggested that explanatory connectives express this notion of ground. These preliminary remarks in mind, let us now turn to possible connections between redutcion and ground. First, there are two very general reasons to regard reduction as a particular variant of ground (5.3.2). At the same time, there appears to be a tension between reduction and ground. Either, reduction turns out to be distinct from ground, or the structural features of reduction may shed light on the nature of ground (5.2.3). Third, one may want to resist an assimilation of reduction to ground, based on a general skepticism towards the philosophical significance of grounding talk (5.2.4).

5.3.2 Reduction and ground linked

There are two paths leading from reduction to ground. First, reductive interpretations of paradigmatic dependence claims may inspire a reconstruction of reduction in terms of ground. Reductionists about the mental argue that mental states, like pain, reduce to certain physiological states and are, hence, identical to the latter. Eliminativists argue that mental states or properties just do not exist. Anti-reductionists maintain that pains exist and are different from corresponding physiological states. Some naturalists employ various notions of dependence to capture the priority of the natural while acknowledging a plurality of layers of reality. The debate thus centered on questions of existence and, often, various dependence relations, ranging from emergence to ruthless reduction. It appears, then, that the reductionist about the mental maintains that the mental reductively depends on the physiological.

By these lights, it may seem plausible to reconstruct reduction claims in terms of ground (if we accept that grounding talk is fruitful). Above, we have noted that the primitive concept of ground may be introduced by way of examples, or by lists of paradigmatic dependence claims. Theories of reduction may offer a viable interpretation of at least some of these dependence claims. Hence, it should not come as a surprise that some maintain that redution is sufficient for ground, so that if a reduces to b, then b grounds a (Rosen 2010, 124f., Schaffer 2009, 378, van Riel 2014). In a similar spirit, one may suggest that grounding talk offers a fruitful reconstruction of the idea that some things do not exist over and above other things, an idea frequently invoked in the reductio debate (cf. Wilson 2014 for an extensive discussion). It seems that on this conception, reduction turns out to be a particular variant of grund, perhaps among others.

Second, conceptions of reduction in the philosophy of science, which draw on explanatory notions, are committed to the assumption that there is a tight connection between reduction and ground, conditional on the assumption that explanatory vocabulary (interpreted non-causally) does in fact introduce a notion of ground, as some grounding theorists would have it. A concept of ground is often introduced by reference to explanatory connectives, such as ‘because’, and ‘in virtue of’. On this interpretation, there is a close link to conceptions of reduction in the philosophy of science. Within this strand of the reduction debate, reduction has been conceived of as an explanatory connection (see above). Of course, a robust metaphysical interpretation of explanatory links in terms of ground stands in stark contrast to some standard conceptions of explanation within the philosophy of science. Realists have mainly focused on causal explanation (Salmon 1989); only recently, philosophers of science have turned to non-causal, mechanistic dependence (cf. Machamer et al. 2000, Craver 2005, 2007). Others have taken explanation to be primarily an epistemic or pragmatic affair (Kitcher 1989, Achinstein 1983, van Fraassen 1980). Nevertheless, it is worth noting that it is an open question whether (non-causal) explanation can be construed pragmatically or epistemically, or whether it requires a metaphysically robust interpretation. If it turns out that explanation does require a metaphysically robust interpretation, the fact that reduction has been construed as an explanatory notion in the philosophy of science may be seen as an indicator that claims of reduction are, properly construed, claims of ground.

5.3.3 A possible problem

Yet, there is a problem. Above, it has been pointed out that claims of reduction are often taken to imply corresponding identity claims. Recall Identity Reduction (4.5.1):

Identity reduction: P1 reduces to P2 only if P1 = P2.

As a consequence, reduction is taken to have the “structural features of identity”, such as reflexivity and symmetry, as Trogdon maintains (Trogdon 2013, similarly: Audi 2012), but also intensionality. Then, it is not clear how reduction could possibly exhibit the structural features of ground – irreflexivity, asymmetry, and hyper-intensionality. (This observation seems to parallel the tension between supervenience and dependence noted above.) Philosophers have reacted in different ways. Some take these observations at face value and conclude that reduction is distinct from ground (Audi 2012, Trogdon 2013). Others have argued that it would be short-sighted to construe reduction in this way. From Identity Reduction, it simply does not follow that reduction has the structural features of identity. Recall the puzzle of reduction discussed above: Although reduction requires identity, identity is not sufficient for reduction. In fact, if a reduces to b, it follows, by the asymmetry of reduction, that b does not reduce to a. For this and similary reasons, it has been suggested that reduction generates hyper-intensional contexts, and that reduction statements are sensitive to the modes of presentation expressed by the terms flanking the reduction predicate (Jenkins 2011, van Riel 2013, 2014). On this view, reduction may turn out to be a variant of ground.

It is noteworthy that this debate turns on fundamental questions regarding the nature of ground. If reduction is a variant of ground, and if ‘reduces to’ generates hyper-intensional contexts in the way just sketched, then ground does not link non-representational objects only. Put differently, the grounding structure of the world would then depend, at least in part, on features of representations of the world. Fine (2001, 2012) and DasGupta (2014) take ground to be concerned with truths or finely individuated facts, rather than properties or fundamental or composed objects. On the other hand, this observation has led some philosophers to assume that reduction, ontologically construed, should not be regarded as a version of metaphysical ground (Audi 2012).

5.3.4 Reduction without grounding

Of course, there may be very general reasons to reject grounding talk altogether (see the discussion in the entry Metaphysical Grounding). In the present context, one criticism deserves close attention. Wilson (2014) maintains that reference to a primitive metaphysical relation in articulations of various dependence claims does not constitute philosophical progress. Many of the various detailed explications of different types of dependence, including mereological dependence, supervenience, and the relation between determinables and determinates, promise illumination, whereas grounding talk is ultimately obscure, mainly for two reasons. First, ‘ground’ is supposed to be primitive. Second, its structural features of a partial order – ground is irreflexive, asymmetric and transitive – are too permissive and too narrow at the same time, to single out a particular relation of metaphysical dependence, says Wilson. It is too permissive because temporal order and causation may have the same structural features (Wilson 2014, 569). It may be too narrow because, for instance, mixed cases of dependence may violate transitivity (Schaffer 2012, Wilson 2014). So, even if there is prima facie evidence that reduction and ground are closely linked, it is an open question whether shifting attention from theories of reduction to the metaphysics of ground will prove fruitful.

5.4 Problems for reductionism and the relevance of the notion of reduction

Scientific reduction became an important topic in the philosophy of science within the context of a general interest in the unity of science, and it was inspired by specific alleged cases of successful reductions. The most prominent argument against reductionism stems from the observation that straightforward reductions hardly ever occur. Hence, reductionism cannot be regarded as yielding a coherent picture of what actually goes on in science. As long as reductionism is supposed to be more than a purely metaphysical position and is intended to say something significant about scientific change or norms, the value and relevance of the notion of reduction seems to depend in part upon how well the reductionist positions fit the facts, which their critics argue they do not (see, for example, Sarkar 1992; Scerri & McIntyre 1997).

Proponents of reduction have responded in different ways. Some have suggested more flexible and liberal interpretations of reduction (Wimsatt 1976; Schaffner 1993; Dizadji-Bahmani et al. 2010), to ensure that the term ‘reduction’ still serves a purpose in describing actual scientific practice. A case in point is Schaffner’s suggestion (Schaffner 2006&2012) that we should reconsider the relevance of merely partial reductions or of scientific explanations, broadly construed, that are reductionist in spirit, despite the fact that they do not comply with more traditional standards of full-fledged theory-reductions (see also Winther 2009).

Others have opted for a more radical stance: Bickle has recently suggested that philosophical theorizing about reduction should best be construed as reconstructing whatever cases scientists judge to be reductions (Bickle 2008).

A much more modest position consists in the idea that, though straightforward reductions might be rare, reductionism might play a role as a regulative ideal (Schaffner 1993); the notion of reduction can, on this view, be used to characterize one extreme of a spectrum of possible relations between different stages of scientific developments. It comes with a specific normative power: If a reduction can be effected, it should be effected.

In addition, the notion of reduction obviously plays an important role in the characterization of non-reductive physicalism; a careful investigation of what reductionism consists in is required to adequately determine in what respects, if any, a theory of mind could be coherently both non-reductivist and materialist about the mental.

Finally, the concept obviously plays an important role in the field of metaphysics which often extends far into the realm of possibilities. Even if reductionism should fail to apply to our world and our scientific history, it might be of interest to consider what reality would be like in other worlds where reductionism does hold, worlds similar to ours in containing many different theories or conceptual frameworks but ones tied together by reductive links.

The hope that the actual progress of science can be successfully described in terms of reduction has vanished. Concepts of reduction, except for those re-adapted to actual scientific practice, are nowadays studied primarily in the more theoretically oriented parts of the metaphysics of science.

Still, the question of what the concept of reduction amounts to can be satisfactorily answered even if no theory actually reduces to any other theory and no property reduces to any other property. Answering this question may serve two closely related purposes. First, a precise characterization of what reduction is supposed to consist in will help judging whether or not a given theory, such as folk psychology, or a given property, such as being in pain, actually reduce to their neural counterparts. Secondly, an appropriate definition of reduction is called for when it comes to evaluating anti-reductionist positions.

As we have seen, reduction has been conceived of as a relation that primarily holds between theories, properties, substances, concepts, or events. It has been described as an explanatory relation that can be cashed out in terms of derivation, and it could be tied to mechanistic or ontological dependence, supervenience and identity. It has been argued that theory-reduction is prior to ontological reduction; and it has been argued that ontological reduction is more fundamental than theory reduction. Reduction has been couched in structuralist, empiricist and functionalist frameworks, and it has been one of the core notions of theories defending one form or another of scientific unification. Most philosophers have abandoned this latter view. But even if the outlook for strong general reductionism, a form of reductionism that amounts to scientific as well as ontological unity might be dim, exploring the question of what it takes for a property or theory to reduce to another property or theory will help not only understand what the search for unity consists in, a search that dominated large parts of the philosophy of science in the last century; it will also help judging and understanding its rivals, such as non-reductive physicalism, versions of dualism, or even the recently defended rainforest pluralism (Wimsatt 1994). If we know the conditions imposed by the reduction relation on pairs of theories or properties, we will also know what these anti-reductionist theories are bound to deny.


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