Plato’s Timaeus

First published Tue Oct 25, 2005; substantive revision Fri May 13, 2022

In the Timaeus Plato presents an elaborately wrought account of the formation of the universe and an explanation of its impressive order and beauty. The universe, he proposes, is the product of rational, purposive, and beneficent agency. It is the handiwork of a divine Craftsman (“Demiurge,” dêmiourgos, 28a6) who, imitating an unchanging and eternal model, imposes mathematical order on a preexistent chaos to generate the ordered universe (kosmos). The governing explanatory principle of the account is teleological: the universe as a whole as well as its various parts are so arranged as to produce a vast array of good effects. For Plato this arrangement is not fortuitous, but the outcome of the deliberate intent of Intellect (nous), anthropomorphically represented by the figure of the Craftsman who plans and constructs a world that is as excellent as its nature permits it to be.

The beautiful orderliness of the universe is not only the manifestation of Intellect; it is also the model for rational souls to understand and to emulate. Such understanding and emulation restores those souls to their original state of excellence, a state that was lost in their embodiment. There is, then, an explicit ethical and religious dimension to the discourse.

This picture of a divinely created universe, though controversial from the start (see below, section 2), has captured the imagination and admiration of numerous generations of philosophers and theologians through the centuries.[1] Because of the vast scope of the work, as well as its character as a monologue—by excluding exchanges between interlocutors the discourse is much more like an authoritative statement than a set of questions to be investigated—the Timaeus was generally taken to be the culmination of its author’s intellectual achievement, particularly by thinkers in sympathy with its portrayal of the universe. This also seems to have been one of the reasons for its early translation into Latin. Calcidius’ Latin translation in the fourth century CE made it the only text of Plato available in the Middle Ages in the Latin West until the twelfth century. While it still was an important reference point for Kepler, its influence began to wane over time. In the latter part of the nineteenth and earlier part of the twentieth century interest in the Timaeus was again stimulated by the refinement of philological methods and exact historical scholarship,[2] but for most of the second half of the twentieth century the dialogue was frequently dismissed as philosophically insignificant at best and regressive at worst. It played an important role in debates about the development of Plato’s philosophy, but not much more. Recent decades, however, have witnessed a strong revival of interest in the Timaeus: philosophers, historians of science and of ideas, and philologists, while not necessarily persuaded by the dialogue’s bold claims, have been fascinated by its majestic account and have sympathetically entered into and sought to elucidate its conceptual structure.

1. Overview of the Dialogue

The opening conversation (17a1–27d4) introduces the characters—Socrates, Timaeus, Critias and Hermocrates—and suggests that the latter three would contribute to a reply to Socrates’ speech allegedly given on the previous day, which presented an ideal political arrangement strongly reminiscent of the Republic.[3] This reply would start with an account of the creation of the universe down to the creation of human beings and, in a second step, show an ideal society in motion. Critias is meant to provide the second step with his account of a war between ancient Athens and Atlantis, the beginning of which we find in Plato’s Critias, while Timaeus is meant to deal with the first step in our dialogue. Timaeus begins the discourse (27d5–92c9) with a prologue (27d5–29d6) in which he sets out the metaphysical principles on which his account is based, introduces the figure of the Craftsman and his eternal model, and provides a brief comment on the status of the account he is about to provide. This prologue is followed by the discourse proper, which is uninterrupted to the end of the dialogue (29d7–92c9). The discourse unfolds in three main stages: the first sets out the achievements of Intellect (29d7–47e2), the second gives an account of the effects of Necessity (47d3–69a5), and the third shows how Intellect and Necessity cooperate in the production of the psychophysical constitution of human beings (69a6–92c9).

The first of the main sections of the discourse explains the existence of the universe and some of its most general features teleologically. The universe exists and manifests goodness because it is the handiwork of a supremely good, ungrudging Craftsman, who brought order to an initially disorderly state of affairs. It is a living thing (zô[i]on, also translatable as “animal”), because it is better for it to possess intelligence than to lack it, and the acquisition of intelligence requires the acquisition of soul. It is complete, and thus it includes within itself all the species of living things as its parts. It is unique, because its model is unique; the uniqueness of the model follows from its completeness. The world’s body is composed of fire (for visibility) and earth (for tangibility), but these so-called elements require the mediation of air and water in a progression of proportion to bind them together into a unified, concordant whole. The shape of the universe’s body—a sphere—and the characteristics it possesses or lacks are all explained in terms of their various purposes. The composition of the world’s soul out of a harmonically proportionate series of portions of a mixture of both divisible and indivisible Sameness, Difference and Being, and the division of these portions into two intersecting circles (called the circle of the Same and of the Different) explain the cognitive powers of the soul in relation to the different types of objects of cognition: those that are and those that become. When joined with the world’s body, they also explain the cosmological organization of the universe. The heavenly bodies are divine and move in their various orbits to serve as markers of time: the fixed stars to mark a day/night, the moon to mark the (lunar) month and the sun to mark the year. Time itself came into being together with these celestial movements as an “image of eternity.”[4] Individual souls are made up of the residue (and an inferior grade) of the soul stuff of the universe, and are eventually embodied in physical bodies. This embodiment throws the previously regular motions of the soul into confusion as the soul is subjected to the forceful disturbances of internal bodily processes as well as the impact of external bodies upon it, particularly in sense experience. These disturbances gravely impair the soul’s cognitive functioning; only with appropriate nurture and education can its original motions be reestablished and proper cognitive functioning be restored. The body and its parts were designed to support that functioning, and Timaeus takes the design of the eyes and the mechanics of vision as an important case in point.

Timaeus prepares for the transition to the second main part of his discourse by pointing out that while a causal story of the sort he has been telling so far is indeed concerned with what is properly the cause (aitia) of the universe’s generation, that story is not by itself sufficient and must extend to an account of “contributing causes” (sunaitiai or summetraitiai, 46c7, 46e6, 68e4–5) as well. The discourse must provide an account of the various physical structures that are necessary for and support the achievement of the purposes of Intellect. The properties possessed by these various structures are determined by their constitutions as a matter of “Necessity,” and it is not open to the Craftsman to change or eliminate the properties of these structures. The properties allow (or disallow) certain processes desirable to the Craftsman, and to the extent that Intellect achieves its desiderata, it succeeds in “persuading” Necessity (48a2–5). It is the role of the second major part of the discourse to set forth these contributing causes.

The second main section begins with the introduction of the receptacle, a “third kind” alongside the familiar paradigmatic forms and the generated images of the forms (49a1–4, 52a8, d2–4). The receptacle has been seen as serving either as material substratum or as some form of space or as combining both roles. Timaeus’ account of the receptacle presents several interpretive difficulties, some of which will be discussed below. In the “pre-cosmic” state (the state “prior to” the intervention of the Craftsman) the receptacle is subject to erratic and disorderly motions, and moves its contents in turn. Its contents are mere “traces” (ichnê, 53b2) of the subsequently articulated four “kinds” (the so-called “elements”): fire, air, water and earth. Each of these four kinds is made up of geometrical bodies—fire of tetrahedra, air of octahedra, water of icosahedra, and earth of cubes. The Craftsman begins by constructing these four regular solids as the primary corpuscles of each of the four kinds. These solids have faces that are made up (ultimately) of two types of right-angled triangles—the half-equilateral and the isosceles—and it is these triangles that are the “simples” of the physics of the dialogue. Because their triangles are similar (half-equilateral), only corpuscles of fire, air and water may be transformed into one another; while corpuscles of earth are made up of isosceles triangles and are thus excluded from such transformations. Each of the four kinds has properties that are determined by the constitution of their respective corpuscles, and these properties in turn determine how the particles act upon and react to one another. These actions and reactions are ongoing and perpetuate a state of non-uniformity which itself is a necessary condition for motion, i.e., the continuation of the interactions. Although each of the four kinds has a tendency to move toward its own region of space, their being squeezed together in a spherical universe without any gaps leads to the inevitable transformations that occur when their various corpuscles cut or crush one another. Thus it is assured that these migrations are never completed in the sense that there would be a complete separation of the four elements into separate regions. The account proceeds to explain the various varieties of each of the four kinds, and the sensible properties that they and their compounds manifest. An account of sensible properties calls for a preliminary account of sensation (including pleasure and pain), and it is with that preliminary account that this section of the discourse concludes.

The third main section of the discourse—about the cooperation of Intellect with Necessity—focuses primarily on the psychophysical construction of the human being. While the Craftsman has created the individual souls, he delegates the creation of the human bodies to the lesser, created gods. As individual immortal (and rational) souls are embodied in mortal bodies, the embodiment requires the further creation of the “mortal” parts of the soul—the spirited and appetitive parts, familiar from the Republic and the Phaedrus. These parts are assigned their respective locations in the body: the immortal and rational soul in the head, and the two parts of the mortal soul in the trunk: the spirited part in the chest (nearer to the head) and the appetitive part in the belly. The various organs in the trunk—the lungs and heart in the chest and the liver in the belly—support the functions of their resident soul parts. The account proceeds to describe the formation of the various bodily parts, setting out in each case the purpose of the part in question and showing how its construction (out of the appropriately selected materials) serves that purpose. The purpose is prescribed by Intellect, and the properties of the materials—selected because their properties render them compliant to Intellect’s purposes—are the consequences (and thus contributions) of Necessity. For the most part, Necessity serves the purposes of Intellect well, but this is not always the case. A notable example of them coming apart is the covering around the brain. That covering needs to be massive to provide maximal protection, but that very massiveness would impede sensation, and so a preferential choice must be made between the conflicting demands. Such occasional cases of resistance by Necessity to the “persuasion” of Intellect limit the degree of excellence the created world can attain. Timaeus’ discourse moves on with an account of the mechanisms of respiration and digestion, and a classification and etiological discussion of various diseases of both body and soul. This is preparatory to an exhortation to properly exercise both the soul and the body to recover or maintain physical and psychic well being. The well being of the soul in particular is emphasized: it is through realigning the motions of our souls with those of the universe at large that we achieve our goal of living virtuously and happily. The discourse concludes with an account of the generation of women and non-human animals.

2. An Interpretive Question

Ever since Aristotle rejected the cosmology of the Timaeus on the ground that it required not just a beginning of the universe in time, but a beginning of time itself (Physics 251b14–26), defenders of the dialogue—perhaps wishing to neutralize Aristotle’s critique while conceding that the assumption of a beginning of time is problematic—have claimed that the creation story is not to be read literally, but metaphorically.[5] This metaphorical reading of the dialogue became the prevailing (though not exclusive) view among Platonists, from the Old Academy of Plato’s immediate successors to Plotinus (third cent. CE). The question of how literally the creation story is to be interpreted remains an intriguing one that continues to interest (and divide) scholars to this day: if we follow the metaphorical interpretation, we will read the account not as a process by which an intelligent Craftsman put the world together at some time in the past, but as a statement of the principles that underlie the universe at all times of its existence. Key questions raised by this issue include the following: (1) Is Intellect (personified by the Craftsman) literally an intelligent agent of some sort, an entity that is ontologically distinct from both the model and its copy, or can the Craftsman be identified with some aspect of either the copy or the model—the world soul, for example, or one or other of the forms—and thus be reducible to something else? (On this question, see more below, under “Teleology.”) (2) How do we understand the relation of the “pre-cosmic” state of the universe to its finished state? The account posits that pre-cosmic state “before” the creative process by which the ordered universe comes into being. But if there is no time apart from the measured celestial motions, how is that “before” to be understood? (3) If the creation story is read literally, is it consistent with Plato’s views on related subjects set forth in other dialogues? [6]

3. Relation of the Timaeus to other Platonic Dialogues

The question of the place of the Timaeus relative to the other dialogues has given rise to an acrimonious but nevertheless fruitful debate, with far-ranging implications for our assessment of Plato’s philosophy. In 1953, G. E. L. Owen published a provocative article that challenged the orthodox view of the Timaeus as a work written during Plato’s so called “late” period, and argued that it should be regarded as a middle dialogue instead, composed prior to the Theaetetus and the Parmenides. Owen claimed to see in the Timaeus a reassertion of several metaphysical views familiar from the Republic but (on the reading proposed by Owen) subsequently exposed for refutation in these two dialogues, both of which on the orthodox view precede the Timaeus. The orthodox view was based on long-standing tradition, but had been confirmed by the stylometric studies of Plato’s writings undertaken by late nineteenth- and early twentieth-century philologists. Owen called into question the assumptions and the results of these studies. Four years later Owen’s criticism of stylometry, as well as his interpretation of the relevant arguments in the Theaetetus and the Parmenides, were in turn vigorously if not rancorously disputed by H. F. Cherniss in defense of the traditional view (Cherniss 1965, 1977). This debate between these two scholars of renown whose approaches to the study of Plato’s dialogues were so markedly different did much to bring a new level of acuity to the analysis of Platonic texts. Over time the orthodox view appears to have held its own. Both a more nuanced examination of the texts and more recent computer-assisted stylometric studies have done much to reinforce it.[7]

The opening of the Timaeus, depicting it as a sequel to a conversation about the ideal city-state that resembles the kallipolis of the Republic in important points, connects the project announced in the Timaeus to the Republic. This opening also presents the Critias as a sequel to the Timaeus. And Socrates’ request in the Phaedo to provide teleological causes for the explanation of the world, instead of the material causes employed in the cosmologies of the Presocratics (97b-99b), is answered by Timaeus’ account of the rational cause of the universe (the Timaeus, however, points out that the material causes of the Phaedo also have to be considered in order to explain the perceptible world).

4. The Status of the Account

In his prefatory remarks Timaeus describes the account he is about to give as a “likely account” (eikôs logos) or “likely story” (eikôs muthos).[8] The description is a play on words: the subject of the account is itself an “image” (eikôn) and, Timaeus avers, “the accounts we give of things [should] have the same character as the subjects they set forth” (29b3–5). Fashioned after an unchanging and eternal model—a possible subject of a definitive and exact account—the universe as a thing that becomes is shifting and unstable, and hence any account given of it will be similarly lacking in complete accuracy and consistency (29c4–7). This may be read as lowering our expectations—the account is no more than likely. At the same time, Timaeus says he will strive to give an account that is “no less likely than anyone else’s” (or “any other [account]”) (29c7–8) and, while the account cannot be grasped by understanding (nous, 29b6—the faculty for apprehending unchanging truths), it nevertheless merits our “belief” (pistis, 29c3) and fulfills certain standards. As Timaeus’ account proceeds, we are frequently reminded of its “likely” character,[9] and both the negative and positive connotations of that characterization should be kept in mind.

The account, then, is presented as reasonable, thus meriting our belief, but neither definitive nor complete (cf. 68b6–8), and thus open to possible revision (cf. 54b1–2, 55d4–6). A definitive account of these matters eludes humans (29d1) and is available only to a god “and those human beings dear to him” (53d4–7).[10] It has sometimes been argued that the qualification of the account as “merely likely” supports a metaphorical reading of the cosmology. This, however, is a mistake; it is not easy to see how the distinction between an exact and definitive versus a reliable but revisable account maps on to the distinction between a literal versus a metaphorical account. The contrast should rather be seen as one between apodeictic certainty (about intelligible matters) and plausibility[11] (about empirical matters). To the extent that the subject of the account is a thing that becomes rather than a thing that is, as well as a thing that is perceptible rather than a thing that is intelligible, the account will be no more than likely. To the extent that it is beautiful and ordered, modeled after a perfect reality and fashioned by a most excellent maker, the account will be no less than likely.

5. Being and Becoming

The account Timaeus gives of the generation of the universe is from the outset based on metaphysical and epistemological principles familiar from the dialogues of Plato’s middle period, particularly the Republic. Introducing the subject of his discourse, Timaeus posits a distinction between what always is and never becomes and what becomes and never is (27d5–28a1). He goes on to connect each with its familiar epistemological correlate (28a1–4): the former is grasped by understanding (noêsis) involving a reasoned account (logos), and the latter by opinion (doxa), which involves unreasoning sense perception (aesthêsis alogos). Although Timaeus does not here name the types of entity that satisfy these descriptions, the reader familiar with the Republic will call to mind the distinction between forms and sensibles (518c, 534a). The role of what is as the model after which the Craftsman designs and constructs the universe (29a) recalls the role of the forms as models for the philosopher-rulers to imitate in exercising their statecraft (Rep. 500b–501c). It is not until much later in Timaeus’ discourse (51b7–e6) that forms are mentioned for the first time, and their existence is argued for on the basis of the distinction (itself supported by argument) between understanding and (true) opinion. And the identification of what becomes with sensibles (in this case the universe as an object of sense) is readily made at 28b7–c2 (see 5. in the argument below).

Timaeus’ opening question (“What is that which always is and never becomes…?”) can be read extensionally (“What entity or entities are such that they always are and never become…?”) or intensionally (“What is it for some entity always to be and never to become…?”). If read in the former way, the answer will be “forms” or “a form.” If read in the latter way, the question is answered immediately in the text  and hence this reading seems preferable : always to be is to be intelligible and unchanging.

The metaphysical being-becoming distinction and its epistemological correlate are put to work in an argument that establishes the framework for the cosmology to follow. The conclusion of that argument is that the universe is a work of craft, produced by a supremely good Craftsman in imitation of an eternal model. The reasoning may be represented as follows:

  1. Some things always are, without ever becoming (27d6).
  2. Some things become, without ever being (27d6–28a1).
  3. If and only if a thing always is, then it is grasped by understanding, involving a rational account (28a1–2).
  4. If and only if a thing becomes, then it is grasped by opinion, involving unreasoning sense perception (28a2–3).[12]
  5. The universe is a thing that has become (28b7; from 5a–c, and 4).
    1. The universe is visible, tangible and possesses a body (28b7–8).
    2. If a thing is visible, tangible and possesses a body, then it is perceptible (28b8).
    3. If a thing is perceptible, then it has become (28c1–2; also entailed by 4).
  6. Anything that becomes is caused to become by something (28a4–6, c2–3).
  7. The universe has been caused to become by something (from 5 and 6).
  8. The cause of the universe is a Craftsman, who fashioned the universe after a model (28a6 ff., c3 ff.; apparently from 7, but see below).
  9. The model of the universe is something that always is (29a4–5; from 9a–9e).
    1. Either the model of the universe is something that always is or something that has become (28a5–29a2, also implied at 28a6–b2).
    2. If the universe is beautiful and the Craftsman is good, then the model of the universe is something that always is (29a2–3).
    3. If the universe is not beautiful or the Craftsman is not good, then the model of the universe is something that has become (29a3–5).
    4. The universe is supremely beautiful (29a5).
    5. The Craftsman is supremely good (29a6).
  10. The universe is a work of craft, fashioned after an eternal model (29a6–b1; from 8 and 9).

Given familiar Platonic doctrines and assumptions, the argument up to the intermediate conclusion that the universe has a cause of its becoming (7) presents no particular difficulties. But 7 by itself gives only partial support to 8.[13] Here it helps to anticipate 9d as a fundamental premise in Timaeus’ reasoning; it is not just the generation of any world, but that of a supremely beautiful one that Timaeus’ reasoning here—and in fact throughout the discourse—attempts to explain. That a world as beautiful as ours might be the effect of an unintelligent cause is a possibility that Plato does not discuss.

Once the conclusion that the universe is teleologically structured is settled, the explanatory methodology of the discourse proceeds accordingly. The question that frames the inquiry is not the question: What best explains this or that observed feature of the world? It is rather the question: Given that the world as a whole is the best possible one within the constraints of becoming and of Necessity, what sorts of features should we expect the world to have? This question invites a priori answers, and Timaeus’ arguments about the most general features of the universe as a whole (for example, why it exists, why it is alive and intelligent, why it is unique, why it is shaped and composed as it is) are derived wholly a priori. The answers to these questions are not open to empirical confirmation. But clearly the inquiry is also constrained by features of the universe that are actually observed, and this gives rise, secondly, to questions about the good purposes that are being served by these features (for example, the motions of the heavenly bodies, the psychophysical constitutions of human beings, etc.), and how the features in question accomplish those purposes. For the most part there is a happy coincidence between the features that are required (in answer to the first question), and the features that are actually observed (in answer to the second), and it is part of the genius of the discourse that these are so well woven together. Occasionally, however, the methodology leads to conclusions apparently at odds with observation—for example, the exemption of earth from inter-elemental transformation (see further under “Physics” below).[14]

The model that serves the Craftsman is regularly named the “Living Thing (Itself),” and this is either a form, or an appropriately organized constellation of forms. It is the Ideal (or better: Real) Universe; the object of what Plato had called “real astronomy” (as opposed to empirical astronomy) in the Republic (527d–531d, esp. 530a3). The Craftsman does not—indeed logically cannot—copy by replicating the Living Thing; his challenge rather lies in crafting an image of it that is subject to the constraints of becoming: unlike the model, it must be visible and tangible (28b7), hence three-dimensional (solid—stereoeidê, 32b1). This constraint in turn requires the postulation of something three-dimensional in which the created universe may subsist, what Timaeus initially names the “receptacle (hupodochê) of all becoming” (49a5–6) and subsequently calls “space” (chôra, 52a8, d3).

The imitative activity of the Craftsman, who forms the universe as an imitation of an eternal model, is unlike that of a builder who replicates a larger- or smaller-scale three-dimensional structure as model, but like that of a builder who follows a set of instructions or schematics. That set is the intelligible, non-material and non-spatial model that prescribes the features of the structure to be built; it is not a structure itself. It is a matter of debate whether Plato’s middle-period metaphysics included the view that forms were, or exhibited, some grander, unalloyed version of some of the properties exhibited by sensible objects. Arguably such a view (call it “crude paradeigmatism”) was refuted by the “Third Man” argument of the Parmenides (132a). As invisible, intangible, and non-spatial entities forms are excluded from possessing properties that only visible, tangible and spatial object may possess. Nevertheless, in so far as they are or exhibit intelligible natures forms may, like a set of instructions or schematics, serve as models to be “looked at” (28a7, 29a3) by anyone who understands those natures and is in a position to construct a world in accordance with them. (This view of the Craftsman’s imitative activity might by contrast be described as “refined paradeigmatism.”[15])

6. The Receptacle

Timaeus introduces the receptacle as a “third kind” (triton genos, 48e4) alongside forms and their imitations. He apologizes for the obscurity of the concept, and attempts to explicate its role by means of a series of analogies: it is variously compared to a lump of gold (50a4–b5), a mother that together with a father produces offspring (50d2–4, 51a4–5), a plastic, impressionable stuff (50c2–6, e7–51a1), and an ointment that serves as a neutral base for various fragrances (50e5–8). These images suggest that it is devoid of any characteristics in its own right (except those formal characteristics necessary to its role, such as malleability). The receptacle is posited as the solution to a problem: none of the observable particulars persists as this or that (for example as fire or water) over time. We observe the very thing that is fire at one time becoming air, and subsequently becoming water, etc., “transmitting their becoming to one another in a cycle, so it seems” (49c6–7). Thus the thing that appears as fire here and now is not fire in its own right: its fieriness is only a temporary characterization of it. What, then, is that thing in its own right? In a difficult and controversial passage Timaeus proposes a solution:[16] In its own right it is (part of) a totally characterless subject that temporarily in its various parts gets characterized in various ways. This is the receptacle—an enduring substratum, neutral in itself but temporarily taking on the various characterizations through traces of the four elements in it. The observed particulars just are parts of that receptacle so characterized (51b4–6).

The above analogies may be seen as suggesting that the receptacle is a material substratum: as gold qua gold is the material substratum for the various geometrical configurations it is shaped into, the ointment base for the fragrances, or the impressionable stuff for the various impressions, so the receptacle serves as the “stuff” that gets characterized in various ways. But Timaeus does not use any descriptive word that can suitably be translated as “matter” or “material”; he does, however, use the word, “space” (chôra). And its function of providing a “seat” (hedra, 52b1) reinforces the conception that its role is to provide a spatial location for the things that enter it and disappear from it (49e7–8, 50c4–5, 52a4–6).

There has been considerable discussion about whether the receptacle is to be thought of as matter, or as space, and whether it is possible to think of it coherently as having both of those roles. And there is also ongoing disagreement about the nature of the entities that are said to enter into and disappear from the receptacle. They are clearly not forms (52a4). Some interpreters have suggested that these are character types (or character tokens) derived from the forms, and that these types (or tokens) are properly the form copies (mimêmata) that have a prominent place in the argument for the receptacle (49c7–50a4). Whatever the merits of this reading, the things the receptacle is said to “receive” are “all the bodies (sômata)” (50b6). Bodies are three-dimensional entities, and this makes it likely that it is the emergence and disappearance of the variously characterized observable particulars as such, and not their properties (types or tokens), that are mentioned in these passages (49e7–8, 50c4–5, 52a4–6). But the particular bodies have a geometrical underpinning—the four “elements”, which are the building blocks of the physical world, are made up of the so-called Platonic solids; and these solids, in turn, are made up of two kinds of triangles (cf. below).

The complete metaphysical scheme of the Timaeus that is summed up at 50c7–d4 and again at 52a1–b5 is thus as follows: (i) the eternal and unchanging forms, the “model,” or “father”; (ii) the receptacle, or “mother,” and (iii) the copies of the model or “offspring” of the father and the mother. These three are the components of Plato’s analysis; they are not three ontologically distinct ingredients. The receptacle is introduced not as a distinct entity newly superadded to particulars and forms, but as a new and essential component in the analysis of what it is to be a spatio-temporal particular. What is missing from that analysis, however, is any mention of character types or tokens, and while later philosophers might see a use for such concepts in elucidating the metaphysical scheme of the Timaeus, it is not clear that Plato himself makes any use of them there.

The introduction of the receptacle is an important innovation in Plato’s metaphysics, and clearly a development that takes him beyond the metaphysics of the middle dialogues.[17] Little attention was given in those dialogues to the question of what it is to be a sensible particular (other than being something that participates in forms), or what is required of particulars to be such that forms may be exemplified in them. In order to be effective in their role of exemplifying forms, particulars must possess certain general characteristics qua particulars: they must be spatially extended and spatially situated, and they must be constituted of some indeterminate but determinable “stuff” that is subject to determination by way of participating in forms. Although the receptacle does not appear by name in any other of the later dialogues, it clearly has affinities to the concept of the apeiron (indefinite or indeterminate) of the metaphysical scheme in the Philebus. It is impossible, however, to determine the chronological relation between these two dialogues with certainty (see note 7), and thus impossible to infer which of the two schemes Plato might have thought to be the more definitive.

7. Teleology

Many commentators on the Timaeus have pointed out that the teleological account set out in the Timaeus is the fulfillment of a quest for teleological explanations related in the Phaedo (see, e.g., Strange 1999). In that dialogue the character Socrates describes his foray into causal questions in the realm of natural science and recounts both his high expectations of and disappointment with Anaxagoras’ concept of Intellect (nous) as providing the true cause of natural phenomena. Socrates expected the use Anaxagoras made of Intellect to provide teleological explanations; instead, Anaxagoras employed the concept to provide the same sort of causal explanation—in terms of physical interactions—that Socrates had found confusing. Continuing to hope for teleological causal explanations but finding them elusive, Socrates settles for a second best account: offering causal explanations in terms of participation in Forms (Phaedo 99c6 ff.).

It is not entirely clear by what avenue of reasoning Plato found what his character Socrates failed to find in the Phaedo, but it is reasonable to assume that the role of the form of the Good, introduced in the Republic, assisted in the discovery. Although the character Socrates in that dialogue declines to offer an account of the nature of the Good, it is not unreasonable to connect that form, as some have done, with rational, mathematical order.[18] Such order as the expression of goodness is arguably for Plato the ultimate metaphysical datum; forms other than the Good are good in so far as they possess such intelligible order, and they do so perfectly. Sensibles are good in so far as they participate in these forms, though they fail to do so completely. What is left to be explained, then, is how such order is manifested in the visible universe, however imperfectly. The explanation offered in the Timaeus is that order is not inherent in the spatio-material universe; it is imposed by Intellect, as represented by the Craftsman.

While the figure of the Craftsman seems to be an anthropomorphic representation of Intellect,[19] it remains to ask what the ontological status of Intellect is, in relation to the division between being and becoming—a distinction that appears to be exhaustive. Some interpreters, relying on Timaeus’ claim (at 30b3) that intellect cannot become present to anything apart from soul, have argued that Intellect is (part of) the world’s soul.[20] This cannot be correct: like the rest of becoming, the world’s soul is a product of the Craftsman, and hence neither it nor anything else on the side of becoming can be identified with Intellect. Alternatively, either Intellect is a form, or the distinction between being and becoming is not exhaustive. Some have argued that Intellect is to be identified with the entire realm of forms,[21] or the form of the Good,[22] while others, understanding “nous” to name a virtue, have opted for the form of Intelligence (a substance in virtue of its status as a form).[23] More recently, it has been suggested that the figure of the Craftsman is a personification of craftsmanship.[24] None of these accounts seem adequate either: if Intellect were a form of any kind, it would be an intelligible object, not a subject that possesses cognition and efficient causal agency.[25] Intellect, then, cannot be placed either on the side of being or on that of becoming, and that dichotomy is thus not exhaustive.[26] It is reasonable to conclude that Intellect is a sui generis substance that transcends the metaphysical dichotomy of being and becoming—possibly not unlike the Abrahamic conception of God.[27]

The teleology of the Timaeus may be usefully compared to that of Aristotle’s philosophy of nature. What is immediately striking in that comparison is the absence from Aristotle’s natural philosophy of a purposive, designing causal agent that transcends nature. Aristotelian final causes in the formation of organisms and the structures of the natural world are said to be immanent in nature (i.e., the nature or “form” of the organism or structure) itself: it is not a divine Craftsman but nature itself that is said to act purposively.[28] Such an immanent teleology will not be an option for Plato. Aristotle’s teleology is local, with no more than a few hints at a global level : while it makes sense to ask Aristotle for a teleological explanation of this or that feature of the natural world, it makes little sense to ask him for a teleological explanation of the world as a whole. Moreover, for Aristotle the development of an individual member of a species is determined by the form it has inherited from its (male) parent: the goal of the developing individual is to fully actualize that form. For Plato the primeval chaotic stuff of the universe has no inherent preexisting form that governs some course of natural development toward the achievement of some goal, and so the explanatory cause of its orderliness must be external to any features that such stuff may possess.

8. Physics

While the receptacle has an obvious metaphysical role in the Timaeus, its primary role after its introduction is in the physical theory of the dialogue. The argument from 47e3 to 52d4 prepares the ground for both the spatial matrix in which to situate, and the material substratum from which to constitute, the universe that he will fashion after its eternal model. The fashioning, however, is the process of bringing order to what was, prior to and apart from the Craftsman’s intervention, a thoroughly disorderly state of affairs, and so the physical account begins with a description of that disorderly, “god-forsaken” (53b3–4) initial state.

In that state, dramatically described at 52d4–53c3, the filled space that is the receptacle undergoes constant, erratic motion: it is subject to forces (dunameis, 52e2) that are dissimilar to and out of balance with each other, and thus, as each spastic movement produces its chain of spastic reactions, it is perpetually unstable (52e1–5). These motions may accidentally produce manifestations that to a would-be observer look like fire or any of the so-called four elements, or “kinds” (genê). Timaeus calls these manifestations “traces” (53b2) of the four kinds, and states that even as inarticulate traces, they tended to behave in the ways in which the subsequently articulated kinds would come to behave by necessity: each trace type would gather to its own region, with the heavier to one region and the lighter to another. These migrations are the effect of the ceaseless agitation of the receptacle, which acts like a “winnowing sieve” (52e6), separating the heavy from the light. The result is a pre-cosmic inchoate stratification of these traces, which anticipates the (perpetually incomplete, 58a2–c4) stratification of the finished universe.

In accordance with the requirements for the construction of the body of the universe previously set out at 31b4–32c4, the Craftsman begins by fashioning each of the four kinds “to be as perfect and excellent as possible…” (53b5–6). He selects as the basic corpuscles (sômata, “bodies”) four of the five regular solids: the tetrahedron for fire, the octahedron for air, the icosahedron for water, and the cube for earth. (The remaining regular solid, the dodecahedron, is “used for the universe as a whole,” [55c4–6], since it approaches most nearly the shape of a sphere.) The faces of the first three of these are composed of equilateral triangles, and each face is itself composed of six elemental (scalene) half equilateral right-angled triangles, whose sides are in a proportion of 1:√3:2. Timaeus does not say why each face is composed of six such triangles, when in fact two, joined at the longer of the two sides that contain the right angle, will more simply constitute an equilateral triangle. The faces of the cube are squares composed of four elemental isosceles right-angled triangles and again, it is not clear why four should be preferred to two. Given that every right-angled triangle is infinitely divisible into two triangles of it own type (by dropping a perpendicular from the right-angle vertex to the hypotenuse, the resulting two smaller right triangles are both similar to the original triangle) the equilateral or square faces of the solids and thus the stereometric solids themselves have no minimal size. Possibly, then, the choice of six component triangles for the equilateral and four for the square is intended to prevent the solid particles from becoming vanishingly small.[29]

Since each of the first three of the regular solids has equilateral faces, it is possible for any fire, air or water corpuscles to come apart in their interactions—they cut or crush each other—and their faces be reconstituted into corpuscles of one of the two other sorts, depending on the numbers of faces of the basic corpuscles involved. For example, two fire corpuscles could be transformed into a single air corpuscle, or one air corpuscle into two fire corpuscles, given that the tetrahedron has four faces and the octahedron eight (other examples are given at 56d6–e7). In this way Timaeus explains the intertransformation that can occur among fire, air and water. On the other hand, while the faces of the cube particles may also come apart, they can only be reconstituted as cubes since they are based on isosceles right-angled triangles; and so earth undergoes no intertransformation with the other three.[30] Having established the construction and interaction of the basic particles, Timaeus continues the physical account of the discourse with a series of applications: differences among varieties of each of the primary bodies are explained by differences in the sizes of the constituent particles (some varieties consisting of particles of different sizes), and compounds are distinguished by their combinations of both different sorts and different sizes of particles. These various arrangements explain the perceptible properties possessed by the varieties of primary bodies and their compounds. An object’s particular arrangement of triangles produces a particular kind of “disturbance” or “experience” (pathos) in the perceiving subject, so that the object is perceived as having this or that perceptible property.

It is a fair question to ask how the physics of the discourse relates to its metaphysics—for example, how the perceptible properties of observable instances of fire (its brightness, lightness and heat, let us say) relate to the form of Fire, an intelligible reality that has no perceptible properties at all. The form of Fire is the non-spatial, non-material, non-perceptible intelligible, eternal and unchanging nature of fire that the Craftsman “imitates,” and in so doing produces spatially extended, material, perceptible, transient and variable instances of fire. Although we are not told what it is about the nature of fire that requires observable instances of it to have just these properties, it is presumably that knowledge that guides the Craftsman to select and assign the four regular solids as he does. Given that the nature of fire is such that any “imitations” of it that appear in the Receptacle must be perceptible as bright, light and hot, the type of solid body that best supports these properties—the tetrahedron, it turns out—should be assigned to fire. And so with the other three kinds (see 55d7–56c7).

9. Ethics

Plato inherited from Socrates the conviction that knowledge of goodness has a salvific effect upon human life. That knowledge remained elusive to Socrates. As Plato continues the Socratic quest, he expands the scope of the search beyond ethical matters. In the Phaedo, as we saw earlier, the character Socrates expresses the conviction that goodness is the true cause (aitia) of the beneficent arrangement of the natural world, though the nature of goodness continues to elude him as well. The causal supremacy of goodness is recognized in the metaphysical and epistemological roles assigned to the Republic’s form of the Good, and it is the understanding of that form that constitutes the culmination of the education of the philosophical statesman, the paragon of the virtuous and happy person. What remains to be articulated is a conception of how cosmic goodness is manifested in the universe so that human beings will recognize it, understand it, and emulate it in order that their lives may become truly virtuous and happy.[31]

We saw above that in its dramatic context, the Timaeus is the second of a series of three or possibly four (see Critias 108a–b) speeches exchanged by four or possibly five (see Timaeus 17a) friends during one of the yearly Athenian Panathenaic festivals. It is sandwiched between Socrates’ Republic-like speech, which is briefly summarized at the beginning of the Timaeus (17c–19b), and Critias’ speech, the unfinished sequel to the Timaeus,[32] which was intended to recount and celebrate the great victory of ancient, prehistoric Athens over the vast military might of Atlantis.[33] The stated thematic purpose of Timaeus’ discourse is to provide an account of human nature in the context of the nature of the universe as a whole. Conjoined with Socrates’ previous account of education (à la Republic) this account will provide the basis for Critias’ forthcoming account of human virtue in action, as displayed by the deeds of the ancient Athenians (27a7–b1).[34] If we take this stated purpose seriously, we will expect the entire cosmological account to culminate in human psychology and ethics. And that is indeed what we find.

In the passage that may fairly be taken as the climax of Timaeus’ discourse (90a2–d7), human beings are urged to devote their utmost attention to the cultivation and preservation of the well being of their immortal, rational souls. The well being of a rational soul consists in its being well ordered (eu kekosmêmenon, 90c5), and so the goal of human life, given the fact that the soul’s revolutions were thrown off course around the time of birth (43a6–44b1), is to realign (exorthounta, 90d3) those revolutions with those of the universe at large. Such realignment is achieved by a study of the revolutions and harmonies of the universe and, once achieved, restores the soul to its original condition and thereby brings to fulfillment “that most excellent life offered to humankind by the gods, both now and forevermore” (90d5–7).


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Other Internet Resources

  • The Timaeus, Greek text and English translation, Perseus Digital Library, Tufts.

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