Notes to Plato's Timaeus

1. For a recent tribute to the cultural influence of the Timaeus from late antiquity to the Renaissance see Reydams-Schils (2003).

2. See Archer-Hind (1888 and 1988), Taylor (1928 and 1967), and Cornford (1937 and 1997).

3. Some scholars believe that the Republic, narrated by Socrates in the first person, is itself that first speech, but the dramatic dates of the two dialogues, as well as certain internal difficulties, makes such a suggestion difficult to defend.

4. Remi Brague (1982) has offered an alternative reading, understanding the heavens (ouranos) as the image of eternity.

5. In On the Heavens 279b32–280a1 Aristotle reports the view (that of Xenocrates, third head of the Academy) that the account is given in story form for pedagogical purposes.

6. For fuller discussion, see Zeyl (2000), xx–xxv. Broadie (2012), 243–277, provides an extended defense of the "proto-historical" (i.e., literal) interpretation.

7. For more discussion, see Zeyl (2000), xvi–xx.  The chronological relation of the Timaeus to other late dialogues such as the Sophist, Statesman and Philebus is much more difficult to determine: different stylometric criteria do not appear to yield uniform results.  For contrary assessments see Brandwood (1990), 250 and Ledger (1989).

8. For a plausible account of the distinction between eikôs logos and eikôs muthos see Johansen (2004), 62–64.

9. See, for example, 30b7, 44d1, 48d2, 49b6, 53d5–6, 55d5, 56a1, 57d6, 59c6, 68d2, 72d7, 90e8.

10. See discussion by Johansen (2004), 55–56.

11. See Burnyeat (2005) for a defense of translating eikôs as “reasonable” or “plausible” in these contexts. Burnyeat's influential paper has evoked thoughtful commentary and critique. See, for example, Betegh (2009) and Mourelatos (2009). See also Broadie (2012), 33–45.

12. The biconditional is required to support the inference from 5a and 5b below to 5.

13. For possible explanations as to why Timaeus takes the cause of the universe to be a craftsman, see Broadie (2012), 31–38 and Johansen (2014).

14. Aristotle criticizes the methodology precisely on this point.  See De Caelo 306a1–7.

15. The distinction between “crude” and “refined” paradeigmatism is useful in responding to Owen's charge (see above, section 3) that the Timaeus, if late, reintroduces a view previously refuted by the Parmenides.

16. For a discussion of the controversy see Zeyl (2000), lvi–lix.

17. For a different understanding of particulars that avoids this problem with motion see Sattler (2012).

18. Plato accepts the principle that there is not void (e.g., at Tim. 79b1, c2)

19. For further discussion of this point see Zeyl (2009).

20. This is correctly seen by Silverman (2002), 260.

21. In his attempt to assimilate the metaphysics of the Timaeus to that of the middle dialogues Owen (1965) took no account of the introduction of the receptacle.

22. See, for example, Kraut (1997), 207–208; Cooper (1997), 23; Burnyeat (1999).

23. This has been effectively argued by Hackforth (1965), and more thoroughly by Menn (1995).

24. Cornford (1937 and 1997), 38–39; Cherniss (1944), 425. See now also Carone (2005), 42–51.

25. De Vogel (1970), 194–209 and (1986), 73; Perl.

26. Hampton (1990), 909.

27. See Menn (1995), 14–18. Menn prefers translating nous as “Reason” or “Intelligence,” objecting to such translations as “Mind” (or “Intellect”) that in his view wrongly substantivize nous.

28. Johansen (2004), 69–86.  Johansen does not say that it is the form of Craftsmanship, however.   He fails to explain how an abstraction like craftsmanship can be capable of intelligent agency.

29. See Menn (1995) for an account that attempts to attribute efficient causality to the form of nous.  Whatever the plausibility of this account, Intellect functions as a causal agent, and not merely as an (impersonal) efficient cause, and its role as subject of rational action is not captured in Menn's account.  It is far from clear that Platonic forms have the capacities to be intelligent subjects as well as intelligible objects.

30. When the dichotomy is introduced at 27d6–27a1 it is as exclusive but not as exhaustive.

31. For a recent cogent defense of the separateness of the Craftsman from any of his products (in particular the world soul) and an instructive comparison between the Platonic Demiurge and the “Abrahamic” God, see Broadie (2012), 7–26.

32. See, for example, On the Parts of Animals 4.10, 687a19–23.

33. For different explanations see Cornford (1997) and Artmann and Schäfer (1993).

34. As Aristotle objected (see note 14 above), this exception is contradicted by what is actually observed. 

35. The ethical significance of the cosmology of the Timaeus (as well as that of other late Platonic dialogues) is well demonstrated by Carone (2005).

36. We do not know why the Critias was left unfinished.

37. There are fascinating questions concerning the provenance and verisimilitude of the Atlantis story that cannot be treated here.  For discussion see Pradeau (1997), Johansen (2004), 24–47, Broadie (2012), 115–172 and Gill (2017).

38. This is well discussed by Johansen (2004), 9 ff. 

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Donald Zeyl <>
Barbara Sattler <>

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