Notes to Platonism in the Philosophy of Mathematics

1. Does platonism directly contradict physicalism? The answer will depend on how physicalism is defined. If physicalism is defined as the view that everything supervenes on the physical, and if all mathematical truths are necessary, then the two views will be formally consistent. For assuming S5, any two worlds are alike with respect to necessary truths. Thus a fortiori, any two worlds that are alike with respect to physical truths are also alike with respect to mathematical truths. But this is a standard definition of the claim that mathematical truths supervene on the physical. If on the other hand physicalism is defined as the view that all entities are composed of, or constituted by, fundamental physical entities, then the two views will contradict each other. (See the entry on physicalism.)

2. For instance, there is wide-spread agreement among mathematicians about the guiding problems of their field and about the kinds of methods that are permissible when attempting to solve these problems. Moreover, using these methods, mathematicians have made, and continue to make, great progress towards solving these guiding problems.

3. However, the philosophical analysis itself could be challenged. For this analysis goes beyond mathematics proper and does therefore not automatically inherit its strong scientific credentials.

4. “Object realism” is sometimes identified with Existence rather than with the conjunction of Existence and Abstractness; see e.g. Linnebo 2017.

5. However, it is not easy to understand what this dependence or constitution amounts to. More recent forms of intuitionism are often given an alternative development in the form of a non-classical semantics for the language of mathematics. Semantic theories of this sort seek to replace the classical notion of truth with the epistemologically more tractable notion of proof. Where classical platonism says that a mathematical sentence \(S\) is true just in case the objects that \(S\) talks about have the properties that \(S\) ascribes to them, the present form of intuitionism says that \(S\) is true (in some suitably lightweight sense) just in case \(S\) is provable. See Wright 1992 and Dummett 1991b.

6. One example is the “modal structuralism” of Hellman 1989, where an arithmetical sentence \(A\) is analyzed as \(\Box\forall X\forall f\forall x[\textrm{PA}^2 (X/\mathbb{N}, f/s, x/0)A(X/\mathbb{N}, f/s, x/0)\)], where \(\textrm{PA}^2\) is the conjunction of the axioms of second-order Peano Arithmetic.

7. This is the point of Kreisel’s dictum, which makes many appearances in the writings of Michael Dummett, for instance:

As Kreisel remarked in a review of Wittgenstein, “the problem is not the existence of mathematical objects but the objectivity of mathematical statements”. (Dummett 1978b, p. xxxviii)

See also Dummett 1981, p. 508. The remark of Kreisel’s to which Dummett is alluding appears to be Kreisel 1958, p. 138, fn. 1 (which, if so, is rather less memorable than Dummett’s paraphrase). For another example of the view that truth-value realism is more important than platonism, see Isaacson 1994, and Gaifman 1975 for a related view.

8. See Hilbert 1996, p. 1102. Famously, one of the problems Hilbert sets is the Continuum Hypothesis. For this problem to be “solvable”, the Continuum Hypothesis must have an objective truth-value despite being independent of standard ZFC set theory.

9. Note that this step uses the parenthetical precisification in Truth. Without this precisification, it would be possible for most sentences accepted as mathematical theorems to be true and all sentences of the form mentioned in the text to be false.

10. There is a related argument which stands to object-directed intentional acts the way the Fregean argument stands to sentences or propositions. (See Gödel 1964 and Parsons 1980 and 1995.)

  • People have intuitions as of mathematical objects.
  • These intuitions are veridical.

These premises entail Existence as well: for an intuition can only be veridical when its intentional object exists. But the entry concentrates on the original Fregean argument as this seems more tractable. For it is easier to assess whether a mathematical sentence is true than whether a mathematical intuition is veridical.

11. An epistemic holist will claim that evidence for or against a linguistic analysis can in principle come from anywhere. One need not deny this claim. The point is simply that the hypothesis in question belongs to empirical linguistics and has to be assessed as such.

12. Two differences between Benacerraf’s and Field’s arguments deserve mention. Firstly, Field’s argument is carefully formulated so as to avoid any appeal to problematic causal theories of knowledge. Secondly, unlike Field, Benacerraf does not regard his argument as an objection to mathematical platonism but rather as a dilemma. One desideratum in the philosophy of mathematics is a unified semantics for mathematical and non-mathematical language. Another desideratum is a plausible epistemology of mathematics. If we accept mathematical platonism, we satisfy the first desideratum but not the second. If on the other hand we reject mathematical platonism, we satisfy the second desideratum but not the first. See Nutting (2020) for discussion.

13. Even if Premise 3 turns out to be defensible, it may no longer be so when ‘object realism’ is substituted for ‘mathematical platonism’. The discussion in Section 4.3 provides some reason to doubt this modified version of Premise 3. See also Linnebo 2006, Section 5 and 2018, Sections 11.5–11.6.

14. The transitive closure of a relation \(R\) is the smallest transitive relation \(S\) which contains \(R\). The transitive closure of a relation is sometimes also known as the ancestral of the relation.

15. The full-blooded platonist recognizes a mathematical statement \(S\) as ‘objectively correct’ only if \(S\) is true in all mathematical structures answering to our ‘full conception’ of the relevant mathematical structure. See Balaguer 2001.

16. Proponents of set-theoretic potentialism often take the potentiality to involve a distinctive interpretational modality, concerned with shifting interpretations of the relevant mathematical language. In this way, they can take the truths of pure set theory to be metaphysically necessary—and thus accept Counterfactual Independence.

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Øystein Linnebo <>

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